Foundationalist Theories of Epistemic Justification

First published Mon Feb 21, 2000; substantive revision Mon Jun 14, 2010

Foundationalism is a view about the structure of justification or knowledge. The foundationalist's thesis in short is that all knowledge and justified belief rest ultimately on a foundation of noninferential knowledge or justified belief.

A little reflection suggests that the vast majority of the propositions we know or justifiably believe have that status only because we know or justifiably believe other different propositions. So, for example, I know or justifiably believe that Caesar was an assassinated Roman leader, but only because I know or justifiably believe (among other things) that various historical texts describe the event. Arguably, my knowledge (justified belief) about Caesar's death also depends on my knowing (justifiably believing) that the texts in question are reliable guides to the past. Foundationalists want to contrast my inferential knowledge (justified belief) about Caesar with a kind of knowledge (justified belief) that doesn't involve the having of other knowledge (justified belief). There is no standard terminology for what we shall henceforth refer to as noninferential knowledge or justification.[1]

For convenience, in what follows we will concentrate on foundationalism about justification. Everything said about justified belief will apply mutatis mutandis to certain foundationalist views about knowledge. On the “classical” analysis of knowledge, the core of the concept of knowledge is justified true belief and the foundational structure of knowledge simply derives from the foundational structure or justification. It should be noted, however, that the presupposition that the structure of knowledge parallels the structure of justification is controversial. Indeed, in a highly influential book, Timothy Williamson (2000) argues that knowledge is unanalyzable and is a concept that should be employed in understanding a host of other interesting epistemic concepts, including the concept of evidence. In short, his view is that our evidence simply consists in everything we know. Justification may have foundations but only because we end a regress of justification with propositions that are known—the evidential foundation on which all justified belief rests is knowledge (186). A discussion of Williamson's view would take us too far afield, however, and in what follows I will continue to suppose that our understanding of knowledge is parasitic upon our understanding of justification, and not vice versa.

It is surely fair to suggest that for literally thousands of years the foundationalist's thesis was taken to be almost trivially true. When an argument was implicitly or explicitly offered for the view it was most often the now famous regress argument. It is important, however, to distinguish two quite different regress arguments for foundationalism—the epistemic regress argument and the conceptual regress argument.


1. The Regress Arguments for Foundationalism

Suppose I claim to be justified in believing that Fred will die shortly and offer as my evidence that Fred has an untreatable and serious form of cancer. Concerned, you ask me how I discovered that Fred has the cancer and I respond that it is just a hunch on my part. As soon as you discover that I have no reason at all to suppose that Fred has the cancer, you will immediately conclude that my whimsical belief about Fred's condition gives me no justification for believing that Fred will soon die. Generalizing, one might suggest the following principle:

To be justified in believing P on the basis of E one must be justified in believing E.

Now consider another example. Suppose I claim to be justified in believing that Fred will die shortly and offer as my justification that a certain line across his palm (his infamous “lifeline”) is short. Rightly skeptical, you wonder this time what reason I have for believing that palm lines have anything whatsoever to do with length of life. As soon as you become satisfied that I have no justification for supposing that there is any kind of probabilistic connection between the character of this line and Fred's life you will again reject my claim to have a justified belief about Fred's impending demise. That suggests that we might expand our Principle of Inferential Justification (PIJ) to include a second clause:

Principle of Inferential Justification:
To be justified in believing P on the basis of E one must not only be (1) justified in believing E, but also (2) justified in believing that E makes probable P.

With PIJ one can present a relatively straightforward epistemic regress argument for foundationalism. If all justification were inferential then for someone S to be justified in believing some proposition P, S must be in a position to legitimately infer it from some other proposition E1. But E1 could justify S in believing P only if S were justified in believing E1, and if all justification were inferential the only way for S to do that would be to infer it from some other proposition justifiably believed, E2, a proposition which in turn would have to be inferred from some other proposition E3 which is justifiably believed, and so on, ad infinitum. But finite beings cannot complete an infinitely long chain of reasoning and so if all justification were inferential no-one would be justified in believing anything at all to any extent whatsoever. This most radical of all skepticisms is absurd (it entails that one couldn't even be justified in believing it) and so there must be a kind of justification which is not inferential, i.e., there must be noninferentially justified beliefs which terminate regresses of justification.

If we accept the more controversial second clause of PIJ, the looming regresses proliferate. Not only must S above be justified in believing E1, S must also be justified in believing that E1 makes likely P, a proposition he would have to infer (if there are no foundations) from some other proposition F1, which he would have to infer from F2, which he would have to infer from F3, and so on ad infinitum. But S would also need to be justified in believing that F1 does in fact make likely that E1 makes likely P, a proposition he would need to infer from some other proposition G1, which he would need to infer from some other proposition G2, and so on. And he would need to infer that G1 does indeed make likely that F1 makes likely that E1 makes likely P, and so on. Without noninferentially justified beliefs, it would seem that we would need to complete an infinite number of infinitely long chains of reasoning in order to be justified in believing anything!

The above argument relies on the unacceptability of a vicious epistemic regress. But one might also argue, more fundamentally, that without a concept of noninferential justification, one faces a vicious conceptual regress. What precisely is our understanding of inferential justification? What makes PIJ true? It is at least tempting to answer that PIJ is an analytic truth. Part of what it means to claim that someone has inferential justification for believing some proposition P is that his justification consists in his ability to infer P from some other proposition E1 that is justifiably believed. But if anything like this is a plausible analysis of the concept of inferential justification, we face a potential vicious conceptual regress. The analysis of inferential justification presupposes an understanding of justified belief. We need to introduce a concept of noninferential justification in terms of which we can then recursively define inferential justification.

Consider an analogy. Suppose a philosopher introduces the notion of instrumental goodness (something's being good as a means). That philosopher offers the following crude analysis of what it is for something to be instrumentally good. X is instrumentally good when X leads to something Y which is good. Even if we were to accept this analysis of instrumental goodness, it is clear that we haven't yet located the conceptual source of goodness. Our analysis of instrumental goodness presupposes an understanding of what it is for something to be good. In short we can't understand what it is for something to be instrumentally good until we have some prior (and more fundamental) understanding of what it is for something to be intrinsically good. The conceptual regress argument for foundationalism puts forth the thesis that inferential justification stands to noninferential justification as instrumental goodness stands to intrinsic goodness.

2. The Analysis of Noninferential Justification

If foundationalists are united in their conviction that there must be a kind of justification that does not depend on the having of other justified beliefs, they nevertheless disagree radically among themselves as to how to understand noninferential justification. In the latter part of this century, the rise of externalist epistemologies has generated even more fundamentally different versions of foundationalism. It will not be possible to survey all of the strikingly different analyses that have been offered of noninferential justification. In what follows we will examine a few of the more prominent versions of classical and contemporary internalist and externalist foundationalisms.

2.1 Noninferential Justification as Infallible Belief

Descartes is often taken to be the paradigm of a classical foundationalist. Determined to build knowledge on appropriate and secure foundations he seemed to want to identify foundational knowledge with infallible belief. Implicitly or explicitly others seemed to follow his lead by restricting noninferentially justified beliefs to beliefs that cannot be mistaken. Thus, for example, when Price (1950) introduced the notion of sense data, knowledge of which would be included in his foundations of empirical knowledge, he contrasted sense data and their nonrelational properties with other sorts of things about which one could be mistaken, implying again that the way to find the correct foundations of knowledge is to eliminate from one's beliefs system all those beliefs that could be false. Following Lehrer (1974, p. 81)) we might formulate the following definition of infallible belief:

S's belief that P at t is infallible if S's believing P at t entails[2] that P is true.

As Lehrer and others have pointed, it is far from clear that this concept of infallible belief has much relevance to an attempt to understand the epistemic concept of noninferential justification. The first and most striking problem involves necessary truths. Every necessary truth is entailed by every proposition, and thus if I happen to believe a necessary truth, P, that I believe P will entail that P is true. Thus by the above definition my belief that P will be infallible whenever P is a necessary truth even if P is far too complicated for me to prove and I believe it solely on a whim.

Furthermore, a foundation of knowledge and justified belief restricted to infallible beliefs (as defined above) would arguably be far too flimsy to support any sort of substantial epistemic edifice. There are a few contingent propositions that are trivially entailed by the fact that they are believed. My belief that I exist entails that I exist, that I have at least one belief, that someone has beliefs, that experience (broadly construed) exists, etc. But once we get past these sorts of “self-referential” propositions, propositions whose very subject matter encompasses the fact that they are believed, it is hard to come up with uncontroversial examples of infallible beliefs. Ayer (1956, p. 19) argues that as long as the belief that P is one state of affairs and P's being the case is an entirely different state of affairs (not including as a constituent the former) there can be no logical absurdity in the supposition that the former could occur without the latter.

Although it doesn't add much to the logical force of the argument, one might employ our hunches about how the brain might work to rhetorically bolster the argument. Consider a standard candidate for an infallible empirical belief, my belief that I am in pain now. It is surely possible that the region of the brain causally responsible for producing the belief that I am in pain is entirely different from the region of the brain causally responsible for producing the pain. There may be a causal connection between the occurrence of the “pain” brain event and the occurrence of the “belief” brain event, or vice versa, but even if the causal connection holds it will be a contingent fact that it does. It hardly seems that the neurophysiologist could discover these (or any other) causal connections purely a priori. But if the brain state responsible for my belief that I am in pain is wholly different from the brain state responsible for the pain, and if the connections between them are merely nomological, then it is in principle possible to produce the one without the other. The belief will not entail the truth of what is believed.

2.2 Noninferential Justification as Infallible Justification

It may be that classical foundationalists start off on the wrong foot if they seek foundations in logical relations between the mere fact that someone believes some proposition and the proposition's being true. Noninferential justification is, after all, a kind of justification and if the impossibility of error is essential to noninferential justification, it may be more plausible to locate the source of infallibility in a special kind of justification available in support of a belief. Let us say that S's belief is infallibly justified at t when S's justification for believing P at t relevantly entails the truth of P. We need to qualify the entailment as relevant to circumvent the problems discussed earlier. Whenever I have any justification at all for believing a proposition that turns out to be necessarily true, that justification will entail the necessary truth. But we do not want just any sort of justification to yield infallibly justified belief even if the object of that belief is a necessary truth.

What is the difference between relevant and irrelevant entailment? This is a question notoriously difficult to answer, but intuitively it should have something to do with the fact that would make true the proposition entailed and the fact that would make true the proposition that entails it. More specifically, we could say that P relevantly entails Q only if the fact that would make P true is at least a constituent of the fact that would make Q true. This suggestion can be considered at best only preliminary since we will obviously need a more detailed account of facts and their constituents. That I have grey hair entails that someone has grey hair, but is my having grey hair a constituent of the fact that is someone's having grey hair? There is certainly a sense in which it is something one can point to in answer to the question “What makes it true that someone has grey hair?” One cannot appropriately point to my having grey hair as something that makes it true that two plus two equals four.

Consider again my belief that I'm in pain (when I am). If such a belief is noninferentially justified, in what does the justification for that belief consist. Surely not in the mere fact that the proposition is believed. What is it that distinguishes this belief from my belief about Caesar's assassination. Some foundationalists want to locate the noninferential justification in the truth-maker for the proposition believed. What justifies me in believing that I'm in pain when I am is the mere fact that I'm in pain. But again, what is it about my being in pain as opposed to Caesar's being assassinated which makes it appropriate to claim that my being in pain justifies me in believing that I'm in pain while Caesar's having been assassinated doesn't justify me in believing that Caesar was assassinated.

It is tempting to think that the foundationalist is better off appealing to some special relation that I have to my pain which makes it unnecessary to look to other beliefs in order to justify my belief that I'm in pain. It is the fact that I have a kind of access to my pain that no-one else has that makes my belief noninferentially justified while others must rely on inference in order to discover that I am in this state. This takes us to another classical version of foundationalism, the acquaintance theory. Perhaps the best known proponent of an acquaintance theory is Bertrand Russell,[3] but it takes little imagination to read the view into most of the British empiricists. Roughly the view is that what justifies S in believing that he is in pain when he does is the fact that S is directly and immediately acquainted with his pain in a way in which he is not directly and immediately acquainted with any contingent facts about Caesar, the physical world, the future, and so on. On a correspondence conception of truth, one might add that to be fully justified in believing a proposition to be true one must be acquainted not only with the fact that makes the proposition true but the relation of correspondence that holds between the proposition and the fact.

In one of the most influential arguments against foundationalism, Wilfrid Sellars (1963, 131–32) argued that the idea of the given in traditional epistemology contains irreconcilable tensions. On the one hand, to ensure that something's being given does not involve any other beliefs, proponents of the view want the given to be untainted by the application of concepts. On the other hand, the whole doctrine of the given is designed to end the regress of justification, to give us secure foundations for the rest of what we justifiably infer from the given. But to make sense of making inferences from the given the given must have a truth value. The kind of thing that has a truth value involves the application of concepts or thought, a capacity not possessed (we may presume) by at least lower-order animals.

If there is a solution to the dilemma presented by Sellars (and others) it is to emphasize that acquaintance is not by itself an epistemic relation. Acquaintance is a relation that other animals might bear to properties and even facts, but it also probably does not give these animals any kind of justification for believing anything, precisely because these other animals probably do not have beliefs. Without thought or propositions entertained there is no truth, and without a bearer of truth value in the picture there is nothing to be justified or unjustified. The acquaintance theorist can argue that one has a noninferentially justified belief that P only when one has the thought that P and one is acquainted with both the fact that P, the thought that P, and the relation of correspondence holding between the thought that P and the fact that P. On such a view no single act of acquaintance yields knowledge or justified belief, but when one has the relevant thought (entertains the relevant proposition), the three acts together constitute noninferential justification. When everything that is constitutive of a thought or a proposition's being true is immediately before consciousness, there is nothing more that one could want or need to justify a belief. The state that constitutes noninferential justification is a state that contains as constituents both the bearer of truth-value and the truth-maker.[4]

When an acquaintance with the fact that P is part of what constitutes my noninferential justification for believing P, there is a trivial sense in which my noninferential justification is infallible. I can't be directly acquainted with the fact that P while I believe P falsely. There is, however, nothing to prevent an acquaintance theorist from allowing that one can be noninferentially justified in believing P by virtue of being directly acquainted with a fact very similar to, but ultimately different from the fact that P (the fact that makes P true). Such an acquaintance theory could allow for the possibility of noninferentially justified but false belief that P.[5]

3. Objections to Classical Foundationalism

Once the received view, classical foundationalism has come under considerable attack in the last few decades. We have already considered the very influential objection raised by Sellars to the idea of there being a “given” element in experience. It is crucial that the foundationalist discover a kind of truth that can be known without inference. But there can be no bearers of truth value without judgment and judgment involves the application of concepts. But to apply a concept is to make a judgment about class membership, and to make a judgment about class membership always involves relating the thing about which the judgment is made to other paradigm members of the class. These judgments of relevant similarity will minimally involve beliefs about the past, and thus be inferential in character (assuming that we can have no “direct” access to facts about the past). A reply to this objection would take us far afield indeed. Perhaps it will suffice to observe that the objection relies on a number of highly controversial claims about the nature of judgment, most of which the classical foundationalist should and would reject.

The direct acquaintance theorist does presuppose the intelligibility of a world that has “structure” independent of any structure imposed by the mind. Without nonlinguistic facts that are independent of the thoughts and judgments that represent them, one could not make sense of a relation of acquaintance between a person and a fact, a relation that grounds noninferential justification. More radical contemporary rejections of foundationalism may well involve dissatisfaction with the foundationalist's implicit commitment to a strong realistic correspondence conception of truth. Since Kant there has always been a strong undercurrent of anti-realism running through philosophy. The metaphor is that of the mind imposing structure on reality. And there is an intuitively plausible sense in which one can genuinely wonder whether it makes sense to ask about the number of colors that are exemplified in the world independently of some framework provided by color concepts. But despite the periodic popularity of extreme anti-realism, it is surely absurd to suppose that it is even in principle possible for a mind to force a structure on a literally unstructured world. There are indefinitely many ways to sort the books in a library and some are just as useful as others, but there would be no way to begin sorting books were books undifferentiated. If a rejection of foundationalism relies on an extreme form of anti-realism so much the worse for the anti-foundationalist.

Just as some anti-foundationalists reject the conception of truth underlying classical foundationalist accounts of noninferential justification, so others profess to be bewildered by some of the fundamental concepts employed in defining noninferential justification. The acquaintance theorist tends to have relatively little to say by way of analyzing what direct acquaintance is. To be sure one can try to give someone a feel for what one is talking about by contrasting one's awareness of pain with the temporary distraction caused by an engrossing conversation. It is tempting to suppose that for a short time the pain was still present but the person with the pain was no longer aware of the fact that the pain exists. This awareness, the acquaintance theorist will argue, is obviously something over and above mere belief in the existence of the pain, as one can believe that one is in a mental state (say a subconscious mental state) without being aware of that state. Like most theories foundationalism will, however, ultimately rest its intelligibility on an appeal to a sui generis concept that defies further analysis. Just as one needs to end epistemic regresses with foundational justification, the foundationalist will argue, so one needs to end conceptual regresses with concepts one grasps without further definition.

Laurence BonJour (1985) raised another highly influential objection to all forms of classical foundationalism (an objection raised before he joined the ranks of foundationalists). The objection presupposed a strong form of what we might call access internalism. Put very superficially the access internalist argues that a feature of a belief or epistemic situation that makes a belief noninferentially justified must be a feature to which we have actual or potential access. Moreover, we must have access to the fact that the feature in question is probabilistically related to the truth of what we believe. So suppose some foundationalist offers an account of noninferential justification according to which a belief is noninferentially justified if it has some characteristic X. BonJour then argues that the mere fact that the belief has X could not, even in principle, justify the believer in holding the belief. The believer would also need access to (justified belief that!) the belief in question has X and that beliefs of this sort (X beliefs) are likely to be true. At least one of these propositions could only be known through inference, and thus the putative noninferential justification is destroyed.

BonJour presented the objection on the way to developing a coherence theory of empirical justification. But it ultimately became obvious that the objection to foundationalism, if good, was too strong. Given the structure of the argument it should become evident that the coherence theory (and any other theory) would be equally vulnerable to the argument. Just replace “X” with some complicated description of beliefs cohering with each other. That might suggest to the classical foundationalist that strong access internalism is a view to be avoided.

Michael Bergmann (2006), however, argues that if to avoid regress we drop the access requirements that are so dear to some internalists, we also lose the motivation for the view. As Bergmann sees it, the attraction of internalism is its claim to be able to construe justification in such a way that it gives a subject with a justified belief a certain assurance from the subjective perspective, an assurance that externalist views (discussed) below can't offer. According to Bergmann, even acquaintance with truth bearers, truth makers and a correspondence holding between them doesn't carry with it assurance unless it is accompanied by a justified belief that all these relations obtain. And this will take us again on the road to regress. Bergmann's challenge is serious and the traditional acquaintance theorist will need to convince you that a believer can't stand in those relations of acquaintance without there being available to that believer the best sort of justification imaginable.

In a somewhat related objection, Sosa (2003) and Markie (2009) have both resurrected the old problem of the speckled hen, or more precisely the appearance presented by a speckled hen, for the classical acquaintance conception of noninferential justification. Consider the visual appearance presented by a many-speckled hen. In some sense or other, when appeared to by the hen, you will be directly aware of the intrinsic character of your experience. You may even have a noninferentially justified belief that you are being appeared to “many speckled-ly.” But Sosa and Markie would argue, there is also presumably some determine number of speckles characterizing your visual experience (suppose that is 47). Even though you are directly acquainted with the experience complete with its 47 speckles, and even though you are entertaining the thought that it has 47 speckles, you typically won't have any justification for believing the proposition that the experience has that determinate character. The objection raises all sorts of interesting and difficult questions. These include metaphysical controversies about the nature of experience. So at least some philosophers would question the presupposition that there is some determinate number of speckles characterizing the visual experience. You have the property of being appeared to many-speckled-ly, but you simply don't have the property of being appeared to n-speckledly where n represents some particular number. Alternatively, the acquaintance theorist might deny that one can have the thought that something has some determinate number of speckles, at least in way that would allow one to be acquainted with a correspondence between that thought and the fact that makes it true. Alternatively, one might allow that an experience can be characterized determinately but deny that one typically has acquaintance with the experience's having that particular determinate character.

The Principle of Inferential Justification used to generate the regress argument for foundationalism is itself controversial. It is important to note that either clause of the principle can be used by itself to generate the allegedly vicious epistemic and conceptual regress for the philosopher who rejects foundations. It is the two clauses combined that are supposed to present the anti-foundationalist with an infinite number of vicious regresses. A number of philosophers (among them foundationalists) would argue that the second clause of PIJ confuses levels of epistemic questions. It is far too strong to require someone to have a justified belief in a probabilistic connection between available evidence and the conclusion reached on the basis of that evidence. Such a requirement is at best plausible for having second-level justification for believing that one has an inferentially justified belief. In responding to a challenge presented to one's having an inferentially justified belief in P on the basis of E one might find oneself searching for justification to support the claim that E makes probable P, but that is only because in the context of the challenge one is trying to make good (i.e., justify) the claim that one has a justified belief. A similar claim might be made with respect to clause 1) of the principle, although it is more difficult to generate the supporting intuition.

In any event, the careful foundationalist is certainly not confused about level-distinctions. The foundationalist who supports PIJ is claiming that a necessary condition for someone's having an inferentially justified belief in P based on E is that the person have both a justified belief in E and a justified belief in the proposition that E makes P probable. It is simply not enough that E is true or that E does in fact make probable P. Our original examples used to support PIJ would seem to reinforce that conclusion. Even if there happened to be some bizarre connection between palm lines and length of life, for example, the person who has no reason to believe that such a connection exists has no justification for conclusions reached about length of life based on this anatomical feature of people.

Huemer (2002) objects to using examples like the palm-line inference to argue for the second clause of the principle of inferential justification. While most share the intuition that we would need additional information in order to legitimately infer truths about the length of a person's life from knowledge of palm lines, all that really shows is that we wouldn't view the inference in question as legitimate in the first place. Even palm readers don't think that they can make predictions about a person's life based on information about palm lines and that information alone. But that doesn't show that when we have an argument whose premises really do support its conclusion we still need to be aware of the connection in order to justifiably believe the conclusion based on the premises. But while Huemer's point is plausible and the foundationalist trying to argue for the second clause of the principle of inferential justification should heed Huemer's warning to be careful in the use of examples, it is not clear that one can't find plausible examples of inferences from premises to conclusion where the premises do make probable, even entail, the conclusion but the resulting belief is unjustified because the person who reached the conclusion had no awareness of the relevant connection between premise and conclusion. All we need to do is consider a person who infers P from E where E logically entails P, but where the entailment is far too complex for the person to see or even understand. Surely the belief that P is unjustified if the person who reaches conclusion couldn't “see” how the available evidence entails the conclusion.

There are, of course, other responses to the charge of vicious regress facing anti-foundationalists. The coherence theorist rejects the foundationalist's presupposition that justification is linear. Each belief is justified by virtue of its coherence with the rest of what one believes but one avoids the appearance of vicious circularity by insisting that one needn't first have justification for believing the other propositions in one's belief system. The coherence theorist's response to the argument for foundationalism is, of course, only as plausible as the coherence theory of justification (See coherence theories of justification).

Peter Klein (1998) may be the lone supporter of a view he calls infinitism. The infinitist accepts the need to be able to supply non-circular justification for believing what we do, but argues that given the complexity of the human mind and its capacity to entertain and justifiably believe an infinite number of propositions, there is nothing vicious about the relevant regresses we face. There is no reason to suppose that we would be unable to justify every proposition we believe by appeal to some other different proposition which we justifiably believe. Infinitism is a view that should be seriously considered, particularly once one realizes that one not only can but does have an infinite number of justified beliefs (e.g., that 2 is greater than 1, that 3 is greater that 1, and so on.). It is not clear, however, that even if the infinitist can cope with the epistemic regress argument foundationalism, he has a response to the conceptual regress argument discussed earlier. Klein will argue, however, that one needn't define inferential justification recursively by relying on a base clause that invokes the concept of noninferential justification. Rather one can employ a base clause the invokes an unanalyzed generic understanding of justification.

Although anti-foundationalists are not always eager to admit it, I suspect that the primary dissatisfaction with classical foundationalism lies with the difficulty the view has avoiding radical skepticism. On infallible belief, infallible justification, or direct acquaintance theories of foundational justification, there is precious little included in the foundations of knowledge. Most classical foundationalists reject the idea that one can have noninferentially justified beliefs about the past, but the present disappears into the past in the blink of an eye. How can one even hope to get back the vast body of knowledge one pre-philosophically supposes one has, if one's epistemic base is so impoverished. If the second clause of the Principle of Inferential Justification were accepted, the problem is even more serious. One might be able to convince oneself that one can know noninferentially the principles of deductive reasoning, but deduction will not take one usefully beyond the foundations of knowledge and justified belief. As Mill (1906, p. 126) argued, there is a very real sense in which one doesn't advance one's knowledge significantly employing a form of reasoning that takes one only to conclusions that were implicitly contained in the conjunction of one's premises. To advance beyond foundations we will inevitably need to employ non-deductive reasoning and according to PIJ that will ultimately require us to have noninferential (direct) knowledge of propositions describing probability connections between evidence and conclusions. It is not absurd on the face of it to suppose that one can have noninferential a priori knowledge of probabilistic connections, but it is perhaps an understatement to suppose that the view is not popular.[6]

4. Internalist Alternatives to Classical Foundationalism

We noted above that at least many philosophers are convinced that acceptance of radical foundationalism leads inevitably to an unacceptably radical skepticism. In light of that concern, some contemporary epistemologists seek a more modest foundationalism that will make it much easier to respond to the skeptic's argument. Michael Huemer's (2001) phenomenal conservatism and Jim Pryor's (2000) dogmatism are both views that are far more “permissive” in allowing for foundational justification. And their views are not unrelated to Chisholm's longstanding efforts (e.g. 1989) to locate noninferential justification for believing various propositions about one's past and physical environment in the character of one's experiential states.

Huemer offers his view as an improvement on a cruder view sometimes called simply epistemic conservatism. The epistemic conservative takes the mere fact that you find yourself believing some proposition P to be a prima facie justification for believing the proposition in question. Such a view presents wonderful advantages in dealing with the skeptic. The skeptic after all will typically concede that you have the beliefs under skeptical attack, and if conservatism is true, the skeptic faces an uphill battle convincing you that those beliefs have nothing going for them. The battle is only uphill, of course, since your beliefs can turn on themselves. As we get older we might find ourselves inclined to believe something about the past while we also believe that we can't trust our memory any more. In any event, Huemer suggests that we should distinguish belief from what he calls “appearings” or “seemings.” The distinction is typically introduced with examples. So once we are familiar with the Muller-Lyer illusion, we no longer believe that the lines are of unequal length even though, in some sense, they still appear to be of different lengths. Huemer and others will claim that we can't understand these appearances in terms of dispositions to belief, inclinations to believe, or impulses to belief, though not everyone will agree about this. In any event, Huemer thinks that when it appears to one or seems to one as if P, the occurrence of that state gives one prima facie epistemic reason to believe P (a reason that can be overturned).

While Huemer's relies on appearances that accompany such states as sensation or apparent memory, Pryor takes sensory states, for example, to be themselves representational states. When one has a visual or tactile experience, those states are “belief-like” in that they represent the world as being a certain way. And Pryor goes on to argue that such states simply yield prima noninferential justification for beliefs that share their content (that represent the same aspect of reality). Both Huemer and Pryor make clear that the intentional states (representational states) that provide justification do so without one's having to be aware of the fact that one is in such states. They might both allow, however, that one can turn one's attention inward to discover the fact that one is in such states, and that one can, in principle, discover (perhaps a priori) that the states in question do give one the relevant epistemic justification.

As one might expect, the main worry with both Huemer's phenomenal conservatism and Pryor's dogmatism, is the very air of dogmatism that Pryor embraces in his label of the view. It strikes many epistemologists that these views make getting justification for one's beliefs just bit too easy. Perhaps sensations are representational states, and perhaps there is the kind of representational state that Huemer calls an appearing or a seeming, but as intentional states why should we assume that they accurately represent the world around us. Fear is an intentional state, but from the fact that I fear ghosts, it hardly seems to follow that I have a prima facie justification for believing that are ghosts. For that matter, belief is an intentional state and unless extreme epistemic conservatism is true, why should I think that my belief is justified just because it exists. Huemer and Pryor will answer that the intentional states they offer as justifiers are simply different in this respect. While providing no guarantee that the world is as represented, they simply carry with them justification that other representational states are incapable of providing. In the final analysis, however, it is probably fair to say that the classical foundationalists simply wants more assurance than the phenomenal conservative or the dogmatist is able to provide.

5. Externalist Versions of Foundationalism

The epistemic landscape has changed dramatically in the last thirty or forty years with the rise of externalist epistemologies. It is notoriously difficult to define clearly the controversy between internalists and externalists in epistemology.[7] It is sometimes taken to be a controversy over whether or not one can identify epistemic properties with “internal” states of believers. Others seem to think that the controversy centers over the question of whether one requires certain sorts of access (or potential access) to the states or properties that constitute having justification. Certainly, paradigm externalists would reject the second clause of the principle of inferential justification. According to virtually all externalists, one can arrive at a justified belief in P by inferring it from E without being aware of any sort of evidential connection between E and P.

While the externalist defends radically different views than those of classical foundationalists, the structure of knowledge and justification that emerges from such theories is still often a foundationalist structure. We might first illustrate the point by examining the view defended by the most prominent of the externalists, Alvin Goldman's reliabilism.[8]

The fundamental idea behind reliabilism is strikingly simple. Justified beliefs are reliably produced beliefs. Justified beliefs are worth having because justified beliefs are probably true. Goldman initially distinguished, however, two importantly different sorts of justified beliefs—those that result from belief-independent processes and those that result from belief-dependent processes. The former are beliefs that are produced by “software” of the brain that takes as its “input” stimuli other than beliefs; the latter are beliefs produced by processes that take as their input at least some other beliefs. So, for example, it is possible that we have evolved in such a way that when prompted with certain sensory input we immediately and unreflectively reach conclusions about external objects. And we may live in a world in which beliefs about the external world produced in this way are usually true (or would usually be true if enough of them were generated).[9] Such beliefs will be justified by virtue of being the product of reliable belief-independent processes. They can in turn be taken as input for reliable belief-dependent processes in order to generate still more justified beliefs. A belief-dependent process is reliable if its output beliefs are usually (or would usually) be true if the relevant input beliefs are true, and the output beliefs of reliable belief-dependent processes are justified provided that the input beliefs are justified.[10]

The above is but the crudest sketch of Goldman's early reliabilism—he later modified it to deal with a number of objections. But the sketch is enough to bring out the foundationalist structure inherent in a reliabilist account. The reliabilist actually accepts the first clause of PIJ, but avoids both the epistemic and conceptual regresses by embracing a kind of justified belief that does not owe its justification to the having of other different justified beliefs. That the reliabilist is concerned with avoiding the conceptual regress is clear from the fact that the analysis offered is explicitly recursive. The base clause of the recursive analysis in effect captures the concept of a noninferentially justified belief.

I have illustrated the way in which an externalist account of justified belief can exemplify a foundationalist structure by examining one of the most prominent versions of externalism, reliabilism. But other versions of externalism are also implicitly or explicitly committed to a version of foundationalism, or, at the very least, give an account of justification that would enable one to distinguish noninferential from inferential justification, direct from indirect knowledge. Consider, for example, a crude version of the so-called causal theory of knowledge according to which one knows a proposition when one believes it and the belief is caused (in the “right” way) by the very fact that makes true what is believed. Obviously, on such an account one can distinguish causal chains leading to the belief in question that involve intermediate beliefs from those that do not, and using this distinction one can again define a distinction between direct and indirect knowledge.[11]

Externalist versions of foundationalism are probably attractive to many because they often allow at least the possibility of a much expanded foundational base of justified beliefs. The reliabilist's noninferentially justified beliefs, for example, might be produced by processes that are not even very reliable. Unlike the Cartesian, the reliabilist's distinction between noninferentially and inferentially justified belief has nothing to do with how probable it is that the belief in question is true. If nature has been co-operative enough to insure the evolution of cognitive agents who respond to their environmental stimuli with mostly true beliefs then there might be an enormous store of foundational knowledge upon which we can draw in arriving at inferentially justified conclusions. On most externalist accounts of noninferentially justified belief there are literally no a priori constraints on what might end up being noninferentially justified.

A full evaluation of externalist versions of foundationalism is far beyond the scope of this article. The very ease with which the externalist can potentially broaden the foundational base of noninferentially justified belief is, ironically, one of the primary concerns of those philosophers unhappy with externalist epistemology. Many internalists are convinced that externalists are simply re-defining epistemic terms in such a way that they lose the kind of meaning that the philosopher wants them to have in order to ask the kind of penetrating philosophical questions that are the peculiar product of a kind of philosophical curiosity. When a philosopher starts looking for justification in support of a belief, the internalist will argue, the philosopher is interested in achieving a state in which a kind of philosophical curiosity is satisfied. That philosopher wants epistemic justification to provide a kind of assurance of truth. If I'm wondering whether or not I have justification to believe that God exists, I'm hardly going to think that my question has been answered when I'm told by the reliabilist that I might have a reliably produced belief that God exists or when I'm told by the causal theorist that my belief that God exists might be caused by the very fact that God exists. As far as satisfying intellectual curiosity, exemplifying reliably-produced belief or belief caused by the right fact is no more useful than having true belief. If I were to stipulate a technical sense of foundational Knowledge* according to which I foundationally know that P when I believe truly that P and my belief isn't caused by any other belief, there may well be all sorts of truths I “know”, but will having such knowledge do me any good as far as putting me in a state that satisfies my philosophical curiosity?

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  • Pryor, James, 2000, “The Skeptic and the Dogmatist,” Noûs, 34 (4): 517–549.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1910–11. “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description,” The Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 11: 209–32.
  • –––, Theory of Knowledge: The 1913 Manuscript, Elizabeth Eames (ed.), London: Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • –––, 1948. Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits, New York: Simon and Schuster.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, 1963. Science Perception and Reality, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Sosa, Ernest, 2003, “Privileged Access,” in Consciousness: New Philosophical Essays, Q. Smith and A. Jokic (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 273–92.
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epistemology | justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | knowledge: analysis of | reliabilism

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