Supplement to Kant's Philosophy of Religion

The Influence of Kant's Philosophy of Religion

1. Kant's Role in the Origin of Philosophy of Religion

Kant, along with Hume and Hegel, played a central role in the development of philosophy of religion as an area of inquiry distinct from the ways that late medieval and earlier modern philosophers had dealt with the concept of God. (Collins 1967, Dupré 1977, Westphal 1997). These earlier inquiries can be considered forms of “philosophical theology,” i.e., they applied human reason to concepts and claims about God for which Christian theology, understood as a systematic human reflection on divine revelation, served as the primary frame of reference for the truth of such claims. One important function of this kind of inquiry was to determine the extent to which human reason, operating without the assistance of divine revelation, could by its own power establish the meaning, validity and truth of concepts and claims about God. Philosophical theology had been primarily coordinated to the claims Christian theology made on behalf of a divine revelation and was often used as an apologetic on behalf of the reasonableness of Christian beliefs. In contrast, philosophy of religion, as it began to take shape in the eighteenth century, began to function independently of formal theological inquiry and shifted its focus from religion as divinely revealed to religion as a human phenomenon.

2. The Movement from Philosophical Theology to Philosophy of Religion in Kant's own Work

Key elements of this shift can be seen within Kant's own work. In the context of the rationalist systems of Baumgarten, Wolff and Leibniz that stand in the background of Kant's early writings, topics such as the attributes of God, the existence of God and the immortality of the soul were not treated as related parts of an overall philosophical analysis focused upon human religious beliefs and activities. These topics were placed, instead, within one or another of the three fields—rational psychology, cosmology and rational theology—that rationalist systems typically proposed as the division for the inquiry that properly follows upon the investigation that metaphysics makes into “being” as the most general object of philosophical study. These three fields of “special metaphysics” thus each had a particular field or type of being as its proper object: the immaterial being of the soul as object for rational psychology, the material being of the physical universe for cosmology and the infinite being of God for rational theology. Even in the Critique of Pure Reason (1781) Kant deals with these topics mainly in terms of their placement within such a system of metaphysics. His arguments that focus on the concepts of God and the soul are primarily concerned to show their philosophical incoherence as they were articulated within those systems: These notions were incoherent in that they were in principle not subject to the spatio-temporal framework necessary to constitute them as valid objects of “experience” for the legitimate speculative use of reason. Kant's arguments here do not directly bear upon the functions of notions of God and the soul within the complex structure of human religious belief and practice. He is nonetheless well aware that the conclusions drawn from his arguments in the 1st Critique will have significant implications for articulating an understanding of religion appropriate to the finite reason that characterizes humanity's unique status at the juncture of nature and freedom.

Although Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1793) is closely tied to Kant's larger critical project, it also signals the shift in focus to religion as human phenomenon that distinguishes philosophy of religion from prior forms of philosophical theology. In keeping with the “Copernican revolution” that places the constructive activities of the human subject at the center of philosophical analysis, Kant's treatment of religion in this work does not function as a preliminary step in an apologetic on behalf of claims made on the basis of divine revelation. He is concerned, instead, to place the central religious concepts of sin and salvation historically articulated by Christianity into the framework of meaning that has been legitimated by the critically disciplined human reason as delimited in his three Critiques. This framework requires that severe limits be placed on the theoretical claims about God and the soul that are embedded in these Christian doctrines of sin and salvation. Placing such limits, however, serves to exhibit what Kant considers to be the authentic religious meaning of these doctrines, i.e., their bearing upon the moral freedom of human agents and the moral destiny of the human species as the unique juncture of freedom and nature. Kant thus sees the human significance of religion rooted in the exercise of human moral freedom in both its individual and social dimensions.

3. Lines of Influence from Kant's Philosophy of Religion

As is the case with his overall critical project, Kant's treatment of religion has been put to use in divergent and sometimes even contrary ways in subsequent philosophical discussion. There is no simple way to classify all the influences upon philosophy of religion that can trace their lineage back to Kant's discussions. One reason for this is that different weight can be given to the importance that Kant's own texts on religious and theological topics have relative to one another. For some philosophers of religion, the crucial arguments are the ones articulated in the Transcendental Dialectic of the Critique of Pure Reason against the proofs for the existence of God. For others, the more important element in Kant's treatment of religion is his effort to base authentic religion on morality. And for yet others, Kant's importance for philosophy of religion rests upon his attempts to see religion in terms of a symbolic (in contrast to a cognitive) field of human meaning. The following description of some of the more important directions taken in philosophy of religion subsequent to Kant is thus offered more as illustrative than comprehensive. It does not seek to adjudicate the question of which among these deserves to be called the most “authentically” Kantian; it rather indicates the range of influence that Kant's treatment of religion has had and continues to have.

3.1 Arguments for the Existence of God

Kant's criticisms of the arguments for the existence of God typically used in rationalist metaphysics remain among the most influential elements of his heritage. This influence extends not merely to later discussions of these arguments in philosophy of religion but also enters into views of the history of philosophy that see these criticisms as an important marker of “the end of metaphysics.” Kant's criticisms are frequently aligned with other arguments against the possibility of articulating a valid theoretical proof for the existence of God—e.g., those that issue from skeptical positions such as David Hume's. While the prevailing consensus has been that Kant's criticisms decisively undercut these modes of rational proof, the mid-twentieth century saw a revival of interest in the ontological argument, particularly in the forms proposed by Anselm of Canterbury (see Harshorne 1965, Hick 1967, Malcolm 1960, and Plantinga 1965). On some accounts Anselm's arguments may escape Kant's criticisms, which were directed against forms the argument took in the distillation that rationalist metaphysicians such as Baumgarten and Wolff had made of the versions offered by Leibniz and Descartes. More recently, Iris Murdoch has linked the ontological argument in an intriguing way to Kant's ethics (Murdoch 1993). The neo-scholastic and neo-Thomist traditions, which also reject the ontological argument (as did Thomas Aquinas), do not accept Kant's account that makes the ontological proof fundamental to other arguments (e.g., cosmological, teleological) that Aquinas formulated to demonstrate that there is a God.

3.2 The Relation Between Morality and Religion

Of at least equal influence has been Kant's effort to analyze religion as fundamentally based on morality, though there is also significant disagreement about the correctness and the consequences of Kant's position. A common view is that Kant effectively reduces religion to morality without remainder. On this account, Kant's work functions as an important step in freeing humanity from the grip of dogmatic and ritualistic religion. Other views see Kant's account of religion as non-reductive and thus according religion a scope and value distinctive from morality. Some recent reconstructions of Kant's view in which religion functions non-reductively with respect to morality can be found in the work of Ronald M. Green (1978, 1988) and of John Hare (1997). Green (1992) has also argued for a close connection between the views of Kant and Kierkegaard on the relation of religion to morality. Other interpretations find Kant according positive value to religion in conjunction with his views on human responsibility for history, society and culture. On some of these accounts, Kant offers a philosophical and social reconstruction of the eschatological hopes that Christianity articulates under the image of the “kingdom of God” (Goldmann 1971, Schaeffler 1979).

3.3 Influences on Theology

Kant's efforts to root religion in morality also had a significant impact on Protestant theology in Europe during the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, particularly in various forms of what has been termed “liberal theology” or “liberal Protestantism,” which often placed great stress on the moral content of Christianity, particularly as an instrument of social reform. A significant early text that prefigures important features of such liberal theology is the first part of an essay that Hegel wrote in 1795-6 (unpublished until 1907), “The Positivity of the Christian Religion,” in which he presents Jesus' primary religious mission as embodying and preaching the Kantian categorical imperative (Knox 1948). Kant's philosophy and his account of religion also drew significant attention from one of the most significant Protestant theologians of the twentieth century, Karl Barth (1886-1968). He provides an astute analysis of Kant and the impact of Kant's thought upon theology in Protestant Theology in the Nineteenth Century (1973). The beginning of the twenty-first century has seen the emergence of interpretations of Kant's account of God, faith and religion that takes its bearing upon Christian doctrines such as the Redemption and the Incarnation (particularly as they are understood in Reformed and Evangelical theological tradtions) to be “theologically affirmative.” These interpretations stand in contrast to the prevailing view of much twentieth-century Kant scholarship that takes his account of religion to be at least skeptical of these doctrines or even to entail their denial. (See Palmquist and Firestone & Palmquist 2006, Firestone & Jacobs 2008, Palmquist 2000, Hare 1996, 2001; for critical assessments of this approach, see Byrne 2007, especially Chapters 1 and 8, Rossi 2005, and Yandell 2007). Kant's philosophy was of interest to some Catholic thinkers who were his contemporaries; subsequent to the placement of an Italian translation of the Critique of Pure Reason on the Index of Prohibited Books in 1827, however, Kant was generally treated as an adversary to be refuted by the resurgent neo-Thomism of the later nineteenth and early twentieth century (see Mercier, 2002, for an example of such adversarial treatment of Kant by one of the important figures in the revival of Thomism). In contrast to this generally negative treatment of Kant, the Belgian Catholic philosopher Joseph Maréchal, S.J., (1878-1944) proposed an understanding of Kant's transcendental method that has had an impact on contemporary Catholic theology, most notably through the German theologian Karl Rahner, S.J. (1904-1984). Kant's specific views on religion have had less direct impact on Catholic theology, although there has been recent discussion about the appropriate location of his treatment of grace on the spectrum of theological positions that run from Calvinist to Lutheran to Catholic. Jacqueline Mariña (1997) argues that Kant's view is closest to a Catholic understanding of grace. (See also Adams 1999.) In addtion, recent studies of the Catholic reception of Kant's work (Fischer 2005) have put into question the adequacy of the interpretation on which neo-scholastic and neo-Thomist thinkers judged Kant's crtical project to be a subjectivist and relativist enterprise that stands in inplacable opposition to Catholic theology.

3.4 Religion as Non-cognitive and as Symbolic

Most of the interpretations of Kant's treatment of religion that have been mentioned take his account to remove religious claims from the arena of theoretical cognition. Placing religion in the realm of the non-cognitive has been central for a number of later philosophical accounts of religion. Some of these relegate religion to the realm of feeling, with varying assessments about the value of placing it within human interiority and subjectivity. Thus Kierkegaard and Schleiermacher, who disagree with Kant on many matters about religion, premise their respective defenses of Christian living and belief on the placement of authentic religion at a level of human subjectivity that lies beyond the range of theoretical knowledge. In contrast, a plausible case can be made that at the root of the atheistic positions of thinkers such as Feuerbach and Marx stands the same basic Kantian conclusion about the non-cognitive status of religious claims. There are, in addition, other philosophical accounts of religion that view it as non-cognitive and then move in directions influenced by Kant's more constructive accounts of religion that reference the validity and significance of religious concepts to symbolic or aesthetic meaning. Accounts of this kind can be found not only among thinkers who are primarily considered philosophers of religion, e.g., Rudolph Otto, but also among those who are recognized as theologians, e.g., Paul Tillich (see Davidovich 1993). The Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), which can be overlooked in treatments of Kant's understanding of religion, is nonetheless a crucial text for locating his influence upon the development of this way of construing religion.

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Copyright © 2009 by
Philip Rossi <philip.rossi@marquette.edu>

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