# Kant's Philosophy of Mathematics

*First published Fri Jul 19, 2013*

Kant was a student and a teacher of mathematics throughout his
career, and his reflections on mathematics and mathematical practice
had a profound impact on his philosophical thought. He developed
considered philosophical views on the status of mathematical judgment,
the nature of mathematical definitions, axioms and proof, and the
relation between pure mathematics and the natural world. Moreover, his
approach to the general question “how are synthetic
judgments *a priori* possible?” was shaped by his
conception of mathematics and its achievements as a well-grounded
science.

Kant's philosophy of mathematics is of interest to a variety of scholars for multiple reasons. First, his thoughts on mathematics are a crucial and central component of his critical philosophical system, and so they are illuminating to the historian of philosophy working on any aspect of Kant's corpus. Additionally, issues of contemporary interest and relevance arise from Kant's reflections on the most fundamental and elementary mathematical disciplines, issues that continue to inform important questions in the metaphysics and epistemology of mathematics. Finally, disagreements about how to interpret Kant's philosophy of mathematics have generated a fertile area of current research and debate.

## 1. Kant's Pre-Critical Philosophy of Mathematics

In 1763, Kant entered an essay prize competition addressing the question of whether the first principles of metaphysics and morality can be proved, and thereby achieve the same degree of certainty as mathematical truths. Though his essay was awarded second prize by the Royal Academy of Sciences in Berlin (losing to Moses Mendelssohn's “On Evidence in the Metaphysical Sciences”), it has nevertheless come to be known as Kant's “Prize Essay”. The Prize Essay was published by the Academy in 1764 under the title “Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality” and stands as a key text in Kant's pre-critical philosophy of mathematics.

In the Prize Essay, Kant undertook to compare the methods of
mathematics and metaphysics (Carson 1999; Sutherland 2010). He claimed
that “the business of mathematics…is that of combining
and comparing given concepts of magnitudes, which are clear and
certain, with a view to establishing what can be inferred from
them” (2:278). He claimed further that this business is
accomplished via an examination of figures or “visible
signs” that provide concrete representations of universal
concepts that have been synthetically defined. For example, one
defines the mathematical concept <trapezium> by arbitrary
combination of other concepts (“four straight lines bounding a
plane surface so that the opposite sides are not parallel to each
other”^{[1]}),
accompanied by a “sensible sign” that displays the
relations among the parts of all objects so defined. Definitions as
well as fundamental mathematical propositions, for example, that space
can only have three dimensions, must be “examined *in
concreto* so that they come to be cognized intuitively”, but
such propositions can never be proved since they are not inferred from
other propositions (2:281). Theorems are established when simple
cognitions are combined “by means of synthesis” (2:282),
as when, for instance, it is demonstrated that the products of the
segments formed by two chords intersecting inside a circle are
equal. In the latter case, one proves a theorem about any and all
pairs of lines that intersect inside a circle not by “drawing
all the possible lines which could intersect each other within [the
circle]” but rather by drawing only two lines, and identifying
the relationship that holds between them (2:278). The “universal
rule” that results is inferred via a synthesis among the
sensible signs that are displayed, and, as a result, among the
concepts that the sensible signs illustrate.

Kant concludes that the mathematical method cannot be applied to
achieve philosophical (and, in particular, metaphysical) results, for
the primary reason that “geometers acquire their concepts by
means of *synthesis*, whereas philosophers can only acquire
their concepts by means of *analysis*—and that completely
changes the method of thought” (2:289). Yet at this pre-critical
stage, he also concludes that, even lacking synthetic definitions of
its primary concepts, “metaphysics is as much capable of the
certainty which is necessary to produce conviction as
mathematics” (2:296). (Later, in the critical period, Kant will
expand the notion of synthesis to describe not only the genesis and
combination of mathematical concepts, but also the act of unifying
manifold representations. He will also, of course, use the terms
“synthetic” and “analytic” to distinguish two
mutually exclusive ways in which the subject and predicate concepts
relate to one another in distinct judgments of any kind, and he will
emphasize an expanded sense of this distinction that encompasses a
methodological contrast between two modes of argumentation, one
synthetic or progressive and the other analytic or regressive. These
various senses of the analytic/synthetic distinction will be addressed
briefly, below.)

In the essays “Concerning the Ultimate Ground of the
Differentiation of Directions in Space” and “On the Form
and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World [Inaugural
Dissertation]” of 1768 and 1770, respectively, Kant's thoughts
about mathematics and its results begin to evolve in the direction of
his critical philosophy as he begins to recognize the role that a
distinct faculty of sensibility will play in an account of
mathematical cognition (Carson 2004). In these essays, he attributes
the success of mathematical reasoning to its access to the
“principles of sensitive form” and the “primary data
of intuition”, which results in “laws of intuitive
cognition” and “intuitive judgments” about magnitude
and extension. One such judgment serves to establish the possibility
of an object that is “exactly equal and similar to another, but
which cannot be enclosed in the same limits as that other,
its *incongruent counterpart*” (2:382) (Buroker 1981; Van
Cleve and Frederick 1991; Van Cleve 1999). Kant invokes such
“incongruent counterparts” in “Directions in
space” to establish the orientability and actuality of a
Newtonian-style absolute space, the object of geometry as he then
understands it. He invokes the same example in the “Inaugural
Dissertation” to establish that spatial relations “can
only be apprehended by a certain pure intuition” and so show
that “geometry employs principles which are not only indubitable
and discursive, but which also fall under the gaze of the mind.”
As such, mathematical evidence is “the *paradigm* and the
means of all evidence in the other sciences” (2:403). (Later, in
the critical period's *Prolegomena*, he will invoke incongruent
counterparts to establish the transcendental ideality of space,
thereby disavowing his earlier argument in support of absolute
space.)

## 2. Kant's Critical Philosophy of Mathematics

### 2.1 Kant's theory of the construction of mathematical concepts in “The Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use”

Kant's critical philosophy of mathematics finds fullest expression
in the section of the *Critique of Pure Reason* entitled
“The Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use”, which
begins the second of the two main divisions of the *Critique*,
the “Transcendental Doctrine of Method.” In previous
sections of the *Critique*, Kant has subjected pure reason
“in its transcendental use in accordance with mere
concepts” to a critique in order to “constrain its
propensity to expansion beyond the narrow boundaries of possible
experience” (A711/B739). But Kant tells us that it is
unnecessary to subject mathematics to such a critique because the use
of pure reason in mathematics is kept to a “visible track”
via intuition: “[mathematical] concepts must immediately be
exhibited *in concreto* in pure intuition, through which
anything unfounded and arbitrary instantly becomes obvious”
(A711/B739). Nevertheless, the practice and discipline of mathematics
does require an explanation, in order both to account for its success
at demonstrating substantive and necessary truths, and also to license
its invocation as a model of reasoning. Kant thus directs himself, as
he did in the pre-critical period, to the question of what accounts
for the “happy and well grounded” mathematical method, and
also of whether it is useful in any discipline other than
mathematics. To answer this latter question in the negative, Kant must
explain the uniqueness of mathematical reasoning.

The central thesis of Kant's account of the uniqueness of
mathematical reasoning is his claim that mathematical cognition
derives from the “construction” of its concepts:
“to **construct** a concept means to exhibit *a
priori* the intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741)
(Friedman 1992, Friedman 2010). For example, while the concept
<triangle> can be discursively defined as a rectilinear figure
contained by three straight lines (as is done in
Euclid's *Elements*), the concept is *constructed*, in
Kant's technical sense of the term, only when such a definition is
paired with a corresponding intuition, that is, with a singular and
immediately evident representation of a three sided figure. Kant
argues that when one so renders a triangle for the purposes of
performing the auxiliary constructive steps necessary for geometric
proof, one does so *a priori*, whether the triangle is produced
on paper or only in the imagination. This is because in neither case
does the object displayed borrow its pattern from any experience
(A713/B741). Moreover, one can derive universal truths about all
triangles from such a singular display of an individual triangle since
the particular determinations of the displayed object, e.g., the
magnitude of its sides and angles, are “entirely
indifferent” to the ability of the rendered triangle to exhibit
the general concept <triangle> (A714/B742). Kant's account must
thus be defended against the commonly held position that universal
truths *cannot* be derived from reasoning that depends on
particular representations. (Relatedly, the less than perfectly
straight sides of an empirically rendered triangle are likewise
“indifferent” and so such an empirical intuition is
considered adequate for geometric proof. This raises questions about
how one can be sure that an intuition adequately displays the content
of a concept, the relation between pure and empirical intuition, and,
in particular, which of the intuitively displayed features can safely
be ignored (Friedman 2010, Friedman 2012).)

Ultimately, Kant claims that it is “only the concept of magnitudes” (quantities) that can be constructed in pure intuition, since “qualities cannot be exhibited in anything but empirical intuition” (A714/B742) (Sutherland 2004a; 2004b, 2005a). This leads to a principled distinction between mathematical and philosophical cognition: while philosophical cognition is confined to the results of an abstract conceptual analysis, mathematical cognition is the result of a “chain of inferences that is always guided by intuition”, that is, by a concrete representation of its objects (Hintikka 1967, Parsons 1969, Friedman 1992). Kant strains somewhat to explain how the mathematician constructs arithmetic and algebraic magnitudes, which are distinct from the spatial figures that are the object of geometric reasoning. Drawing a distinction between “ostensive” and “symbolic” construction, he identifies ostensive construction with the geometer's practice of showing or displaying spatial figures, whereas symbolic construction correlates to the act of concatenating arithmetic or algebraic symbols (as when, for example, “one magnitude is to be divided by another, [mathematics] places their symbols together in accordance with the form of notation for division…”) (A717/B745) (Brittan 1992, Shabel 1998).

Kant claims further that the pure concept of magnitude is suitable
for construction because, unlike other pure concepts, it does not
represent a synthesis of *possible* intuitions, but
“already contains a pure intuition in itself.” But since
the only candidates for such “pure intuitions” are space
and time (“the mere form of appearances”), it follows that
only spatial and temporal magnitudes can be exhibited in pure
intuition, i.e., constructed. Such spatial and temporal magnitudes can
be exhibited qualitatively, by displaying the shapes of things,
e.g. the rectangularity of the panes of a window, or they can be
exhibited merely quantitatively, by displaying the number of parts of
things, e.g., the number of panes that the window comprises. In either
case, what is displayed counts as a pure and “formal
intuition”, inspection of which yields judgments that “go
beyond” the content of the original concept with which the
intuition was associated. Such judgments are paradigmatically
synthetic *a priori* judgments (to be discussed at greater
length below) since they are ampliative truths that are warranted
independent of experience (Shabel 2006).

Kant argues that mathematical reasoning cannot be employed outside
the domain of mathematics proper for such reasoning, as he understands
it, is *necessarily* directed at objects that are
“determinately given in pure intuition *a priori* and
without any empirical *data*” (A724/B752). Since only
formal mathematical objects (i.e. spatial and temporal magnitudes) can
be so given, mathematical reasoning is useless with respect
to *materially* given content (though the truths that result
from mathematical reasoning about formal mathematical objects are
fruitfully applied to such material content, which is to say that
mathematics is *a priori* true of the appearances.)
Consequently, the “thorough grounding” that mathematics
finds in its definitions, axioms, and demonstrations cannot be
“achieved or imitated” by philosophy or physical sciences
(A727/B755).

While Kant's theory of mathematical concept construction can be
thought of as providing an explanation of mathematical practice as
Kant understood
it^{[2]},
the theory is intertwined with Kant's
broader commitments to strict distinctions between intuitions and
concepts, as modes of representation; between the mental faculties of
sensibility and understanding; between synthetic and analytic
judgments; and between *a priori* and *a posteriori*
evidence and reasoning. Ultimately, the picture of mathematics
developed in the Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use depends on
the full theory of judgment that the *Critique* aims to
provide, and crucially on the theory of sensibility that Kant offers
in The Transcendental Aesthetic (Parsons 1992, Carson 1997), as well
as in corresponding passages in the *Prolegomena*'s Main
Transcendental Question, First Part, where he investigates the
“origin” of the pure sensible concepts of mathematics, and
the “scope of their
validity” (A725/B753).^{[3]}

### 2.2 Kant's answer to his question “How is Pure Mathematics Possible?”

Kant asks two related leading questions of his critical philosophy:
(1) How are synthetic judgments *a priori* possible?; and, (2)
How is metaphysics possible as a science (B19; B23)? Mathematics
provides a special avenue for helping to answer these questions by
providing a model of a codified scientific discipline the possibility
of which is clear and, moreover, guaranteed by its own achievement of
cognition that is both synthetic and *a priori*. In other
words, an explanation of how synthetic *a priori* judgments are
affirmed in mathematical contexts, together with the resulting and
related explanation of how a systematic body of demonstrable knowledge
comprises such judgments, allow mathematical truth to be invoked as a
paradigm of the substantive yet necessary and universal truths that
metaphysics hopes to achieve. Kant's theory of mathematical concept
construction (discussed above) can only be fully appreciated in
conjunction with his treatment of such broader questions about the
very nature and possibility of mathematical and metaphysical
knowledge.

In both the Preamble to the *Prolegomena to Any Future
Metaphysics* and the B-Introduction to the *Critique of Pure
Reason*, Kant introduces the analytic/synthetic distinction, which
distinguishes between judgments the predicates of which belong to or
are contained in the subject concept and judgments the predicates of
which are connected to but go beyond the subject concept,
respectively. In each text, he follows his presentation of this
distinction with a discussion of his claim that all mathematical
judgments are synthetic and *a
priori*.^{[4]}
There he claims, first, that “properly mathematical judgments
are always *a priori* judgments” on the grounds that they
are necessary, and so cannot be derived from experience (B14). He
follows this with an explanation of how such non-empirical judgments
can yet be synthetic, that is, how they can serve to synthesize a
subject and predicate concept rather than merely explicate or analyze
a subject concept into its constituent logical parts. Here he famously
invokes the proposition “7 + 5 = 12” and argues
negatively, claiming that “no matter how long I analyze my
concept of such a possible sum [of seven and five] I will still not
find twelve in it”, and also positively, claiming that
“One must go beyond these concepts [of seven and five], seeking
assistance in the intuition that corresponds to one of the two, one's
five fingers, say…and one after another add the units of the
five given in the intuition to the concept of seven…and thus
see the number 12 arise” (B15). He takes it to follow that the
necessary truth of an arithmetic proposition such as “7 + 5 =
12” cannot be established by any method of logical or conceptual
analysis (Anderson 2004), but *can* be established by intuitive
synthesis (Parsons 1969). He follows this discussion of arithmetic
reasoning and truth with corresponding claims about Euclidean
geometry, according to which the principles of geometry express
synthetic relations between concepts (such as between the concept of
the straight line between two points and the concept of the shortest
line between those same two points), neither of which can be
analytically “extracted” from the other. The principles of
geometry thus express relations among basic geometric concepts
inasmuch as these can be “exhibited in intuition” (Shabel
2003, Sutherland 2005a).

Elsewhere, Kant also includes geometric *theorems* as the
sorts of propositions (in addition to geometric principles) that count
as synthetic (Friedman 1992, Friedman 2010). But Kant's account of the
syntheticity of such theorems is not transparent. Having denied that
the *principles* (Grundsätze) could be cognized
analytically from the principle of contradiction, he admits that
mathematical inference of the kind needed to establish
geometric *theorems* does proceed “in accordance with the
principle of contradiction”, and also that “a synthetic
proposition can of course be comprehended in accordance with the
principle of contradiction” though “only insofar as
another synthetic proposition is presupposed from which it can be
deduced, never in itself” (B14). So, while he is clear that all
mathematical judgments, including geometric theorems, are synthetic,
he is less clear about exactly what it means for such propositions or
the inferences that support them to “accord with” the
principle of contradiction, derivability from which he takes to be the
paradigm test of *analyticity*. This leads to an interpretive disagreement as to whether demonstrable mathematical
judgments follow from the synthetic principles via strictly logical or
conceptual inference—and so in strict accordance
with *only* the principle of contradiction—or whether
they are deduced via inferences that are themselves reliant on
intuition, but which do not violate the law of contradiction. There is
thus disagreement over whether Kant is committed merely to the
syntheticity of the axioms of mathematics (which transmit syntheticity
to demonstrable theorems via logical inference), or is also committed
to the syntheticity of mathematical inference itself. The former
interpretive position is associated with Ernst Cassirer and Lewis
White Beck; the latter position with Bertrand Russell (Hogan
forthcoming). Gordon Brittan (Brittan 2006) conceives both such
positions “evidentialist”, which is his label for any
interpretation according to which intuitions provide indispensable
evidence for the truth of mathematics, whether that evidence is
provided in support of axioms or inferences, or both. According to his
alternative “objectivist” position, intuitions do not
provide evidence but are rather semantic vehicles of singular
reference and “objective reality” (Brittan 2006).

Attention to this interpretive issue in Kant's philosophy of
mathematics is vital for the light it sheds on the more general
question of what makes synthetic *a priori* cognition possible,
the central question of Kant's *Critique of Pure Reason*. With
respect to this more general question, it is important to
differentiate Kant's use of the terms “analytic” and
“synthetic” to mark a logico-semantic distinction between
types of judgments—which Kant uses to defend the distinctive
thesis that mathematical cognition is synthetic *a
priori*—from his use of the same terms to mark a traditional
mathematical distinction, between analytic and
synthetic *methods* (Beaney 2012). He deploys the latter
distinction in order to identify two distinct argumentative strategies
for answering the question of the “possibility of pure
mathematics.” The analytic method is characterized by reasoning
that traces a given body of cognition, such as mathematics, to its
origin or sources in the mind. By contrast, the synthetic method aims
to derive real cognition directly from such original cognitive
sources, which sources or powers are first explicated independently of
any particular body of cognition (including mathematics) that the
powers might ultimately produce. Kant adopts the former method in
his *Prolegomena*, arguing from the synthetic and *a
priori* nature of mathematical judgment to the claim that space
and time are the forms of human sensibility; he adopts the latter
method in the *Critique of Pure Reason*, arguing that the forms
of human sensibility, space and time, provide the basis from which to
derive synthetic and *a priori* mathematical judgments (Shabel
2004). These arguments, together with the details of his account of
the synthetic and *a priori* nature of all mathematical
judgment, provide an answer to the question of the possibility of
mathematics: the practices that yield the paradigmatically synthetic
and *a priori* judgments of the science of mathematics are
grounded in and explained by the very nature of human sensibility,
and, in particular, by the spatio-temporal form of all (and only) the
objects of human experience (Van Cleve 1999).

### 2.3 Kant's conception of the role of mathematics in Transcendental Idealism

Kant's theory of mathematical practice connects not only with his theory of sensibility (as described above) but also with other aspects of the doctrine of Transcendental Idealism, as it is articulated throughout Kant's critical works.

In the Transcendental Analytic, Kant deduces the table of twelve
categories, or pure concepts of the understanding, the first six of
which he describes as “mathematical” (as opposed to
“dynamical”) categories because of their concern with
objects of intuition (B110). The concept of number is treated as
“belonging” to the category of “allness” or
totality, which is itself thought to result from the combination of
the concepts of unity and plurality (Parsons 1984). But, Kant claims
further that difficulties that arise in the representation of
infinities—in which one allegedly represents unity and plurality
with no resulting representation of *number*—reveal that
a concept of number must require the mediation of “a special act
of the understanding” (B111). (This special act is presumably
the *synthesis* that Kant describes as a function of both
imagination and understanding, and which it is the business of the
full theory of judgment—including the Transcendental Deduction
and the Schematism—to explain (Longuenesse 1998).) So, though he
also claims that arithmetic “forms its concepts of numbers
through successive addition of units in time” (4:283), it is
misleading to infer that arithmetic is to time as geometry is to
space, since a formal intuition of time is inadequate to explain the
general and abstract science of
number.^{[5]}
(In fact, Kant declares mechanics to be the
mathematical science that is to time what geometry is to space.)

In the Schematism, Kant undertakes to identify the particular
mechanism that enables the pure concepts of the understanding to
subsume sensible intuitions, with which they are heterogeneous. The
categories must be “schematized” because their
non-empirical origin in pure understanding prevents their having the
sort of sensible content that would connect them immediately to the
objects of experience; transcendental schemata are mediating
representations that are meant to establish the connection between
pure concepts and appearances in a rule-governed way. Mathematical
concepts are discussed in this context since they are unique in being
pure but also sensible concepts: they are pure because they are
strictly *a priori* in origin, and yet they are sensible since
they are constructed *in concreto*. (Kant further complicates
this issue by identifying number as the pure schema of the category of
magnitude (Longuenesse 1998).) There arises an interpretive question
as to whether mathematical concepts, whose conceptual content is given
sensibly, require schematization by a distinguishable “third
thing”, and, if so, what it amounts to (Young 1984). More
broadly, the question arises as to how the transcendental imagination,
the faculty responsible for schematism, operates in mathematical
contexts (Domski 2010).

Finally, in the Analytic of Principles, Kant derives the synthetic
judgments that “flow *a priori* from pure concepts of the
understanding” and which ground all other *a priori*
cognitions, including those of mathematics (A136/B175). The principles
of pure understanding that are associated with the categories of
quantity (i.e., unity, plurality and totality) are the Axioms of
Intuition. Whereas mathematical principles proper are “drawn
only from intuition” and so do not constitute any part of the
system of principles of pure understanding, the explanation for the
possibility of such mathematical principles (outlined above) must be
supplemented by an account of the highest possible transcendental
principles (A148–9/B188–9). Accordingly, the Axioms of
Intuition provide a meta-principle, or principle *of* the
mathematical principles of quantity, namely that “All intuitions
are extensive magnitudes” (A161/B202). Most commentators
interpret Kant here to be indicating why the principles of
mathematics, which have to do with pure space and time, are applicable
to the appearances: the appearances can only be represented
“through the same synthesis as that through which space and time
in general are determined” (A161/B202). So, *all*
intuitions, whether pure or empirical, are “extensive
magnitudes” that are governed by the principles of
mathematics. Expressing an alternative view, Daniel Sutherland sees
the Axioms of Intuition as concerning “not only the
applicability of mathematics but the possibility of any mathematical
cognition whatsoever, whether pure or applied, general or
specific” and so as having wider significance than has been
appreciated (Sutherland 2005b).

(It is also notable that key passages in the *Critique of the
Power of Judgment* deal with mathematics and the
“mathematical sublime” (Breitenbach forthcoming). See
especially [5:248ff].)

## 3. Commentary and Interpretive Debate

Kant's conception of mathematics was debated by his contemporaries;
influenced and provoked Frege, Russell and Husserl; and provided
inspiration for Brouwerian Intuitionism. His conception of mathematics
was rejuvenated as worthy of close historical study by Gottfried
Martin's 1938 monograph *Arithmetik und Kombinatoric bei Kant*
(Martin 1985). Despite the very different positions that contemporary
commentators develop as to how best to understand Kant's thought, they
are broadly united in opposing a long-standard story (perhaps
originally promoted by Bertrand Russell in his *Principles of
Mathematics* and by Rudolph Carnap in his *Philosophical
Foundations of Physics*) according to which the development of
modern logic in the 19^{th} and 20^{th} centuries, the
discovery of non-Euclidean geometries, and the formalization of
mathematics renders Kant's intuition-based theory of mathematics and
related philosophical commitments obsolete or irrelevant. Contemporary
commentators seek to reconstruct Kant's philosophy of mathematics from
the vantage of Kant's own historical context and also to identify the
elements of Kant's philosophy of mathematics that are of eternal
philosophical interest.

In recent times, scholarship on Kant's philosophy of mathematics
has been influenced most strongly by an enduring debate between Jaakko
Hintikka and Charles Parsons over what have come to be known as the
“logical” and “phenomenological”
interpretations of Kant; by Michael Friedman's seminal book, *Kant
and the Exact Sciences* (Friedman 1992), as well as his now
classic articles “Kant's Theory of Geometry” and
“Geometry, Construction and Intuition in Kant and his
Successors” (Friedman 1985, 2000); and by the papers collected
in Carl Posy's volume *Kant's Philosophy of Mathematics* (which
includes contributions by Hintikka, Parsons and Friedman, as well as
by Stephen Barker, Gordon Brittan, William Harper, Philip Kitcher,
Arthur Melnick, Carl Posy, Manley Thompson, and J.Michael Young, all
of which were published more than twenty years ago (Posy
1992).)^{[6]} New
generations of scholars contribute to a lively, fertile and ongoing
discussion about the interpretation and legacy of Kant's philosophy of
mathematics that originated with this literature.

The interpretive debate over how to understand Kant's view of the role of intuition in mathematical reasoning has had the strongest influence on the shape of scholarship in Kant's philosophy of mathematics; this debate is directly related to the question (described above) of the syntheticity of mathematical axioms, theorems and inferences. In his general discussion of mental representation, Kant implies that immediacy and singularity are both criteria of non-conceptual, intuitive representation, the species of representation that grounds synthetic judgment. In a series of papers, Charles Parsons (Parsons 1964, 1969, 1984) has argued that the syntheticity of mathematical judgments depends on mathematical intuitions being fundamentally immediate, and he explains the immediacy of such representations in a perceptual way, as a direct, phenomenological presence to the mind. Jaakko Hintikka (Hintikka 1965, 1967, 1969), developing an idea from E.W. Beth's earlier work, counters that the syntheticity of mathematical judgments instead depends only on the singularity of their intuitive constituents. Hintikka assimilates mathematical intuitions to singular terms or particulars, and explains the use of intuition in a mathematical context by analogy to the logical move of existential instantiation. These two positions have come to be known as the “phenomenological” and “logical” interpretations, respectively.

Michael Friedman's original position (Friedman 1985, 1992) with
respect to the role of intuition in mathematical reasoning descends
from Beth's and Hintikka's, though it is substantially different from
theirs and has been modified in his most recent writings. In
his *Kant and the Exact Sciences *(Friedman 1992), Friedman
takes the position that our modern conception of logic ought to be
used as a tool for interpreting (rather than criticizing) Kant, noting
that the explicit representation of an infinity of mathematical
objects that can be generated by the polyadic logic of modern
quantification theory is conceptually unavailable to the mathematician
and logician of Kant's time. As a result of the inadequacy of monadic
logic to represent an infinity of objects, the eighteenth-century
mathematician relies on intuition to deliver the representations
necessary for mathematical reasoning. Friedman explicates the details
of Kant's philosophy of mathematics on the basis of this historical
insight.

Friedman has modified his original position in response to criticism from Emily Carson (Carson 1997), who has developed an interpretation of Kant's theory of geometry that is Parsonsian in its anti-formalist emphasis on the epistemological and phenomenological over the logical role for intuition in mathematics. In recent work (Friedman 2000, 2010), Friedman argues that the intuition that grounds geometry is fundamentally kinematical, and is best explained by the translations and rotations that describe both the constructive action of the Euclidean geometer and the perceptual point of view of the ordinary, spatially oriented observer. This new account provides a synthesis between the logical and phenomenological interpretive accounts, in large part by connecting the geometrical space that is explored by the imagination via Euclidean constructions to the perspectival space that is, according to Kant, the form of all outer sensibility. More specifically, he reconciles the logical with the phenomenological by “[embedding] the purely logical understanding of geometrical constructions (as Skolem functions) within space as the pure form of our outer sensible intuition (as described in the Transcendental Aesthetic)” (Friedman 2012, n.17).

## Bibliography

References to Kant's texts follow the pagination of the Academy
edition (*Gesammelte Schriften*, Akademie der Wissenschaften
(ed.), Berlin: Reimer/DeGruyter, 1910ff.) References to
the *Critique of Pure Reason* employ the usual A/B
convention. Translations are from the Cambridge Edition of the Works
of Immanuel Kant.

- Anderson, R. L., 2004, “It Adds Up After All: Kant's
Philosophy of Arithmetic in Light of the Traditional
Logic”,
*Philosophy and Phenomenological Research*, 69 (3): 501–540. - Barker, S., 1992, “Kant's View of Geometry: A Partial Defense”, in Posy 1992, pp. 221–244.
- Breitenbach, A., forthcoming, “Beauty in Proofs: Kant on
Aesthetics in Mathematics”,
*European Journal of Philosophy*. - Brittan, G., 1992, “Algebra and Intuition” in Posy 1992, pp. 315–340.
- –––, 2006, “Kant's Philosophy of
Mathematics” in G. Bird (ed.),
*A Companion to Kant*, Malden, MA: Blackwell, pp. 222–235. - Buroker, J. V., 1981,
*Space and Incongruence: The Origin of Kant's Idealism*, Dordrecht: D. Reidel. - Butts, R., 1981, “Rules, Examples and Constructions Kant's
Theory of Mathematics”,
*Synthese*, 47 (2): 257–288. - Carson, E., 1997, “Kant on Intuition in
Geometry”,
*Canadian Journal of Philosophy*, 27 (4): 489–512. - –––, 1999, “Kant on the Method of
Mathematics”,
*Journal of the History of Philosophy*, 37 (4): 629–652. - –––, 2002, “Locke's Account of Certain and
Instructive Knowledge”,
*British Journal for the History of Philosophy*, 10 (3): 359–378. - –––, 2004, “Metaphysics, Mathematics and
the Distinction Between the Sensible and the Intelligible in Kant's
Inaugural Dissertation”,
*Journal of the History of Philosophy*, 42 (2): 165–194. - Domski, M., 2010, “Kant on the Imagination and Geometrical
Certainty”,
*Perspectives on Science*, 18 (4): 409–431. - –––, forthcoming, “Kant and Newton on the
A Priori Necessity of Geometry”,
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Science*. - Domski, M. and Dickson, M. (eds.), 2010,
*Discourse on a New Method: Reinvigorating the Marriage of History and Philosophy of Science*, Chicago: Open Court Publishing. - Dunlop, K., 2012, “Kant and Strawson on the Content of
Geometrical Concepts”,
*Noûs*, 46 (1): 86–126. - Friedman, M., 1985, “Kant's Theory of
Geometry”,
*The Philosophical Review*, 94 (4): 455–506. - –––, 1992,
*Kant and the Exact Sciences*, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - –––, 2000, “Geometry, Construction and
Intuition in Kant and His Successors”, in G. Scher and
R. Tieszen (eds.),
*Between Logic and Intuition: Essays in Honor of Charles Parsons*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 186–218. - –––, 2010, “Synthetic History Reconsidered”, in Domski and Dickson 2010, pp. 573–813.
- –––, 2012, “Kant on Geometry and Spatial
Intuition”,
*Synthese*, 186: 231–255. - Guyer, P. (ed.), 1992,
*The Cambridge Companion to Kant*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Guyer, P. (ed.), 2006,
*The Cambridge Companion to Kant and Modern Philosophy*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Hagar, A., 2008, “Kant and Non-Euclidean
Geometry”,
*Kant-Studien*, 99 (1): 80–98. - Hanna, R., 2002, “Mathematics for Humans: Kant's Philosophy
of Arithmetic Revisited”,
*European Journal of Philosophy*, 10 (3): 328–352. - Harper, W., 1984, “Kant on Space, Empirical Realism and the
Foundations of Geometry”,
*Topoi*, 3 (2): 143–161. [Reprinted in Posy 1992.] - Hatfield, G., 2006, “Kant on the Perception of Space (and Time)”, in Guyer 2006, pp. 61–93.
- Heis, J., forthcoming, “Kant on Parallel Lines”, in Posy and Rechter, forthcoming.
- Hintikka, J., 1965, “
*Kant's ‘New Method of Thought*’ and his Theories of Mathematics”,*Ajatus*, 27: 37–47. - –––, 1967, “Kant on the Mathematical
Method”,
*The Monist*, 51 (3): 352–375. [Reprinted in Posy 1992] - –––, 1969, “
*On Kant's Notion of Intuition*(Anschauung)”, in T. Penelhum and J. J. MacIntosh (eds.),*The First Critique*, Belmont, CA: Wadsworth Publishing. - –––, 1984, “Kant's Transcendental Method
and His Theory of Mathematics”,
*Topoi*, 3 (2): 99–108. [Reprinted in Posy 1992] - Hogan, D., forthcoming, “Kant and the Character of Mathematical Inference”, in Posy and Rechter forthcoming.
- Horstmann, R. P., 1976, “Space as Intuition and
Geometry”,
*Ratio*, 18: 17–30. - Jauernig, A., forthcoming, “The synthetic nature of
geometry, and the role of construction in intuition”, in
S. Bacin, A. Ferrarin, C. La Rocca, and M. Ruffing (eds.),
*Akten des XI. Internationalen Kant Kongresses 2010*, Berlin/New York: Walter de Gruyter. - Kim, J., 2006, “Concepts and Intuitions in Kant's Philosophy
of Geometry”,
*Kant-Studien*, 97 (2):138–162. - Kitcher, P., 1975, “Kant and the Foundations of
Mathematics”,
*The Philosophical Review*, 84 (1): 23–50. [Reprinted in Posy 1992] - Laywine, A., 1993,
*Kant's Early Metaphysics and the Origins of the Critical Philosophy*, Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview. - –––, 2010, “Kant and Lambert on Geometrical Postulates in the Reform of Metaphysics”, in Domski and Dickson 2010, pp. 113–133.
- Longuenesse, B., 1998,
*Kant and the Capacity to Judge*. Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Martin, G. , 1985,
*Arithmetic and Combinatorics: Kant and his Contemporaries*, J. Wubnig, (trans.), Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press. - Melnick, A., 1984, “The Geometry of a Form of
Intuition”,
*Topoi*, 3 (2): 163–168. [Reprinted in Posy 1992] - Parsons, C., 1964, “Infinity and Kant's Conception of the
‘Possibility of Experience’”,
*The Philosophical Review*, 73 (2): 182–197. [Reprinted in Parsons 1983] - –––, 1969, “Kant's Philosophy of
Arithmetic”, in S. Morgenbesser, P. Suppes, and M. White
(eds.),
*Philosophy, Science and Method: Essays in Honor of Ernest Nagel*, New York: St. Martin's Press. [Reprinted in Parsons 1983 and in Posy 1992] - –––, 1983,
*Mathematics in Philosophy: Selected Essays*. Ithaca: Cornell University Press. - –––, 1984, “Arithmetic and the
Categories”,
*Topoi*, 3 (2): 109–121. [Reprinted in Posy 1992.] - –––, 1992, “The Transcendental Aesthetic”, in Guyer 1992, pp. 62–100.
- –––, 2010, “Two Studies in the Reception of Kant's Philosophy of Arithmetic”, in Domski and Dickson 2010, pp. 135–153.
- –––, 2012,
*From Kant to Husserl: Selected Essays*, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - Posy, C., 1984, “Kant's Mathematical Realism”,
*The Monist*, 67: 115–134. [Reprinted in Posy 1992.] - ––– (ed.), 1992,
*Kant's Philosophy of Mathematics: Modern Essays*, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers. - –––, 2008, “Intuition and Infinity: A
Kantian Theme with Echoes in the Foundations of
Mathematics”,
*Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement*, 63: 165–193. - Posy, C. and Rechter, O. (eds.), forthcoming,
*Kant's Philosophy of Mathematics*, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Rechter, O., 2006, “The View from 1763: Kant on the
Arithmetical Method Before Intuition”, in E. Carson and R. Huber
(eds.),
*Intuition and the Axiomatic Method*, Dordrecht: Springer. - Risjord, M., 1990, “The Sensible Foundation for Mathematics:
A Defense of Kant's View”,
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Science*, 21 (1): 123–143. - Rusnock, P., 2004, “Was Kant's Philosophy of Mathematics
Right for His Time?”,
*Kant-Studien*, 95 (4): 426–442. - Schönfeld, M., 2000,
*The Philosophy of the Young Kant: The Precritical Project*, New York: Oxford University Press. - Shabel, L., 1998, “Kant on the ‘Symbolic
Construction’ of Mathematical Concepts”,
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Science*, 29 (4): 589–621. - –––, 2003,
*Mathematics in Kant's Critical Philosophy: Reflections on Mathematical Practice*, New York: Routledge. - –––, 2004, “Kant's ‘Argument from
Geometry’”,
*Journal of the History of Philosophy*42 (2): 195–215. - –––, 2006, “Kant's Philosophy of Mathematics”, in Guyer 2006, pp. 94–128.
- Strawson, P. F., 1966,
*The Bounds of Sense*, London: Methuen, Part Five. - Sutherland, D., 2004a, “Kant's Philosophy of Mathematics and
the Greek Mathematical
Tradition”,
*The Philosophical Review*, 113 (2): 157–201. - –––, 2004b, “The Role of Magnitude in
Kant's Critical Philosophy”,
*Canadian Journal of Philosophy*, 34 (3): 411–441. - –––, 2005a, “Kant on Fundamental
Geometrical Relations”,
*Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie*, 87 (2): 117–158. - –––, 2005b, “The Point of Kant's Axioms of
Intuition”,
*Pacific Philosophical Quarterly*, 86 (1): 135–159. - –––, 2006, “Kant on Arithmetic, Algebra,
and the Theory of Proportions”,
*Journal of the History of Philosophy*, 44 (4): 533–558. - –––, 2010, “Philosophy, Geometry, and Logic in Leibniz, Wolff, and the Early Kant”, in Domski and Dickson 2010, pp. 155–192.
- Thompson, M., 1972, “Singular Terms and Intuitions in Kant's
Epistemology”,
*Review of Metaphysics*, 26 (2): 314–343. [Reprinted in Posy 1992] - van Cleve, J. and Frederick, R. (eds.), 1991,
*The Philosophy of Right and Left: Incongruent Counterparts and the Nature of Space*, Dordrecht, Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers. - van Cleve, J., 1999,
*Problems From Kant*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Young, J. M., 1984, “Construction, Schematism, and
Imagination”,
*Topoi*, 3 (2): 123–131. [Reprinted in Posy 1992]

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Kant: Overview of the Academy Edition,
full description of
*Kant's Gesammelte Schriften*. - Kant on the Web
- North American Kant Society

## Related Entries

analysis |
analytic/synthetic distinction |
*a priori* justification and knowledge |
Kant, Immanuel: critique of metaphysics |
Kant, Immanuel: philosophical development |
Kant, Immanuel: philosophy of science |
Kant, Immanuel: transcendental arguments |
Kant, Immanuel: views on space and time |
mathematics, philosophy of