Kant's Transcendental Idealism

First published Fri Mar 4, 2016

In the Critique of Pure Reason Kant argues that space and time are merely formal features of how we perceive objects, not things in themselves that exist independently of us, or properties or relations among them. Objects in space and time are said to be “appearances”, and he argues that we know nothing of substance about the things in themselves of which they are appearances. Kant calls this doctrine (or set of doctrines) “transcendental idealism”, and ever since the publication of the first edition of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781, Kant’s readers have wondered, and debated, what exactly transcendental idealism is, and have developed quite different interpretations. Some, including many of Kant’s contemporaries, interpret transcendental idealism as essentially a form of phenomenalism, similar in some respects to that of Berkeley, while others think that it is not a metaphysical or ontological theory at all. There is probably no major interpretive question in Kant’s philosophy on which there is so little consensus. This entry provides an introduction to the most important Kantian texts, as well as the interpretive and philosophical issues surrounding them.

1. Appearances and Things in Themselves

In the first edition (A) of the Critique of Pure Reason, published in 1781, Kant argues for a surprising set of claims about space, time, and objects:

  • Space and time are merely the forms of our sensible intuition of objects. They are not beings that exist independently of our intuition (things in themselves), nor are they properties of, nor relations among, such beings. (A26, A33)
  • The objects we intuit in space and time are appearances, not objects that exist independently of our intuition (things in themselves). This is also true of the mental states we intuit in introspection; in “inner sense” (introspective awareness of my inner states) I intuit only how I appear to myself, not how I am “in myself”. (A37–8, A42)
  • We can only cognize objects that we can, in principle, intuit. Consequently, we can only cognize objects in space and time, appearances. We cannot cognize things in themselves. (A239)
  • Nonetheless, we can think about things in themselves using the categories (A254).
  • Things in themselves affect us, activating our sensible faculty (A190, A387).[1]

In the “Fourth Paralogism” Kant defines “transcendental idealism”:

I understand by the transcendental idealism of all appearances [Erscheinungen] the doctrine that they are all together to be regarded as mere representations and not as things in themselves [nicht als Dinge an sich selbst ansehen], and accordingly that space and time are only sensible forms of our intuition, but not determinations given for themselves or conditions of objects as things in themselves [als Dinge an sich selbst]. (A369; the Critique is quoted from the Guyer & Wood translation (1998))

Ever since 1781, the meaning and significance of Kant’s “transcendental idealism” has been a subject of controversy. Kant’s doctrines raise numerous interpretive questions, which cluster around three sets of issues:

  • (a) The nature of appearances. Are they (as Kant sometimes suggests) identical to representations, i.e., states of our minds? If so, does Kant follow Berkeley in equating bodies (objects in space) with ideas (representations)? If not, what are they, and what relation do they have to our representations of them?
  • (b) The nature of things in themselves. What can we say positively about them? What does it mean that they are not in space and time? How is this claim compatible with the doctrine that we cannot know anything about them? How is the claim that they affect us compatible with that doctrine? Is Kant committed to the existence of things in themselves, or is the concept of a “thing in itself” merely the concept of a way objects might be (for all we know)?
  • (c) The relation of things in themselves to appearances. Is the appearance/thing in itself distinction an ontological one between two different kinds of objects? If not, is it a distinction between two aspects of one and the same kind of object? Or perhaps an adverbial distinction between two different ways of considering the same objects?

Sections 2–6 examine various influential interpretations of transcendental idealism, focusing on their consequences for (a)–(c). Section 7 is devoted more narrowly to the nature of things in themselves, topic (b), and the related Kantian notions: noumena, and the transcendental object. The primary focus will be the Critique of Pure Reason itself; while transcendental idealism, arguably, plays an equally crucial role in the other Critiques, discussing them would take us too far afield into Kant’s ethics, aesthetics, and teleology.[2] While transcendental idealism is a view both about space and time, and thus of objects of outer sense as well as inner sense (my own mental states), this entry will focus on Kant’s views about space and outer objects. Kant’s transcendental idealist theory of time is too intimately tied up with his theory of the self, and the argument of the transcendental deduction, to discuss here (see Falkenstein 1991; Van Cleve 1999: 52–61; and Dunlop 2009 for more on Kant’s theory of time).

Before discussing the details of different interpretations, though, it will be helpful if readers have an overview of some relevant texts and some sense of their prima facie meaning. The interpretation of these texts offered in this section is provisional; later, we will see powerful reasons to question whether they are correct. Since some scholars claim there is a change in Kant’s doctrine from the A edition of 1781 to the B edition of 1787, we will begin by restricting attention to the A edition. Section 2.4 discusses what relevance the changes made in the B edition have for the interpretation of transcendental idealism. However, following standard scholarly practice, for passages present in both editions, the A page number followed by the B page number is given (e.g., A575/B603). Works other than the Critique are cited by volume in the “Academy” edition of Kant’s work (Ak.), followed by the page number. At the end of this article can be found a guide to all the editions and translations of Kant used in its preparation.

1.1 Transcendental Realism and Empirical Idealism

One promising place to begin understanding transcendental idealism is to look at the other philosophical positions from which Kant distinguishes it. In the “Fourth Paralogism”, he distinguishes transcendental idealism from transcendental realism:

To this [transcendental] idealism is opposed transcendental realism, which regards space and time as something given in themselves (independent of our sensibility). The transcendental realist therefore represents outer appearances (if their reality is conceded) as things in themselves [Dinge an sich selbst], which would exist independently of us and our sensibility and thus would also be outside us according to pure concepts of the understanding. (A369)

Transcendental realism, according to this passage, is the view that objects in space and time exist independently of our experience of them, while transcendental idealism denies this. This point is reiterated later in the Critique when Kant writes:

We have sufficiently proved in the Transcendental Aesthetic that everything intuited in space or in time, hence all objects of an experience possible for us, are nothing but appearances, i.e., mere representations, which, as they are represented, as extended beings or series of alterations, have outside our thoughts no existence grounded in itself. This doctrine I call transcendental idealism. The realist, in the transcendental signification, makes these modifications of our sensibility into things subsisting in themselves, and hence makes mere representations into things in themselves [Sachen an sich selbst]. (A491/B519)[3]

Appearances exist at least partly in virtue of our experience of them, while the existence of things in themselves is not grounded in our experience at all (cf. A369, A492/B521, A493/B522). Kant calls transcendental realism the “common prejudice” (A740/B768) and describes it as a “common but fallacious presupposition” (A536/B564; cf. Allison 2004: 22). Transcendental realism is the commonsense pre-theoretic view that objects in space and time are “things in themselves”, which Kant, of course, denies.

Kant also distinguishes transcendental idealism from another position he calls “empirical idealism”:

One would also do us an injustice if one tried to ascribe to us that long-decried empirical idealism that, while assuming the proper reality of space, denies the existence of extended beings in it, or at least finds this existence doubtful, and so in this respect admits no satisfactorily provable distinction between dream and truth. As to the appearances of inner sense in time, it finds no difficulty in them as real things, indeed, it even asserts that this inner experience and it alone gives sufficient proof of the real existence of their object (in itself) along with all this time-determination. (A491/B519)

Empirical idealism, as Kant here characterizes it, is the view that all we know immediately (non-inferentially) is the existence of our own minds and our temporally ordered mental states, while we can only infer the existence of objects “outside” us in space. Since the inference from a known effect to an unknown cause is always uncertain, the empirical idealist concludes we cannot know that objects exist outside us in space. Kant typically distinguishes two varieties of empirical idealism: dogmatic idealism, which claims that objects in space do not exist, and problematic idealism, which claims that objects in space may exist, but we cannot know whether they do (see A377). Although he is never mentioned by name in the A Edition, Berkeley seems to be Kant’s paradigm dogmatic idealist, while Descartes is named as the paradigm problematic idealist.[4]

Transcendental idealism is a form of empirical realism because it entails that we have immediate (non-inferential) and certain knowledge of the existence of objects in space merely through self-consciousness:

[…] external objects (bodies) are merely appearances, hence also nothing other than a species of my representations, whose objects are something only through these representations, but are nothing separated from them. Thus external things exist as well as my self, and indeed both exist on the immediate testimony of my self-consciousness, only with this difference: the representation of my Self, as the thinking subject is related merely to inner sense, but the representations that designate extended beings are also related to outer sense. I am no more necessitated to draw inferences in respect of the reality of external objects than I am in regard to the reality of my inner sense (my thoughts), for in both cases they are nothing but representations, the immediate perception (consciousness) of which is at the same time a sufficient proof of their reality. (A370–1)

Merely through self-conscious introspection I can know that I have representations with certain contents and since appearances are “nothing other than a species of my representations” this constitutes immediate and certain knowledge of the existence of objects in space.

Understanding transcendental idealism requires understanding the precise sense in which things in themselves are, and appearances are not, “external to” or “independent” of the mind and Kant draws a helpful distinction between two senses in which objects can be “outside me”:

But since the expression outside us carries with it an unavoidable ambiguity, since it sometimes signifies something that, as a thing in itself [Ding an sich selbst], exists distinct from us and sometimes merely that belongs to outer appearance, then in order to escape uncertainty and use this concept in the latter significance—in which it is taken in the proper psychological question about the reality of our outer intuition—we will distinguish empirically external objects from those that might be called “external” in the transcendental sense, by directly calling them “things that are to be encountered in space”. (A373)

In the transcendental sense, an object is “outside me” when its existence does not depend (even partly) on my representations of it. The empirical sense of “outside me” depends upon the distinction between outer and inner sense. Inner sense is the sensible intuition of my inner states (which are themselves appearances); time is the form of inner sense, meaning that all the states we intuit in inner sense are temporally ordered. Outer sense is the sensible intuition of objects that are not my inner states; space is the form of outer sense. In the empirical sense, “outer” simply refers to objects of outer sense, objects in space. Transcendental idealism is the view that objects in space are “outer” in the empirical sense but not in the transcendental sense. Things in themselves are transcendentally “outer” but appearances are not.

1.2 The Empirical Thing in Itself

Just as Kant distinguishes a transcendental from an empirical sense of “outer” he also distinguishes a transcendental version of the appearance/thing in itself distinction (the distinction we have been concerned with up to now) from an empirical version of that distinction. The key text here is A45–46/B62–63, which for reasons of brevity will not be quoted in full (cf. the discussion of the rose at A29–30/B45, as well as A257/B313).

In the empirical case, the distinction seems to be between the physical properties of an object and the sensory qualities it presents to differently situated human observers. This requires distinguishing between what is “valid for every human sense in general” and what “pertains to [objects] only contingently because [of] … a particular situation or organization of this or that sense” (A45/B62). The distinction seems to be that some properties of objects are represented in experience just in virtue of the a priori forms of experience, and thus have inter-subjective validity for all cognitive subjects, while some properties depend upon the particular constitution of our sense organs (cf. A226/B273). The “empirical thing in itself” is the empirical object qua bearer of the former set of properties, while the “empirical appearance” is the empirical object qua bearer of all of its properties, including the latter. For instance, the empirical “rainbow in itself” is a collection of water droplets with particular sizes and shapes and spatial relations, while the empirical “rainbow appearance” is the colorful band we see in the sky.[5]

For our purposes, the importance of this distinction is two-fold. Firstly, the (transcendental) distinction is not the ordinary distinction between how objects appear to us in sense perception and the properties they actually have. Kantian appearances are not the objects of ordinary sense perception, for Kant holds that appearances in themselves (things in themselves, in the empirical sense) lack sensory qualities like color, taste, texture, etc. In scientific research, we may discover how appearances are in themselves (in the empirical sense) but in so doing all we discover is more appearance (in the transcendental sense); scientific investigation into the ultimate constituents or causal determinants of objects only reveals more appearance, not things in themselves. Secondly, there is an appearance/reality distinction at the level of appearances. This provides a further sense in which Kant is an “empirical realist”: appearances in themselves have properties quite different than they seem to have in sense perception.

Kant’s empirical realism—not in his technical sense, but in the broader sense that he accepts an appearance/reality distinction at the level of appearances (see Abela 2002)—is further deepened by his scientific realism: he accepts the existence of unobservable entities posited by our best scientific theories and holds that these entities are appearances (because they are in space).[6] Earlier, we saw texts whose prima facie meaning is that appearances exist, at least partly, in virtue of the contents of our representations of them. But it is clear that Kant cannot hold that the existence of an object in space is grounded in our direct perception of that object, for that would be incompatible with the existence of unperceived spatial objects.

2. The Feder-Garve Review and Kant’s Replies

The first published review of the Critique of Pure Reason, by Feder and Garve (1782), accuses Kant of holding a basically Berkeleyan phenomenalist conception of objects in space. Feder and Garve were not the only ones to read Kant as a phenomenalist. The phenomenalist reading was so widespread and influential that it became the default interpretation for generations after the publication of the Critique. In fact, many of the key figures in German philosophy in 1781 and after (e.g., Mendelssohn, Eberhard, Hamann, Jacobi, Fichte, Schelling) take the phenomenalist or “subjectivist” reading of Kant for granted and think this is precisely why Kant must be “overcome”. The assumption that Kant is a subjectivist about appearances is a major impetus in the development of German idealism.[7]

However, the phenomenalist reading of transcendental idealism has been challenged on many fronts, both as an interpretation of Kant and (often on the assumption that it is Kant’s view) on its own philosophical merits. This section explores the origin of the phenomenalist reading in the Feder-Garve review and its basis in the text of the Critique. The next section provides some reasons to think that the phenomenalist reading is more defensible as an interpretation of Kant than is sometimes appreciated. Section 3.4 explores influential objections by Kant’s contemporaries to transcendental idealism, on the assumption that the phenomenalist interpretation of that doctrine is correct, which were later taken up as criticisms of the phenomenalist interpretation itself. Section 4 introduces a theme explored in greater detail in later sections: the development of non-phenomenalist interpretations of Kant’s transcendental idealism.

2.1 The Feder-Garve review

Although it is uncharitable and, on some points, simply mistaken, the first published review of the Critique, originally written by Christian Garve and then substantially revised, and shortened, by J.G.H. Feder, raised an issue that has been discussed ever since.[8] The Göttingen, or “Feder-Garve” review, as it is now known, claims that Kantian “transcendental” idealism is just idealism of a familiar Berkeleyan or phenomenalist variety (Sassen 2000: 53).

First of all, it should be noted that the Feder-Garve view, while not exactly an exercise in interpretive charity, is not without a basis in claiming that there is a deep similarity between Berkeley and the Critique (this point is brought out well in Beiser 2002: 49–52). First of all, Kant repeatedly claims that empirical objects are representations. For instance, in the “Transcendental Aesthetic” he writes that “what we call outer objects are nothing other than mere representations of our sensibility” (A30/B45) and in the “Fourth Paralogism” he writes: “external objects (bodies) are merely appearances, hence also nothing other than a species of my representations” (A370; see also A30/B45, A104 and A375n, A490, A498, A563). Since “representation” [Vorstellung] is Kant’s term for what Berkeley calls “ideas”, this seems at least perilously close to the Berkeleyan view that bodies are collections of ideas. Secondly, the A Edition is full of passages that can easily suggest a phenomenalist view of objects in space, such as:

Why do we have need of a doctrine of the soul grounded merely on pure rational principles? Without doubt chiefly with the intent of securing our thinking Self from the danger of materialism. But this is achieved by the rational concept of our thinking Self that we have given. For according to it, so little fear remains that if one took matter away then all thinking and even the existence of thinking beings would be abolished, that it rather shows clearly that if I were to take away the thinking subject, the whole corporeal world would have to disappear, as this is nothing but the appearance in the sensibility of our subject and one mode of its representations. (A383; cf. A374n, A490–1/B518–9, A520/B492–A521/B493, A494/B522)

On one plausible reading of these passages, Kant is claiming that all there is for objects in space to exist is for us to have experiences as of objects in space. Consequently, if we did not exist, or did not have such experiences, these objects would not exist. The Feder-Garve interpretation of transcendental idealism is not without some merit.[9]

2.2 Varieties of Phenomenalism

Phenomenalism can mean many things, and later we will explore these meanings in detail, but for now it is worth distinguishing at least three different things we might mean by phenomenalism:

  • (1) Objects in space are identical to (unified collections of) our representations.[10]
  • (2) Objects in space exist solely in virtue of the contents of our representations of them. They possess all of their properties solely in virtue of the contents of those representations.
  • (3) Objects in space exist partly in virtue of the contents of our representations of them. They possess their “core physical properties” solely in virtue of the contents of those representations.

By “core physical properties” I mean the properties that appearance have “in themselves” according to Kant, roughly, Lockean primary qualities (see Locke, Essay concerning Human Understanding, book II, chapter VIII). Feder-Garve accuse Kant of holding (1), which I will call “identity phenomenalism”. But even if he did not hold that extreme view, he might hold one of the weaker views listed here. Claim (2) is a quite strong form of phenomenalism, for it entails that, in some sense, all there is to objects is our representations of them, although they are not literally identical to those representation. I will call this “strong phenomenalism”. The exact meaning of Berkeley’s own views about bodies is unclear, and not the subject of this entry. But it is not implausible to read Berkeley as holding (2). However, claim (3), while very controversial and (arguably) extremely counter-intuitive, is weaker. It allows that there may be more to the existence of objects in space than our representing them, and it allows that there may be aspects or properties of objects that they possess independently of how we represent them. I will call it “qualified phenomenalism”. In discussing the debate about Kant’s alleged phenomenalism, and Kant’s own responses to the Feder-Garve review, it will help to have these distinctions in mind.

2.3 Kant Strikes Back

Kant’s was apoplectic that Feder and Garve had, apparently, not made any serious attempt to even understand the Critique, or to present its contents accurately to their readers. He penned a response to the review, published as an appendix to the Prolegomena. In the appendix, and in the text of the Prolegomena itself, Kant explains what he sees as clear differences between his own view and Berkeley’s. First, Kant identifies idealism as the doctrine that

all cognition through the senses and experience is nothing but sheer illusion, and there is truth only in the ideas of pure understanding and reason (Ak. 4:374)

and points out that, in this sense, his view is not idealism at all because the Critique consistently maintains that bodies exist in space and that we have immediate (non-inferential) knowledge of them.[11] Secondly, Kant points out that his idealism is merely formal: he has argued only that the form of objects is due to our minds, not their matter (cf. Kant’s Dec. 4 1792 letter to J.S. Beck (Ak. 11:395)). While the form-matter distinction in Kant’s philosophy is a complex matter in its own right, Kant’s point seems to be that the matter of experience, the sensory content that is perceptually and conceptually structured by space and time, and the categories, respectively, is not generated by the mind itself, but is produced in our minds through affection by mind-independent objects, things in themselves (see, however, section 3.4 for some reasons to be suspicious of the doctrine of “noumenal affection”). As he would write several years later in response to Eberhard, the Critique

posits this ground of the matter of sensory representations not once again in things, as objects of the senses, but in something super-sensible, which grounds the latter, and of which we can have no cognition. (Discovery, Ak. 8:205)

Thus, Kant can claim that only the form of experience is mind-dependent, not its matter; the matter of experience depends upon a source outside of the mind.[12]

However, Kant’s attempts to distance himself from Berkeley may not cut as deep as he seems to think. Regarding the first point, Kant’s definition of idealism in the Appendix (quoted above) does not apply to Berkeley. Nor is it clear that his definition in the body of the Prolegomena does either:

the claim that there are none other than thinking beings; the other things that we believe we perceive in intuition are only representations in thinking beings, to which in fact no object existing outside these beings corresponds. (Ak. 4:289)

One of the main points of Berkeley’s philosophical project is to defend the existence of bodies in space, while denying what he takes to be a philosophical misinterpretation of what this existence amounts to: the existence of non-thinking substances. Berkeley does not deny that bodies exist; he claims that bodies cannot exist without minds to perceive them, something that Kant himself also seems to accept (see the texts quoted in the previous section). In fact, Berkeley constantly contends that his theory is the only way to avoid what Kant calls “problematic” idealism: we do not know whether bodies exist (Treatise on the Principles of Human Knowledge, Part I, § 1, 6, 18, 20, 22–24, 34–38). That Kant would describe Berkeley as an idealist in this sense (what he elsewhere designates a “dogmatic idealist”) raises the suspicion that has misread Berkeley.[13] Since the misinterpretation of Berkeley as holding that sense perception is illusory and that bodies do not exist was widespread in Germany in the eighteenth-century (again, see Beiser 2002), it is quite possible that Kant shares it. It may be that Kant is more similar to Berkeley than he realizes because he is not familiar with Berkeley’s actual theory.

Nor does another points Kant makes—that Kant’s idealism concerns merely the form and not the matter of experience—constitute a clear difference from Berkeley. Berkeley does not claim that human spirits are the causes of their own ideas; he claims that God acts on human spirits, causing us to perceive an internally and inter-subjectively consistent world of ideas. Since Kant’s official doctrine in the Critique seems to require agnosticism about the ultimate nature of the things in themselves that causally affect us in experience, it is compatible with what he says that the noumenal cause of experience is God himself.

Kant’s argument might be that the matter of experience (its sensory content) depends upon how our sensibility is affected by mind-independent objects, things in themselves, while the form of experience is determined by our minds alone. Consequently, experience itself requires the existence of objects “outside” (in the transcendental sense) the mind. But this would show, at most, that Kant is not a strong phenomenalist. It does not undercut the interpretation of him as a qualified phenomenalist. Nor does it succeed in clearly differentiating him from Berkeley. (See the supplementary article: Kant’s Attempts to Distance Himself from Berkeley.) This, of course, does not settle the issue; it may be that Kantian appearances are quite different than bodies, as Berkeley, or even the qualified phenomenalist, conceive them (for important discussions of transcendental idealism in the Prolegomena see Ak. 4:283–4, 286, 289–294, 314–315, 320).

2.4 Changes in the B Edition

Kant extensively revised certain sections of the Critique for the second edition (B), published in 1787. It is widely accepted that a main consideration in these revisions was to avoid the misunderstanding of his view that had led to the Feder-Garve review. However, some scholars think that, on this point, there is a difference in doctrine between the A and B editions: made aware of the problematic Berkeleyan consequences of the first edition, Kant endeavored to develop a more realistic view in the B Edition.[14] Other scholars think the difference is largely a matter of presentation: in the B edition, Kant highlights the more realistic aspects of his view and downplays its phenomenalistic sides, but the view is basically the same (e.g., Allison 2004). The rest of this section considers the main textual changes from 1781 to 1787 and consider what implications they have for the interpretation of Kant’s idealism. Since Kant made no significant changes past the Paralogisms chapter, I will not cite sections that did not undergo substantial revision as evidence; it may be that Kant would have significantly changed those sections if he had gotten there (on the general topic of the changes from the A to the B edition, see Erdmann 1878).

Kant did, however, make one relatively minor alteration in the later sections (in the “Antinomies”, to be specific) that is relevant to our discussion. In the wake of the Feder-Garve view, Kant evidently felt that “transcendental” idealism may have been a poor choice of name.[15] In the B Edition Kant adds a footnote to his definition of transcendental idealism at A491/519 (quoted earlier) to remark that perhaps he should have called his position “critical idealism”.[16] The section Kant most heavily revised for the B Edition is the “Transcendental Deduction”, but I do not have space here to discuss the complex argument of that section, or the differences between the A “Deduction” and the B “Deduction”

2.4.1 Objects as representations

As mentioned earlier, one of the main sources, both in the eighteenth century and today, for the phenomenalist reading of Kant is Kant’s tendency to identify empirical objects with representations. But Kant continues to do this in the B Edition, not only in sections that were heavily revised for the B Edition[17] but even in passages that were added to the B Edition (e.g., B164).

2.4.2 Preface

The B Preface contains several passages, which some scholars take to be inconsistent with the phenomenalist reading. They are discussed below in section 4.1.

2.4.3 Transcendental Aesthetic

The main addition to the B “Transcendental Aesthetic” is several pages (B66–69) at the end of the section, which includes this discussion, a clear reference to the Feder-Garve review:

If I say: in space and time intuition represents both outer objects as well as the self-intuition of the mind as each affects our senses, i.e., as it appears, that is not to say that these objects would be a mere illusion. […] Thus I do not say that objects merely seem to exist outside me or that my soul only seems to be given if I assert that the quality of space […] lies in my kind of intuition and not in these objects in themselves. It would be my own fault if I made that which I should count as appearance [Erscheinung] into mere illusion [bloßen Schein]. (B70–1)

This reiterates a theme found in the A edition and in the Prolegomena: transcendental idealism does not entail that objects in space are illusions. Later in the paragraph Kant argues that, if we assume that if space and time must be “infinite substances”, if they exist at all, then we cannot blame Berkeley for concluding that space, time, and bodies are mere illusions; empirical idealism is the right conclusion to draw from transcendental realism, according to Kant. While Kant is correct in representing Berkeley later in this paragraph as reacting against the Newtonian view of space and time as “absolute” entities, he is wrong to characterize Berkeley as concluding that bodies are mere illusions, so Kant’s dissatisfaction with Berkeley’s own view is not evidence that he does not have a some variety of phenomenalist view of objects in space. The B “Transcendental Aesthetic” adds no new evidence against the phenomenalist reading.

2.4.4 Paralogisms

One main source of the phenomenalist reading is the A Edition “Fourth Paralogism”, in which Kant refutes the “Cartesian” view that our inner states are immediately known while the existence of outer objects can only be known mediately by inference from our inner states. The Paralogisms section was entirely re-written in the B Edition, and none of the four B Paralogisms correspond precisely to the fourth A Paralogism. The A Edition “Fourth Paralogoism” is the source of many of the passages quoted above, and, historically, an important source for the phenomenalist interpretation. The fact that it was, effectively, removed in the B Edition has led many scholars to reject the phenomenalist interpretation, at least with respect to the B Edition (with some averring that he changed his mind from the A to the B Edition).[18] A version of the A Paralogism argument that self-consciousness requires knowledge of objects in space reappears as the “Refutation of Idealism”, added in the B Edition.

2.4.5 Refutation of Idealism

Given its brevity, the “Refutation of Idealism”, added to the “Postulates of empirical thinking in general” in the B Edition, is, line for line, one of the most thoroughly commented upon passages in all of Kant’s writings.[19] Kant’s argument, very briefly, is that the existence of objects in space outside me (“empirically external” objects) is a condition on the possibility of my being conscious of the determinate temporal relations of my inner states. Consequently, it is impossible to be a self-conscious subject without there existing objects in space outside of me, and in being conscious of the temporal relations of my inner states I am immediately conscious of the existence of these objects.[20] The problem of “problematic idealism”—how can I infer the existence of objects outside of me on the basis of my immediate knowledge of my inner states?—is based on a false premise.

Nothing about this conclusion, or how Kant argues for it, is prima facie incompatible with a qualified phenomenalist reading of transcendental idealism, or even a strong phenomenalist one.[21] It may be incompatible with “identity” phenomenalism, since Kant argues that self-consciousness requires the existence of permanent objects in space, yet there is no permanent representation in the mind (B278). If objects just are representations, it follows that none of them are permanent.[22] At B274 Kant makes it clear that the “idealism” that he intends to refute is idealism as he defined it in the Prolegomena and the “Fourth A Paralogism”: the claim that objects in space do not exist (dogmatic idealism) or at least that we do not know whether they exist (problematic idealism). The sense of idealism that is at issue in the phenomenalist reading—empirical objects exist, and exist in virtue of the contents of experience—is not, apparently, addressed here. On an extreme phenomenalist reading, all there is to the existence of empirical objects in space is our having appropriately unified experiences of them. The phenomenalist can interpret Kant’s argument in the “Refutation” as an argument that consciousness of the temporal relations of my inner states requires that these inner states constitute appropriately unified experiences. Consequently, self-consciousness requires the existence of objects in space (spatially) outside me.[23] , [24]

2.4.6 General note to the principles

In the B Edition Kant added a “General Note” to the “Principles of Experience”, which some have read as ruling out the phenomenalist reading, especially the long passage from B291 to 294, from which I quote an excerpt:

This entire remark is of great importance, not only in order to confirm our preceding refutation of idealism, but, even more, when we come to talk of self-cognition form mere inner consciousness and the determination of our nature without the assistance of outer empirical intuition, to indicate to us the limits of the possibility of such a cognition. (B293–4)

Once again, this is a case of Kant emphasizing that his view is not idealist in the specific sense of idealism we have seen so far—denying either that objects exist in space or that we can know that they do. His point is that even understanding our most basic a priori concepts, the categories, requires applying them to outer objects in space. The remark about “self-cognition” at the end is a reminder that inner awareness is dependent upon outer experience; it does not address whether empirical objects exist (partly or wholly) in virtue of the contents of experience.

2.4.7 Phenomena and noumena

Kant extensively revised the section entitled “On the grounds of the distinction of all objects into phenomena and noumena” in the B Edition. However, since that section concerns the Kantian notion of “noumena” I will reserve discussion of it until section 6, which is devoted to that notion, its relation to the “thing in itself”, and the related notion of the “transcendental object”.

3. Kant as a Phenomenalist

So far, we have seen the prima facie evidence for the phenomenalist interpretation of Kant, made famous by Feder-Garve, and Kant’s own attempts to distance himself from their accusations. However, we also distinguished three different kinds of phenomenalism: identity phenomenalism, strong phenomenalism, and qualified phenomenalism. This section explores the interpretation of Kant as qualified phenomenalist, and argue that this interpretation can answer many of the standard objections to the phenomenalist reading.

3.1 Appearances = representations?

While the identity phenomenalist interpretation has found few defenders among contemporary readers (Guyer 1987: 333–336 is a notable exception; for critical discussion, see Allison 2004: 8–9), it is worth asking why exactly we should reject the prima facie meaning of the numerous passages in which Kant equates appearances with representations.

Perhaps the best reason to reject the identity phenomenalist interpretation is that it is incompatible with many of the very texts that are used to motivate it (there is also the lingering problem of whether it is compatible with the “Refutation of Idealism”; see section 2.4. and part IV of Guyer 1987). In many of the texts in which Kant identifies appearances with (a species of) representation, he also claims that representations are representations of appearances, i.e., that representations are representations of objects, appearances. For instance,

[…] external objects (bodies) are merely appearances, hence also nothing other than a species of my representations, whose objects are something only through these representations, but are nothing separated from them. (A370–1)

everything intuited in space or in time, hence all objects of an experience possible for us, are nothing but appearances, i.e., mere representations, which, as they are represented, as extended beings or series of alterations, have outside our thoughts no existence grounded in itself (A490–1/B518–9; Allison (2004: 36) attempts to explain away the apparently phenomenalist implications of this passage)

In both passages, Kant describes appearances as representations but also as objects of representation. If this is correct, then Kant thinks that the sense in which an appearance is a representation is compatible with it being the object of a representation. For instance, the sense in which this table “is” a representation is compatible with it being the object of my perception of it. Assuming that the representations that empirical objects “are” are not always self-representational (e.g., the table is not identical to a table-ish visual perception that also represents itself), it follows that the objects cannot be identical to our representations of them. For instance, my visual perception of this table cannot be this table, because my visual perception does not (presumably) represent itself. To make the identity phenomenalist view consistent with the very texts that motivate it, we need to “double” our representations: a visual perception of the table and then the representation that the table is. But what could that representation be? It must be present when and only when the table exists (because they are identical), and my perception of the table must be intentionally directed at it. While this is not conclusive, it is evidence that the identity phenomenalist interpretation should be abandoned.

Is there any way to free Kant from the apparent consequences of his tendency to identify appearances with representations of them? One standard strategy is to say that Kant is simply being sloppy: he means that appearances are the objects of our representations, not that they literally are those representations.[25] However, the passages in question occur throughout the Critique, in both editions, and they remain after Feder-Garve pointed out their apparently phenomenalist implications. On the other hand, their persistence in the B Edition suggests that they do not, and never were intended to, commit Kant to a form of identity phenomenalism. How could Kant claim Feder-Garve had misunderstood him if he had identified appearances with representations? This suggests that another reading is possible, but does not tell us what it is.

One strategy would be to claim that Kant does not mean the “is” of identity, but the “is” of grounding. Sometimes, apparent claims of identity are really claims about grounding relations. For instance, if I say “pain is C-fiber firing” I might mean the type-identity thesis that the state of being in pain is the state of C-fiber firing. But I might also mean that all there is to pain is C-fiber firing, that if one is in pain it is in virtue of C-fiber firing, or that C-fiber firing non-causally grounds the state of being in pain. On this view, in claiming that appearances are representations, Kant is claiming that the contents of representations ground the existence and empirical properties of appearances.

But this is not the plain meaning of the relevant passages. At A371 Kant claims that appearances are a species (Art) of representations; while “is” can be interpreted in a number of ways (e.g., the “is” of constitution), it is hard to interpret “As are a species of Bs” in any other way than: every A is a B, which means every A is identical to a B (namely, itself). While there may be something to the “grounding” interpretation of these passages, there are good reasons to think these texts have not been explained (or explained away).

A third alternative, proposed by Wilfred Sellars, and which may ultimately face the same problem, relies on the Cartesian distinction between the formal and objective reality of representations (in Cartesian terminology, ideas).[26] The objective reality of an idea is the representational character of the idea, its character as a representation with a certain content. Consequently, we can talk about the object of an idea without assuming that there is an object “external” to the idea; to talk of the “internal” object of the idea is just to talk about that idea’s objective reality. For instance, we can coherently talk about God without presupposing that God exists “outside” our idea of him; this God-talk is to be understood as talk about our idea of God in its objective realty, i.e., to talk about the content of our God-idea. Translating this back into Kant, we might take his claims that appearances are representations as claims to the effect that appearances are representations considered in their objective reality, or, in other words, that talking about appearances, objects of representations, is just talking about representations and their contents.

There are at least two problems with this strategy, however. For one, it is arguably no less a distortion of the plain letter of the text than the other interpretations. If Kant meant that appearances are representations considered with respect to their objective reality why didn’t he simply say that, rather than stating that they are a species of representations? Secondly, it is far from clear that, on Kant’s view, talk about appearances is equivalent to talk about the objective reality of representations. Kant may not be attempting a semantic analysis of appearances in terms of representations. To many readers, it has seemed more plausible to read Kant as claiming that appearances are grounded (non-semantically) in representations and their objective reality (content). So this proposal may collapse into the previous one.

3.2 Qualified phenomenalism

Kant repeatedly claims that our representations alone do not ground the existence of their objects. At A92/B125 he writes that “representation in itself does not produce its objects in so far as existence is concerned” and in a 1792 letter to J.S. Beck he dismissed the Feder-Garve interpretation with one line:

I speak of ideality in respect of the form of representation, while they construe it as ideality in respect of the matter, i.e., ideality of the object and its existence. (Ak. 11:395)

The first passage could be taken to mean that the existence of empirical objects is not wholly grounded in the contents of our experience; something else must be added. The second passage could be taken to mean that Feder and Garve misattributed to him the opposite view: that all there is to the existence of an object in space is our having mental states with a certain content. But all this shows is that strong phenomenalism is not Kant’s view. It leaves open the possibility that he accepts qualified phenomenalism: the existence of objects in space is grounded partially, and their core physical properties are grounded wholly, in the contents of our representations of them.

The first question to be answered is, what, in addition to the contents of our representations, grounds the existence of empirical objects? The natural answer, for the qualified phenomenalist, is that there must be things in themselves that appear as these objects. Kant repeatedly insists that it is a conceptual truth that appearances are appearances of something that is not itself an appearance, a thing in itself (e.g., A251–2, Bxxvi–xxvii, B306, B307, and Ak. 4:314–5). On the qualified phenomenalist reading, this means that the existence of an appearance requires (a) a representation of an object, and (b) a thing in itself that appears as that object. A fully developed qualified phenomenalist reading would require saying precisely what it means for a thing in itself to appear as an empirical object (an object of experience), but for reasons of space only sketch of an answer can be given here. At the minimum, the qualified phenomenalist should require that the thing in itself causally affect the experiencing subject, and that the sensory content thus produced be involved in the experience of the object. Some scholars have suggested that the properties of appearances are structurally isomorphic to the properties of things in themselves, but I will not further pursue that idea here (e.g., Findlay 1981: 92–93; see also Van Cleve 1999: 155–162).

The qualified phenomenalist also owes us an answer to the question, which are the representations whose content partly grounds the existence of empirical objects and wholly grounds their core physical properties? The natural answer is “experience”, so the qualified phenomenalist owes us an interpretation of what Kant means by “experience”, what its content is, and how it grounds (partly) the existence and (wholly) empirical properties of appearances.[27] We have already seen that, for familiar reasons, Kant cannot ground the existence of empirical objects in our mere perceptions of them: sometimes we misperceive objects, objects exist while unperceived, and there are objects we cannot ever directly perceive.

There have been few worked-out phenomenalist interpretations of Kant in the secondary literature, so in what follows I present an outline of one such reading. I do this so that the reader has some more determinate idea of what a qualified phenomenalist reading might look like and why (section 3.3) some of the classic objections to phenomenalist interpretations may be less devastating that they are sometimes presented. I do not want to give the impression that this is the only plausible phenomenalist reading of Kant.

The qualified phenomenalist grounds the existence of objects (partly) and their core physical properties (wholly) in the contexts of experience. But this requires a conception of experience on which it is not identical to any individual subject’s perceptual episodes; otherwise, objects will have contradictory properties if, for instance, I see the tower as round and you see it as square. Kant distinguishes experience from perception in the A “Deduction”, writing:

There is only one experience, in which all perceptions are represented as in thoroughgoing and lawlike connection […] If one speaks of different experiences, they are only so many perceptions insofar as they belong to one and the same universal experience. (A110).

In this sense of experience (“universal experience”) there is only one experience. It may also be that, inter-subjectively, there is only one universal experience as well: my perceptions and your perceptions are only “experiences” to the extent that they cohere with the one universal experience. Kant, in this passage, does not tell us much about what universal experience is, or what its contents are. He does tell us that it is composed from perceptions, that it has an a priori form (space, time, and categories), and that the perceptions that constitute it are in “thoroughgoing and lawlike connection”.

Elsewhere, he sheds further light on the coherence relation that defines universal experience:

In space and time, however, the empirical truth of appearances is satisfactorily secured, and sufficiently distinguished from its kinship with dreams, if both are correctly and thoroughly connected up according to empirical laws in one experience. Accordingly, the objects of experience are never given in themselves, but only in experience, and they do not exist at all outside it. (A493/B521)

Perception Pn coheres with perceptions P1 through Pn−1 to the extent that the causal laws observed in P1 through Pn−1 are observed in Pn. This gives us reason to exclude hallucinatory perceptions from universal experience: hallucinatory perceptions involve apparent violations of the causal laws that are observed to hold in our “waking” perceptions, so they do not cohere with those other perceptions.

We know a priori something very general about the form of universal experience, of course: it will be spatiotemporal and the principles of experience (applications of the categories) will hold in it. But that does not determine the determinate a posteriori content of universal experience, and the idea of a qualified phenomenalist analysis of empirical objects is to hold that their existence and empirical properties are (partly and wholly, respectively) grounded in that fully determinate a posteriori content. So we might begin with the following analysis:

(Experience) Universal experience consists in the largest internally coherent subset of perceptions that obeys the principles of experience. A subset of perceptions is internally coherent to the degree to which causal regularities hold among its contents.

On a qualified phenomenalist reading of Kant, this might be taken as the set of representations whose content grounds objects. However, there are at least two problems with this analysis of universal experience:

  • (i) Unperceived objects. Kant holds that there are spatiotemporal objects we cannot perceive. This by itself would pose a problem for the proposed definition of universal experience, since, on the qualified phenomenalist view, that definition entails that there cannot be unperceived spatiotemporal objects. But Kant further claims that we can experience unperceivable objects through perceiving their effects and inferring their existence from causal laws. So the definition of universal experience needs to be refined (A226/B273; Langton (1998: 186–190).
  • (ii) Secondary qualities. As we discussed above in the section on Kant’s empirical realism, Kant distinguishes between the properties spatiotemporal objects actually have “in themselves” and those they merely appear to have in sense perception. He has a basically Lockean distinction between primary and secondary qualities at the empirical level. Since we perceive objects as having secondary qualities, the definition of universal experience given above, combined with the qualified phenomenalist analysis, entails that empirical objects have secondary qualities. We need to further refine our definition of universal experience to eliminate secondary qualities from the empirical properties of objects.

We need to refine the conception of experience so as to include unperceived objects and exclude secondary qualities. This might push us towards a more “scientistic” conception of universal experience, on which experience is something like the ideal scientific theory of objects in space and time.[28] The form of that theory is a priori determinable from the forms of experience: it will represent persisting substances in a 3-D Euclidean space obeying universal casual laws and in simultaneous mutual interaction. However, the determinate a posteriori content of that theory will be grounded in the perceptions subjects actually have.

Here is a sketch of a conception of universal experience that the qualified phenomenalist might accept:

(Experience) Universal experience is the maximally unified and lawful representation of objects in space and time that is compatible with the a priori forms of experience and justified by the totality of subjects’ perceptual states, or the conjunction of such representations if there is no unique such representation.[29]

To fully develop such a view, a lot more would have to be said about exactly how the content of experience is grounded in, and justified by, the contents of subjects’ perceptual states, but this gloss is enough to give us a sense of what a developed phenomenalist reading of Kant might look like.

3.3 Criticisms of Phenomenalist Readings

Since the Feder-Garve objection to Kant has been around almost as long as the Critique itself, many objections to broadly phenomenalist readings of Kant’s idealism have accumulated. Perhaps the most comprehensive list of such objections is given by Allais (2004). They include:

  • Kant’s claim that his notion of appearance implies that there is something that appears”. I have already explained how the qualified phenomenalist can accommodate this point.
  • Empirically real objects and the space they inhabit are public”. Allais seems to assume that, on a phenomenalist analysis of objects in space, objects are “private”, meaning the objects each subject perceives are constituted by sense data of that subject, which, by definition, cannot be perceived by other subjects. But the qualified phenomenalist conception of universal experience sketched above is explicitly “non-private” in this sense; it is based on the perceptions of all subjects.
  • “Kant’s distinction between primary and secondary qualities”. However, the qualified phenomenalist can claim that while our perceptions represent objects as having secondary qualities, the best scientific theory justified by the totality of those perceptions (universal experience) does not represent them as having those properties, because there is a better theory available: objects do not possess such properties but do possess powers to cause us to perceive them as having such properties. There is, in principle, barrier to a qualified phenomenalist allowing the distinction between primary and secondary qualities.
  • “Kant’s realism about the unobservable entities of theoretical science”. Kant is a scientific realist, in that he accepts the existence of unobservable entities posited by our best physical theories (magnetic matter, Newtonian “lamellae”). Allais thinks this is incompatible with a phenomenalist reading, but it is compatible with the conception of universal experience developed in the previous section. If universal experience has the content of the scientific theory best justified by our perceptions, then universal experience can represent unobservable (=unperceivable) objects (cf. Allison (2004: 46) who also objects that phenomenalism is incompatible with Kant’s empirical realism).
  • “Empirically real objects exist through time and unperceived, and are in causal relations”. The fact that empirically real objects exist through time while unperceived might be thought to pose a problem for phenomenalism, although it should be remembered that Berkeley (at least on some readings) is a phenomenalist and yet accepts that objects exist while unperceived (although he denies that they stand in causal relations). So it isn’t clear why Allais think this is incompatible with phenomenalism. And it clearly is compatible with the conception of universal experience developed in the previous section: experience represents objects as existing through time and unperceived, because a theory that represents them as existing only when perceived would be far less unified and lawful.
  • “We do not know what ideas are in themselves”. Allais’s idea seems to be that the phenomenalist is committed to grounding empirical objects not in “empirical ideas” (temporally ordered mental states available in conscious introspection) but in “noumenal ideas” (the non-temporal states of the subject in itself). But it is unclear why; the phenomenalist conception of experience developed in the previous section explicitly grounds the a posteriori content of universal experience in “empirical” ideas, the totality of subjects’ perceptions.[30]

Allais appears to have conflated phenomenalist readings of Kant in general with the “strong” phenomenalism (or even identity phenomenalism) discussed in section 2, and one, moreover, that identifies experience with mere perception.

3.4 The Problem of Things in Themselves

No discussion of Kant’s transcendental idealism would be complete without a discussion of F.H. Jacobi’s famous objection to the critique:

without the presupposition of the [thing in itself] I cannot enter the [critical] system, and with that presupposition I cannot remain in it. (Jacobi, Werke, vol. II, p. 304)

Jacobi is referring to a number of quite serious problems for Kant’s transcendental idealist theory. They do not disappear on other interpretations, but they are especially serious for the traditional phenomenalist reading. Unlike the problems we discussed earlier, however, which were specifically problems for the phenomenalist analysis of appearances, these problems, as Jacobi indicates, concern the thing in itself, and the relation between things in themselves and appearances.

3.4.1 The Unknowability of Things in Themselves

Kant is committed to both of the following theses:

(Existence) There are things in themselves.

(Humility) We know nothing about things in themselves.

While these are not, strictly speaking, incompatible, they are in tension, for Humility appears to remove any warrant Kant might have for asserting Existence.

But it gets worse for the traditional view. Kant does not merely claim that things in themselves exist, he also asserts that,

(Non-spatiality) Things in themselves are not in space and time.

(Affection) Things in themselves causally affect us.[31]

Many of Kant’s early readers concluded that Kant’s philosophy is inconsistent: he claims that we cannot know the very assertions he makes about things in themselves. Kant’s own theory renders itself unknowable.[32]

It would be over-hasty to suggest that each of these three problems—how to square Humility, with Non-Spatiality, Affection, and Existence—are on a par. Since Non-spatiality makes only a negative claim, it may be easier to make it consistent with Humility. For instance, at B149 Kant writes:

it is not yet a genuine cognition if I merely indicate what the intuition of the object is not, without being able to say what is then contained in it.

This suggests that, while Kant’s usually unqualified statements of our ignorance of things in themselves (they are “not cognized at all” A30/B45), his considered view might be more qualified: we know nothing of the positive properties of things in themselves.[33] But Affection looks especially difficult to square with Humility (see Hogan 2009 and Stang 2013).

3.4.2 Things in themselves as causes

The issue of things in themselves affecting us raises another problem for Kant’s theory, for Kant also argues that categories like cause-effect cannot be meaningfully applied to things in themselves. Without an intuition “[the category] has no sense, and is entirely empty of content” (A239/B298). Since things in themselves cannot be intuited, categories (including cause-effect) have no sense or content when applied to things in themselves. Jacobi and others thought this was yet another inconsistency in Kant’s philosophy: he denies that categories can be applied to things in themselves, but then he applies the category cause-effect to them!

However, one has to be careful in interpreting Kant’s denial of “sense” or “meaning” to categories as applied to thing in themselves. It is tempting to read this as meaning that the thought of things in themselves falling under categories is literally nonsense, but there is textual evidence that Kant is making a weaker point: thinking of things in themselves under the categories has no cognitive sense, i.e., in making such judgments we do not cognize anything. For instance,

[…] the categories are not restricted in thinking by the conditions of our sensible intuition, but have an unbounded field, and only the cognition of objects that we think, the determination of the object, requires intuition; in the absence of the latter, the thought of the object can still have its true and useful consequences for the use of reason […] (B166n)[34]

We can think of any objects whatsoever using the categories. In fact, this is unavoidable; the categories are the most basic concepts of objects in general, so we cannot think about anything whatsoever without using some categories to do so. But in thinking about the things in themselves using categories we do not thereby (a) know that there are things in themselves falling under the categories or (b) even that it is possible for there to be things in themselves falling under the categories. The strongest form of Jacobi’s objection—that Kant’s view entails that the categories cannot be applied, even in thought, to things in themselves—may rest on a misunderstanding (cf. Van Cleve 1999: 137; Adams 1997: 820–1). This still leaves, though, the pressing problem of how, given Kant’s Humility doctrine, he could have any epistemic warrant for making the various substantive claims he does about things in themselves (Existence, Non-spatiality, Affection).

3.4.3 The Problem of Affection

Jacobi raises yet another problem about Kant’s theory of experience. He notes Kant’s definition of sensibility as the capacity “to receive representations through the manner in which we are affected by objects” (A19/B33) and poses a dilemma: are the objects that affect our sensibility appearances or things in themselves? They cannot be appearances, Jacobi argues, because that would involve applying the categories to things in themselves. And they cannot be appearances, because appearances exist in virtue of the very experiences they are (allegedly) causing. He concludes that Kant’s system is inconsistent (Jacobi, Werke, vol. II, 291–310; Fichte raises the same objection in the Second Introduction to the Wissenschaftslehre; cf. Fichte, Werke I, 488).

We have already discussed the argument of the second horn of Jacobi’s dilemma: we can think but not know that things in themselves causally affect us. But what about the first horn? Hans Vaihinger concisely explains Jacobi’s argument:

Or one understands by affecting objects the objects in space; but since these are only appearances according to Kant, and thus our representations, one falls into the contradiction that the same appearances, which we first have on the basis of affection, should be the source of that very affection. (Vaihinger 1881: vol. 2, p. 53)

“First” here does not refer to temporal priority, but to metaphysical priority: if p is true in virtue of q, then q is “prior” to p. Jacobi and Vaihinger assume that appearances exist in virtue of the contents of our experience of them:

(Trans. Idealism) If x is an appearance, then x exists in virtue of the fact that subjects experience x.

If we are empirically affected, though, it follows that:

(Empirical affection) For some x, x is one of the causes of subjects’ experience of x.

For instance, this computer is one of the causes of my current experience of it. But these assumptions are inconsistent if we assume the following plausible principle:

(Exclusion) If x exists in virtue of the fact that p, then x cannot be even a partial cause of the fact that p.

Intuitively, this principle says that no object can be even a partial cause of the very fact in virtue of which it exists; if it were, it would be a partial cause of its own existence. In the context of Kant’s theory of experience, it means that appearances cannot “reach back” and cause the very experiences in virtue of which they exist. From the 1780s until today, many have taken this problem to be fatal to Kant’s theory of experience.[35]

4. The “Dual Aspect” View

Because the phenomenalist interpretation of transcendental idealism held such sway, not only among Kant’s contemporaries, but for generations of German philosophers as well, these problems for the phenomenalist construal of transcendental idealism were taken to be evidence that Kant’s view itself is inconsistent.[36] In the twentieth century, the phenomenalist (or “Berkeleyan”) interpretation of transcendental idealism is associated with P.F. Strawson, whose massively influential (1966) argued that, for many of the reasons we have seen, transcendental idealism was a blunder on Kant’s part (Strawson 1966: 16, 38–42, 253–73). However, Strawson claimed, the core arguments of the Critique do not in fact rely on it and can be reconstructed independently of it.

In the 1960s and 1970s a group of scholars, in some cases in direct opposition to Strawson, developed a non-phenomenalist, anti-metaphysical reading of transcendental idealism, the “dual aspect” view.[37] These scholars took the textbook problems for phenomenalism (especially, the problem of affection) as evidence that this was the wrong interpretation of Kant’s position to begin with. They sought to rescue transcendental idealism from what they took to be the phenomenalist misconstrual, defend its philosophical cogency from its detractors, and show, contra Strawson, that the central arguments of the Critique do rely on transcendental idealism. This was as much a philosophical defense of Kantian transcendental idealism as it was an interpretive-exegetical project.

They developed what has become known as the “dual aspect” view. They argue that many of the classic problems for the phenomenalist reading (e.g., affection) arise because it was mistakenly assumed that appearances and things in themselves are distinct kinds of objects. They argued instead that the appearance/thing in itself distinction is not an ontological distinction between two kinds of objects, but an adverbial distinction between two different perspectives or stances we can take on one and the same set of objects: we can consider them as they appear, or as they are “in themselves”.

4.1 One Object, Not Two

In numerous passages, Kant describes the appearance/thing in itself distinction, not as a distinction between two different objects, but as a distinction between two ways of considering one and the same object. For instance,

[…] the same objects can be considered from two different sides, on the one side as objects of the senses and the understanding for experience, and on the other side as objects that are merely thought at most for isolated reason striving beyond the bounds of experience. (Bxviii–Bxix, note)

[…] the reservation must well be noted that even if we cannot cognize these same objects as things in themselves, we are lat least able to think of them as things in themselves. (Bxxvi)[38]

The general characteristic of such passages is that they use the same chain of pronouns to refer both to appearances and things in themselves. This strongly suggests that one and the same object can be an appearance and a thing in itself, or, to put it another way, the distinction between appearance and thing in itself is not a distinction between two or more objects, but a distinction between two different aspects of, or ways of considering, one and the same object. One and the same object can be considered as it appear to us in experience, or as it is in itself. Considered in the former way, the object must conform to our a priori intuitional forms, so it is in space and time. Considered in the other way, the object may not be in space and time. Some “dual aspect” readers cite the increased frequency of such passages in the Prolegomena and the B Edition as evidence that Kant, realizing that his distinction between two aspects of objects was being conflated with a distinction between two kinds of objects, sought to remedy this interpretation by emphasizing precisely this point. Prauss (1974) notes that, in most cases, Kant uses the expression “Dinge [Sachen, Objecte, Gegenstände] an sich selbst” rather than the shorter form “Dinge an sich”. He argues that “an sich selbst” functions as an adverb to modify an implicit attitude verb like “to consider” [betrachten]. He concludes that the dominant use of these expressions is as a short-hand for “things considered as they are in themselves” (Prauss 1974: 14–15).

Different scholars understand this distinction in different ways. The main difference is between epistemological and metaphysical “dual aspect” interpretations (Allison 2004: 52). On the epistemological reading, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is simply a distinction in the standpoint from which we consider them. We can consider objects as objects of knowledge for discursive spatiotemporal cognizers like us, in which case we are considering objects as appearances. Or we can abstract from our particular cognitive conditions and consider objects merely as objects for a mind in general, in which case we are considering them as things in themselves. It is crucial to the epistemological reading that there is no sense in which the “transcendental” perspective on objects as things in themselves gets at how objects “are in themselves”. The point of Kant’s transcendental idealism, epistemological interpreters stress, is to get away from the incoherent idea of a “view from nowhere” in which we could know objects as they “really are in themselves”.[39]

By contrast, metaphysical “dual aspect” interpreters take the distinction to carry more metaphysical weight. They interpret the appearance/thing in itself distinction as a metaphysical distinction between two different classes of properties had by objects, for instance, their relational properties and their intrinsic properties. Appearances are objects qua bearers of “empirical properties” (e.g., relational properties) while things in themselves are the very same objects qua bearers of “noumenal” or “non-empirical” properties (e.g., intrinsic properties). The next two sub-sections explore the epistemological interpretation of Henry Allison. The remainder of the sections concerns metaphysical “dual aspect” readings, focusing on the widely discussed interpretation of Langton (1998).

4.2 Allison’s “Epistemic” reading

In modern Kant scholarship, the epistemic reading was first put forward by Gerold Prauss, Henry Allison, and Graham Bird. Since Allison’s work was the most influential among English language scholarship, and most likely to be known to readers, this discussion will focus on the interpretation of transcendental idealism in Allison (1983) and the revised and enlarged second edition (2004). Allison’s writings contain several distinct (and not obviously equivalent) formulations of transcendental idealism. This section concentrates on reconstructing what I take to be the “core” of Allison’s reading: his interpretation of appearances and things in themselves, and his reconstruction of the argument for the non-spatiality of things in themselves.

The core insight of Kant’s epistemology in general, and his transcendental idealism in particular, according to Allison, is the principle that we possess a discursive intellect. A discursive intellect is one that passively receives representations of particular objects (intuitions) and then spontaneously subsumes those intuited objects under general concepts; consequently, a discursive intellect must possess a sensory faculty (through which it receives sensory data and intuits individual objects) and a conceptual faculty (through which it form s general concepts and applies them to objects) (A50–1/B74–5). By contrast, an intuitive intellect brings into existence its objects merely by representing them, and thus has no need to receive representations of objects from outside.[40] But that is not all there is to the discursive nature of our intellect, Allison argues.[41] Kant’s key insight is that our sensible faculty has its own epistemic conditions.

An “epistemic condition” is Allison’s term for a representation we must apply to objects in order to cognize them (Allison 2004: 11, 14). Space and time are epistemic conditions, as are the categories. If E is an epistemic condition then necessarily if we know an object O, in knowing it we represent it using E.[42] Some of our epistemic conditions follow from the general fact that we are discursive cognizers (the categories) and some follow from the more specific fact that we cognize objects given to us in space and time. Representing objects using the categories is an epistemic condition for any discursive intellect, i.e., for any intellect that must conceptualize objects given passively in sensory intuition.[43] So space and time are epistemic conditions of spatiotemporal discursive cognition of objects, while the categories are epistemic conditions of discursive cognition of objects in general. Any discursive intellect must conceptualize sensibly intuited objects using the categories, whether or not those objects are intuited in space and time, or some other intuitional forms (Allison 2004: 17).

This grounds a distinction between two ways of considering the objects of our cognition. When we consider objects qua objects of our cognition, we consider them as falling under the relevant epistemic conditions. If E is an epistemic condition of cognition of objects, then objects must fall under E (i.e., be accurately represented by E); otherwise, in representing them with E, I would not be cognizing objects but misrepresenting them. My representation of objects with E would be an illusion, the very conclusion Kant wants to avoid with respect to space and objects represented in space. This means that if E is an epistemic condition of the specific kind of discursive cognition of objects that we have, then E correctly represents those objects. So, if space and time are the forms of our intuition, it follows that empirical objects qua objects of the kind of discursive intellect we have, are in space and time. But if we do not consider objects qua objects of our specific kind of discursive intellect, but qua objects of discursive intellect in general, we can no longer assume that our specific intuitional epistemic condition still applies to them. The more general epistemic conditions of all discursive cognition (in Kant’s view, the categories) still apply to objects under this more abstract perspective, however. So we can say that objects qua appearing (objects of spatiotemporal discursive cognition) are in space, but qua things in themselves (objects of discursive cognition in general) they are not in space. This, in a nutshell, is Allison’s reconstruction of the argument for the non-spatiality of things in themselves.[44] While it is legitimate to consider objects as things in themselves using the categories, we do not thereby cognize them. This follows trivially from the fact that space and time are epistemic conditions for us: without representing objects in space and time, we can think of objects using the categories, but those thoughts are not cognitions (Allison 2004: 18).

4.3. Problems with the Epistemic reading

Allison’s interpretation has been challenged on a number of points by other scholars. This section discusses a number of such objections.

4.3.1 The Triviality Objection

Some scholars object that Allison’s reading of the non-spatiality thesis, and the thesis that things in themselves are uncognizable by us, renders it a tautology, a trivial logical consequence of definitions.[45] I will represent the definition of “thing in itself” talk (on Allison’s interpretation) as follows:

  • (1)Things in themselves are F if and only if objects of discursive cognition as such are F.

And the non-spatiality thesis as:

  • (C) ∴ ~(Things in themselves are spatial)

But now the reader can see that to derive (C) from (1) we would need a further premise:

  • (2) ~(Objects, considered, as objects of discursive cognition in general, are spatial)

But this claim is not a definition, for it is equivalent to the claim that the concept of a discursive cognition is more general than the concept of a spatiotemporal discursive cognition, i.e., that a non-spatial discursive intellect is conceivable. So although the non-spatiality of things in themselves follows almost immediately from very general truths, on Allison’s reconstruction, it is not correct to say that it is a tautology, or that it is true by definition.

Nor is it true that the uncognizability of things in themselves is trivial, on Allison’s reading. For that principle only follows from the claim that there are sensible epistemic conditions, space and time. And that, on Allison’s reconstruction, is the key insight that sets Kant apart from both his rationalist and empiricist predecessors. Thus, while Allison’s interpretation makes the argument for the non-spatiality of things in themselves relatively easy, it does not render the conclusion trivial.

4.3.2 Epistemic conditions entail realism

Robinson (1994) raises a quite general objection to Allison’s notion of an epistemic condition, namely, an object must satisfy (fall under) a representation if that representation is to constitute an epistemic condition for that object (Robinson 1994 is a response, mainly, to Allison 1983 and 1987). So in the claim that “objects qua appearances” or “objects considered with our epistemic conditions” the qualification “qua appearances” or “considered with our epistemic conditions” is otiose. If space is an epistemic condition of outer objects for us then this entails that objects we cognize are in space simpliciter. The claim that objects are spatial because of or in virtue of space being an epistemic condition for entails either that these objects exist in virtue of our representations of them (which results in phenomenalism) or it entails that they are spatial in virtue of our representing them but would not be spatial otherwise. In the latter case, we are not cognizing them in representing them as spatial; we are misrepresenting them (Robinson 1994: 420–22).

Allison might reply to this objection by pointing out that it implicitly assumes that the claim empirical objects are in space is coherent independently of specifying a perspective on those objects. In the terminology of Allison (2004) it is committed to “transcendental realism” (see the supplementary entry: Allison on Transcendental Realism and Transcendental Idealism). If this were Allison’s reply to the objection, then it would show that the coherence of transcendental idealism, on Allison’s reconstruction, rests on the premise that there is no coherent sense to questions about how objects are independent of any perspective on them. This is important, because it is not always clear that Allison’s reconstruction does depend on this premise, and it is not clear where Kant argues for such a conclusion.

4.3.3 Abstraction

One influential objection focuses on the role that “abstracting” from our spatiotemporal intuition plays in Allison’s reconstruction. Van Cleve puts it somewhat facetiously:

How is it possible for the properties of a thing to be vary according to how it is considered? As I sit typing these words, I have shoes on my feet. But consider me apart from my shoes: so considered, am I barefoot? I am inclined to say no; consider me how you will, I am not now barefoot. (Van Cleve 1999: 8)[46]

To put the point less facetiously: if the object o, considered as an object of spatiotemporal cognition, is spatial, then when we ascend to a more general perspective, in which we consider o as the object of discursive cognition in general, then we should not say that o is non-spatial; we should merely not judge that it is spatial. To take an example of Guyer’s, when we consider a job applicant we might want to ignore or abstract from their race or sex; in doing so we would not judge that they are race-less or sex-less, but merely refrain from representing them as having a determinate race or sex.

Allison can interpret Kant’s claim that things in themselves in either of two ways:

  • (1)Things in themselves are non-spatial.
  • (2)It is not the case that things in themselves are spatial.

While ordinarily we might take these claims to be equivalent, when talking about “things in themselves” we can distinguish them, because “things in themselves” talk is talk about objects from a certain perspective (i.e., considered as objects of discursive intellect in general). In particular, (1) and (2) are equivalent to:

  • (1*)Objects, considered as objects of discursive cognition in general, are non-spatial.
  • (2*)~(Objects, considered as objects of discursive cognition in general, are spatial)

Allison’s critics assume that he opts for (1) (and its analysis, (1*)) and object, rightly, that this is the wrong conclusion to draw from the fact that discursive cognition is a more general notion than spatiotemporal discursive cognition. (Just as it would be wrong to conclude that the job candidate, considered in abstraction from his sex and race, is sex-less and race-less.) While it is sometimes unclear from Allison’s texts which analysis he opts for, the charitable reading is that he accepts (2*).

If this is correct, Allison’s reasoning can be reconstructed as follows:

  • (3)Things in themselves are F = objects, considered as objects of discursive intellect in general, are F.
  • (4)It is conceivable that there is an object of discursive intellect that is not an object of spatiotemporal discursive intellect, i.e., spatiotemporal discursive intellect is a special case of discursive intellect.
  • (5) ∴ ~(objects, considered as objects of discursive intellect in general, are spatial)
  • (6) ∴ ~(Things in themselves are spatial)

But (6) must be distinguished from:

  • (7) Things in themselves are non-spatial.

On this reconstruction of Allison, Kant is committed to (6) but not to (7).

We saw earlier that Allison’s critics assume that he must intend (7) rather than (6). They do so because they think that it is clear from the texts that Kant claims (7) and not the weaker (6). But that is not so clear from the texts, for instance:

Space represents no property at all of any things in themselves nor any relation of them each other, i.e., no determination of them that attaches to objects themselves and that would remain even if one were to abstract from all subjective conditions of intuition. (A26/B42)

Prima facie it is compatible with the letter of these texts that Kant is claiming (6) rather than (7). Note that (6) is not the claim that we cannot know, or justifiably assert that things in themselves are spatial. It is the claim that it is false to say that they are spatial.

The stronger objection to Allison’s view, as reconstructed here, is that (6) is too weak to be a plausible reconstruction of Kant’s non-spatiality thesis. Given Allison’s understanding of “thing in itself” talk (premise (3)) all that (6) requires is that there is some conceivable perspective on objects that is more general than the specifically spatiotemporal form of cognition that we have (premise (4)). It does not even require that it is possible that there be discursive intellects with a non-spatiotemporal form of cognition. All it requires is that the concept of discursive cognition as such is more general than the concept of spatiotemporal discursive cognition, which, trivially, it is. (6) is compatible with it being impossible for there to be non-spatiotemporal discursive cognition because all objects are necessarily spatiotemporal and hence can only be cognized spatiotemporally. In other words (6) is compatible with transcendental realism about space and time (as Kant defines that term)!

One potential Allisonian response to this objection would be that it implicitly presupposes that there is a way objects are independently of any perspective on them. In particular, the claim that (6) is compatible with all possible objects being spatial, and thus cannot be a reconstruction of the non-spatiality thesis, begs the question by assuming that that state-of-affairs does not need to relativized to a perspective, e.g., all possible objects as objects for a certain kind of mind are spatial. Thus, the coherence of Allison’s reconstruction again depends upon the claim that there is no “standpoint-independent” perspective on reality.

4.3.4 Things in themselves as more fundamental than appearances

One major textual hurdle for Allison’s “epistemic” reading of transcendental idealism are the various passages in which Kant describes things in themselves as more fundamental, more ontologically basic, than appearances, or describes things in themselves as the grounds of appearances. Allison appears to reverse this relation of dependence because things in themselves (objects from the relatively abstract transcendental perspective) are an abstraction from appearances (objects from the more determinate empirical perspective). Ameriks (1992: 334) raises this objection, and Allison (2004: 45) replies to it. Allison does not offer an alternate reading of the relevant texts, but instead points out that, in the case where the relative fundamentality of the phenomenal and noumenal is most important to Kant, namely the freedom of the will,[47] Ameriks’ objection assumes, once again, that there is some fact of the matter as to whether we are free or not, and this is to be settled by determining whether we are free at the most fundamental level (the noumenal level, on Ameriks’ reading). Once again, the coherence of Allison’s reading rests on the premise that there is no standpoint-independent perspective on reality (see the supplementary entry: Allison on Transcendental Realism and Transcendental Idealism).

4.4 Metaphysical “Dual Aspect” Readings

One prominent strand in recent scholarship on Kant’s transcendental idealism has been the development of quite sophisticated interpretations that try to retain the original insight that the appearance/thing in itself distinction is not a distinction between two different kinds of objects, while abandoning Allison-style “epistemic” readings. These interpretations take the distinction to be a metaphysical one between two different sets of properties had by one and the same set of objects. These metaphysical “dual aspect” interpretations differ in exactly how they understand the distinction between these different sets of properties (see also Allais (2004, 2006, 2007, 2015); Rosefeldt (2007, 2013); McDaniel (ms); and Marshall (2013)).

Perhaps the most influential metaphysical but non-phenomenalist interpretation of Kant’s idealism has been Langton (1998). Langton begins by pointing out that Kant thinks we are genuinely missing out on something in not knowing things in themselves, and this sense of “epistemic loss” is incompatible with Allison’s reading. As we saw in the previous section, “Allisonian humility” is apparently compatible with it being impossible that there are non-spatiotemporal objects and our forms of intuition being the only possible such forms. This loses Kant’s sense that we are genuinely cognitively deprived, that there is something about the world of which we are irremediably ignorant (Allison responds to Langton’s criticism in 2004: 9–11).

Having rejected Allison’s epistemic reading, Langton goes on to discuss a familiar tension between two of the central doctrines of Kant’s transcendental idealism:

(Existence) Things in themselves exist.

(Humility) We cannot know anything about things in themselves.

Langton’s solution to this, one of the oldest problems of Kant scholarship, is to interpret things in themselves as substances with intrinsic properties, and talk of “phenomena” as talk of the extrinsic properties of those substances (things in themselves). So in general,

  • (1) Things in themselves are F = F is among the intrinsic properties of substances
  • (2) Appearances are F = F is among the extrinsic properties of substances

In particular, this allows Langton to interpret (Existence) and (Humility) as:

(Existence*) Substances with intrinsic properties exist.

(Humility*) We cannot cognize the intrinsic properties of substances.

The apparent tension between these doctrines has vanished. Langton’s interpretation also allows her to explain why the apparent tension between Humility and

(Non-spatiality) Things in themselves are not spatial.

is merely apparent because, on he reading (Non-spatiality) is equivalent to:

(Non-spatiality*) Being spatial is not an intrinsic property of substances.

This is compatible with (Humility*) because we can know it merely by knowing that being spatial is an extrinsic property in general (thus is not an intrinsic property had by substances), and to know this we do not need to know anything about the intrinsic properties of substances. Langton thus offers a consistent, elegant interpretation of transcendental idealism that solves several of the oldest and hardest problems in the interpretation of Kant’s philosophy.[48]

4.5 Problems for Langton’s reading

Much of the critical reaction to Langton (1998) has focused on her reconstruction of Kant’s argument for Humility, but I am not going to discuss that argument; even if Langton is wrong about how Kant proves Humility, she may still be right about what Humility means and thus what the appearance/thing in itself distinction means (e.g., Allais 2006).

4.5.1 Textual evidence

There is substantial textual evidence that Kantian appearances have only extrinsic properties. For instance, this passage from the “Aesthetic”:

everything in our cognition that belongs to intuition (with the exception, therefore, of the feeling of plea sure and displeasure and the will, which are not cognitions at all) contains nothing but mere relations, of places in one intuition (extension), alteration of places (motion), and laws in accordance with which this alteration is determined (moving forces). (B67)

This, and other passages Langton cites, support attributing to Kant these theses:

  • (1)Appearances (phenomena) have only relational properties. (B67, A265/B321, A285/B341)
  • (2) When we conceive of an object purely intellectually we conceive of it as having intrinsic properties. (A274/B330, A277/B333)
  • (3) In knowing relational properties we do not know things as they are in themselves. (B67)

However, in none of these passages does Kant directly state the stronger claim that:

  • (4) Phenomena are extrinsic properties of substances with intrinsic properties.

It is clear that Kant holds (1)–(3) and less clear that he holds (4). The textual case for (4) is weaker, though not absent. It is presented below, in sub-section 4.5.2.

There is a further textual problem for Langton’s interpretation, though. In at least two passages Kant denies that we can know relations between things in themselves:

Space represents no property at all of any things in themselves nor any relation of them each other […] (A26/B42)

[…] the things that we intuit are not in themselves what we intuit them to be, nor are their relations so constituted in themselves as they appear to us. (A42/B59)

In these passages Kant claims that space is not a relation among things in themselves, nor are relations among objects “in themselves” as they appear to us. This is hard to square with Langton’s reading. However, in her (2011) Langton responds to these textual objections by suggesting that the relations among things in themselves of which Kant speaks are internal relations, relations that supervene on the intrinsic properties of substances.[49]

4.5.2 Phenomena substantiata

One source of resistance to Langton’s interpretation is that Kant argues at length in the “First Analogy of Experience” that the category substance can be applied to phenomena:

all appearances contain that which persists (substance) as the object itself, and that which can change as its mere determination, i.e., a way in which the object exists. (A182)

This would appear to contradict Langton’s assertion that things in themselves are substances, while appearances (phenomena) are merely properties of substances.

Langton is well aware that Kant accepts “phenomenal substances” and endeavors to explain this within her picture. In doing so, she compiles a compelling set of textual evidence for her alternative reading of the “First Analogy” and the meaning of substance for phenomena. She begins by pointing to Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten’s notion of a phaenomena substantiata, a “substantiated phenomenon”, by which Baumgarten means a property that we treat as a substance by predicating other properties of it (Baumgarten, Metaphysica §193 (Ak. 18:150); quoted at Langton 1998: 53). She argues convincingly that Kant’s fundamental notion of a substance is of being with properties but which is not a property of anything else.[50] Only such beings, of which other things are predicated (inhere in) but which are not predicated of (inhere in) anything else, are truly substances. However, the properties that are predicated of substances can also be spoken of as substances, because they themselves have properties (which might also have properties, and so on).[51] These are substantiated phenomena.

The question is, are Kantian empirical substances genuine substances or mere substantiated phenomena? Do the objects subsumed under the empirical schema of substance (absolute persistence in time) also fall under the pure category of substance (subjects of inherence which inhere in nothing further)? If no, then they must be predicated of some more fundamental substance, which drives Langton to conclude that appearances (phenomena) are properties of substances (she does point out the hesitant terms in which Kant describes phenomena as substances (1998, 57). Langton assembles an impressive array of evidence that Kant does regard empirical “substances” as phaenomena substantiata (e.g., A265/B321, A277/B333, Refl. 4421, 4422, 5294, Ak. 28:209). However, in context it is not clear whether Kant has the Baumgarten notion in mind, or whether this Latin expression means simply: phenomenal substance. So it is unclear, textually, whether phenomena are predicated of noumena in the Critique.[52]

In his metaphysics lectures, and other texts, Kant consistently distinguishes the inherence relation (which holds between a property and an entity of which it is predicated) from the relation of ground to consequence:

The world “substance” is clearly ambiguous. One translates it through the notion of self-sufficiency, i.e., the possibility of existing without a ground, but also as the possibility of existing without inhering [in something else]. (Ak. 28:1308; Ak. 8:225n, 28:562, 28:779, 28:638–9, 28:1041, 28:1104f)

Kant, following Baumgarten, criticizes Spinoza’s definition of substance as “what is in itself and conceived through itself” (Ethics Id3) because it conflates two notions: (i) a being that is not grounded in, or caused by, anything more fundamental, and (ii) a being that does not inhere in anything more fundamental. The second is the correct definition of substance, according to Kant; by conflating these two notions, Spinoza forecloses the following possibility: there are substances distinct from God (they are not modes of God), all of which are grounded in God.

To bring this back to Langton, we need to distinguish two different claims:

  • (i) Phenomena are extrinsic properties of substances (things in themselves). They inhere in things in themselves.
  • (ii) Phenomena exist (at least partly) in virtue of the extrinsic properties of substances (things in themselves). They are grounded in things in themselves.

Langton attributes (i) to Kant, but her textual case appears to support (ii), at best.[53] This is significant, because (ii) is far less controversial. For instance, it is in principle acceptable to the qualified phenomenalist, because the extrinsic properties of things in themselves include (presumably) properties like causing us to have such and such experience.

5. One Object or Two?

Since Karl Ameriks’ classic survey of the literature, Ameriks (1982), it has been customary to divide interpretations of transcendental idealism into “two object” readings and “one object” readings. By contrast, this article has been organized around the distinction between phenomenalist readings, and non-phenomenalist dual-aspect readings. This section explores the relation between the “one object”/“two object” distinction and the phenomenalist/non-phenomenalist distinction among different interpretations of Kant’s idealism.

The distinction between “one object” and “two object” readings comes down to the question of whether appearances, in general, are numerically identical to things in themselves: one object readers claim they are (Adickes 1924: 20, 27; Allais 2004: 657; Langton 1998: 13; Westphal 1968: 120), and two object readers deny this.[54] Whether all things in themselves are numerically identical to appearances is not at issue, for most one object readers will admit there could be things that never appear to us (cf. B306, where Kant seems to admit as much) (although it might be misleading to call them things “in themselves” since they never appear to us, so we never consider them as they are “in themselves”). The qualification “in general” is necessary because some “two object” readers will admit that some appearances are also things in themselves; e.g., many “two object” readers will admit that, in the case of the self, there is a single object, a thing in itself, that appears to itself as a spatiotemporal object (on this issue, see Adams (1997), Aquila (1979), and Ameriks’ discussion of Aquila in his 1982).

However, the characterization of these views as “one object” and “two object” is unfortunate, because it is not a commitment of “two object” readings that, for each appearance, there is one and only one thing in itself that appears as that object. The “two object” interpreter can hold that each appearance is the appearance of an indefinite plurality of things in themselves. Nor is the other standard moniker, “one world” versus “two world”, helpful, either, for “world” is a technical term in Kant’s metaphysics and has a very specific meaning.[55] One can coherently hold a “non-identity” interpretation while denying that appearances in space and time constitute a “world” at all.[56]

This section explores how the identity/non-identity debate relates to the non-phenomenalist/phenomenalist debate. They have often been conflated by equating the “two world” interpretation (non-identity) with the phenomenalist one, and conversely, by equating the “one world” interpretation (identity) with the anti-phenomenalist one. There are grounds to think, however, that these are distinct debates. Section 5.1 I examines whether claims about the numerical identity or non-identity of appearances and things in themselves are meaningful at all, and, if they are, what warrant we could have for making them within Kant’s theoretical philosophy. Section 5 investigates whether, assuming that claims of identity or non-identity are meaningful, the identity/non-identity debate is orthogonal the phenomenalist/non-phenomenalist debate. Section 5.2 that paradigmatically anti-phenomenalist interpretations (e.g., Langton 1998) can be understood as non-identity views. Section 5.3 examines some reasons for thinking that the phenomenalist interpretation is compatible with the “identity” of appearances and things in themselves. Section 5.4 considers the interpretive landscape in light of these results.[57]

5.1 Identity between appearances and things in themselves

As Henry Allison and others have pointed out, it is not clear that there is any content to the question of whether an appearance is numerically identical to a thing in itself, outside of moral contexts.[58] It is relatively clear that in the context of his moral philosophy, Kant wants to assert that one and the same object, a rational agent, can be considered as an appearance and as a thing in itself. Considered as an appearance, a rational agent is subject to conditions of experience (space, time, and the categories). Considered as a thing in itself, a rational agent can at least consistently be thought of as free (because independent of the deterministic causal order of space and time), while practical reason gives us warrant for positively asserting that the agent is free. Kant typically expresses this solution to the problem of freedom and determinism in terms of the numerical identity of the appearance of the agent and the agent as thing in itself (e.g., Ak. 5: 105, 114). Practical reason gives both content and warrant to the assertion of numerical identity: content, because the assertion of numerical identity means that one and the same noumenal agent is the cause of and therefore responsible for the actions of an empirical rational agent over time, and warrant, because this assumption of the unity of a noumenal agent over time is a presupposition of our ordinary moral cognition of blame and praise. But neither of these seem to hold in the theoretical use of reason. It is not clear that within the theoretical use of reason we can give any content to the claim of the numerical identity (or distinctness) of appearances and things in themselves, nor any warrant for asserting or denying it.[59]

In defense of the contentfulness of these identity claims, one might argue that the term “appearance” and “thing in itself” each has an extension, a set of objects, and the question of identity is perfectly well-formed: do these two sets have a non-empty intersection? If so, at least one appearance is identical to a thing in itself. But this argument begs the question by assuming that the question of whether the set of appearances and the set of thing in themselves has an intersection is itself well-formed; whether this is the case is precisely what is at issue.

While many interpreters (notably Adams 1997: 822) think that we can have no warrant for asserting the identity or non-identity of appearances and things in themselves in general, and thus think the identity/non-identity debate (at least in theoretical contexts) concerns something about which Kant must be agnostic, there are those who disagree (Stang 2014; cf. Walker 2010). In texts quoted earlier, Kant claims that appearances would cease to exist if there were not minds to experience them. On the assumption that this is not true of things in themselves, consider the following argument:

  • (P1) For any x, if x is an appearance, x would not exist if there were no minds to experience it.
  • (P2) For any x, if x is a thing in itself, x would exist if there were no minds to experience it.
  • (C) For any x, if x is an appearance, x is not a thing in itself.

This argument purports to show that, since appearances and things in themselves have different modal properties, they must be distinct. Since (P1) and (P2) are claims Kant makes in the context of his theoretical philosophy, this argument provides warrant for denying identity on purely theoretical grounds.

5.2 Langton and non-identity

Langton’s view can be interpreted as either an identity reading or a non-identity reading. The difference is somewhat subtle, but it has important consequences. On the identity version of Langton (1998), to talk about things in themselves is to predicate intrinsic properties of substances, while to talk about phenomena is to predicate extrinsic properties of those very substances. On the non-identity version of Langton (1998), phenomena are numerically identical to those extrinsic properties. This would be a non-identity reading because substances are not identical to their properties (either extrinsic or intrinsic). By contrast, on the identity reading, an expression for a phenomenon refers to a substance. The difference between these readings can be illustrated by how they give truth-conditions for the judgment that some phenomenon x has property F:

(Identity) x has F = F is among the extrinsic properties of x

(Non-Identity) x has F = x, an extrinsic property of some substance y (≠x), has F

While Langton initially explains her view in a way that suggests an identity reading, she in fact opts for a non-identity reading, for good reason. Firstly, on the identity reading Kant would have to identify subjects of predication in empirical judgments with substances. This is problematic because it would bring substances into the world of space and time. For instance, if I can make a judgment about this table, then it would be a judgment about the extrinsic properties of this table, and this table would be a substance with intrinsic properties (although being a table would, presumably, not be one of them). Alternately, if we identify the table as a collection of extrinsic properties of substances, then we can go on to predicate further properties of the table, without having to identify the substance or substances of which the table is ultimately predicated.[60]

5.3 Phenomenalist Dual Aspect Readings

Some scholars have defended what might initially seem like a contradiction in terms: a phenomenalist “one object” (identity) interpretation of appearances and things in themselves.[61] On such a view, the appearance and the thing in itself are one and the same object, but considered with respect to different properties: the properties we experience the object as having, and the properties it has. On this interpretation, Kant is qualified phenomenalist because he holds that:

(PhenomenalismP) The core physical properties of objects in space are grounded in the contents of our experience of them.

His attitude to:

(PhenomenalismE) The existence of objects in space is ground partly or wholly in the contents of our experience of them.

depends upon how we read it, on this interpretation. On the one hand, we can understand it either as the “de re” claim

(PhenomenalismE*) (x)(x is an object in space ⊃ the existence of x is partly or wholly grounded in our experience of x)

in which case Kant would reject it, because each such object in space is also a thing in itself and, as such, does not depend for its existence on our experience of it. On the other hand, we could understand it as the de dicto claim

(PhenomenalismE**) The fact that there are objects in space is partly or wholly grounded in our experience of objects in space.

in which case Kant would accept it, because there being objects in space depends upon our experiencing objects as in space.

This leads to an important exegetical point. One of the main motivations for “non-identity” interpretations are passages in which Kant claims that appearances would not exist if there were not subjects to experience them, e.g., A42/B59. This might be thought to directly entail phenomenalism, for, if appearances would not exist without subjects to experience them, but things in themselves would, then a fortiori appearances and things in themselves are distinct. This line of reasoning can be represented formally as (P1), (P2) and C from section 5.1. But the identity reader can interpret Kant’s claim “if I were to take away the thinking subject, the whole corporeal world would have to disappear” as meaning: without subjects to experience them, appearances would not exist as appearances, i.e., would not appear. In other words, she can reinterpret (P1) as:

  • (P1*) For all x, if x is an appearance, then x’s existence as an appearance (=the fact that x exists and appears) is grounded in the contents of experience.

But the conjunction of this and (P2) does not entail (C); they are compatible with the identity reading. These passages do not force the non-identity interpretation on us. (For more on phenomenalist identity readings see the supplementary article: Phenomenalist Identity Readings and the Problem of Illusion.)

5.4 Assessing the Interpretive Issues

We have seen some reasons to think that the resolutely anti-phenomenalist reading of Langton (1998) and the phenomenalist reading can be re-interpreted as, respectively, a non-identity reading and an identity reading. One reaction would be to conclude that the interpretive options are simply more complex than is usually appreciated:

Non-Identity Identity
Epistemic Metaphysical
Phenomenalist Aquila (1983), Van Cleve (1999), cf. section 3 N/A Adickes (1924), Westphal (1968)
Anti-phenomenalist Alternate version of Langton Allison (1983/2004), Bird (1962), Prauss (1974) Langton (1998), Allais (2006)

Table 1

But the distinction between the two different versions of Langton, and between the non-identity version of phenomenalism (Aquila 1983; Van Cleve 1999) and the identity version of phenomenalism (Adickes 1924; Westphal 1968) is relatively recondite. It depends on the controversial assumption that assertions of identity between appearances and things in themselves, outside of practical contexts, have a content.

Furthermore, Henry Allison has recently argued that even his view is neutral on the identity/non-identity debate:

although it is sometimes assumed that [the two-aspect reading] commits Kant to a highly implausible one-to-one mapping of the phenomenal and noumenal, I take that to be a red herring. First, it is one thing to distinguish between things (taken collectively) as they are for us in virtue of the sensible conditions of human cognition and as they might be for some putative pure understanding, unburdened by such conditions, and quite another to affirm a one-to-one correspondence or isomorphism between the members of the two domains. (Allison 2004: 459 note 19; cf. Allison 1987: 168)

Allison’s idea is that the distinction between the empirical and the transcendental standpoint is a distinction between how they consider objects as a whole, not how they consider particular objects. The Epistemic reading is not committed to Identity, but neither is it committed to Non-Identity. So an Identity version of the Epistemic reading is possible (according to which we can consider each object individually from either standpoint), as is an Epistemic reading that is neither an Identity nor a Non-Identity reading (on which we remain agnostic as to whether objects considered from one standpoint are numerically identical to objects considered from another).[62] So we might conclude that our interpretive options are even more numerous than we initially thought:

Neither Identity nor Non-Identity Non-Identity Identity
Epistemic Metaphysical
Phenomenalist N/A Aquila (1983), Van Cleve (1999), cf. section 3 N/A Adickes (1924), Westphal (1968)
Anti-phenomenalist Allison (1983/2004) Alternate version of Langton Bird (1962), Prauss (1974), alternate version of Allison (1983/2004), Langton (1998), Allais (2006)

Table 2

But notice we now have doubling of interpretations: identity and non-identity versions of Langton (1998), identity and non-identity versions of phenomenalist views, and identity and “neither identity nor non-identity” versions of Allison.

However, if one thinks that claims of identity between appearances and things in themselves are contentless (see section 5.1), at least outside of the context of practical philosophy, then the menu of interpretive options will appear as:

Phenomenalist Anti-Phenomenalist
Epistemic Metaphysical
Aquila (1983), Van Cleve (1999), Adickes (1924), Westphal (1968), cf. section 3 Allison (1983/2004), Bird (1962), Prauss (1974) Langton (1998), Allais (2006)

Table 3

On such a reading, there is no substance, outside of the practical context, to the question of whether an appearance is numerically identical to a thing in itself, so the identity and non-identity versions of, e.g., phenomenalism, are equivalent.[63] If one holds instead that these identity claims have a content but that we cannot know them on theoretical grounds alone (see section 5.1) then one will likewise see these interpretive options as so constrained, because, although there is a difference in content between, say, the identity and non-identity versions of phenomenalism, Kant must be agnostic as to which is true.

6. Things in themselves, noumena, and the transcendental object

Up to this point, we have focused primarily on the nature of Kantian appearances, and their relation to things in themselves, questions (a) and (c) from section one. However, one of the main questions that must be answered in any interpretation of Kant’s transcendental idealism is, what are things in themselves? Obviously, different interpretations will give very different answers to this question:

Phenomenalist interpretations. Perhaps the best statement of the phenomenalist interpretation of things in themselves is given by Erich Adickes (1924: 14–19): things in themselves are a plurality of mind-independent centers of force. On this view, things in themselves are just what we pre-theoretically took ordinary spatiotemporal objects to be: objects that exist, and possess their core physical properties, wholly independently of our representations of them, and which are (among) the causal inputs to our perceptual faculties (a variant of this thought is expressed by Ameriks 2003: 23–25).

Epistemic interpretations: On the epistemic reading, things in themselves are simply objects considered independently of our distinctively spatiotemporal form of intuition. Thus, they are objects considered as objects of a discursive cognition in general. This very abstract thought is not the basis of any cognition, however; it is merely a reminder that space and time are epistemic conditions, without which we cannot cognize any object.

Metaphysical “dual aspect” interpretations. On this family of interpretations, things in themselves are objects with a given set of properties. Different interpretations give a different answer as to which set of properties constitute things “as they are in themselves”. On Langton’s reading, for instance, things in themselves are substances with intrinsic properties.

In this section I want to distinguish “things in themselves” from other, closely related Kantian notions: noumena, and the “transcendental object”.

6.1 Phenomena and noumena

In the section “On the ground of the distinction of all objects into phenomena and noumena”, which he substantially revised for the B Edition, Kant reiterates his argument that we cannot cognize objects beyond the bounds of possible experience, and introduces a complex distinction between phenomena and noumena.

Fortunately, it is relatively clear what phenomena are: “appearances to the extent that as objects they are thought in accordance with the unity of the categories are called phenomena” (A249). Earlier, in the “Aesthetic”, Kant had defined appearance as: “the undetermined object of an empirical intuition” (A34/B20). All objects of empirical intuition are appearances, but only those that are “thought in accordance with the unity of the categories” are phenomena. For instance, if I have a visual after-image or highly disunified visual hallucination, that perception may not represent its object as standing in cause-effect relations, or being an alteration in an absolutely permanent substance. These would be appearances but not phenomena. The objects of “universal experience”, as defined in section 3, are phenomena because the categories determine the a priori conceptual form; universal experience represents its objects under the unity of the categories.

Kant’s then introduces the concept of noumena:

if, however, I suppose that there be things that are merely objects of the understanding and that, nevertheless, can be given to an intuition, although not to sensible intuition (as coram intuiti intellectuali), then such things would be called noumena (intelligibilia). (A249)

The concept of a noumenon, as defined here, is the concept of an object of cognition for an intellect that is not, like ours, discursive, and thus has a non-sensible form of intuition, which Kant here designates “intellectual intuition”.[64] A sensible intuition is one that can only intuit objects by being causally affected by them; a non-sensible intuition is one in which the intuition of the object brings the object into existence. Thus, the concept of a noumenon is the concept of an object that would be cognized by an intellect whose intuition brings its very objects into existence. Clearly, we do not cognize any noumena, since to cognize an object for us requires intuition and our intuition is sensible, not intellectual.

Kant then connects the concept of noumena to things in themselves:

it also follows naturally from the concept of an appearance in general that something must correspond to it which is not in itself appearance, for appearance can be nothing for itself and outside of our kind of representation; thus, if there is not to be a constant circle, the word "appearance" must already indicate a relation to something the immediate representation of which is, to be sure, sensible, but which in itself, without this constitution of our sensibility (on which the form of our intuition is grounded), must be something, i.e., an object independent of sensibility. Now from this arises the concept of a noumenon, which, however, is not at all positive and does not signify a determinate cognition of something in general, in which I abstract from all form of sensible intuition. (A251–2)

This passage begins with the familiar point that the very concept of appearance requires that there be something that is not appearance that appears. Usually Kant makes this point using the concept “things in themselves” (e.g., in the Prolegomena (Ak. 4:314–5); cf. Bxxvi–xxvii, B306, and B307). However, here he claims that this idea—that it cannot be “appearances all the way down”—brings with it the idea of noumena. This is puzzling. Why must whatever it is that appear to us as phenomena be conceived of as an objects of intellectual intuition?

Kant clarifies precisely this point in the B Edition by distinguishing between a positive and a negative sense of “noumena”:

If by a noumenon we understand a thing insofar as it is not an object of our sensible intuition, because we abstract from the manner of our intuition of then this is a noumenon in the negative sense. But if we understand by that an object of a non-sensible intuition then we assume a special kind of intuition, namely intellectual intuition, which, however, is not our own, and the possibility of which we cannot understand, and this would be the noumenon in a positive sense. (B307)

Noumena in a positive sense are simply noumena as Kant originally defined that notion in the A edition: objects of an intellectual (non-sensible) intuition. The negative concept of noumena, however, is simply the concept of objects that are not spatiotemporal (not objects of our sensible intuition, namely space and time). But then it follows that things in themselves are noumena in the negative sense, retrospectively clarifying the passage from the A edition quoted immediately above, where Kant seems to draw from the “Transcendental Aesthetic” the conclusion that there are noumena: the concept of appearance requires that something appears, and this must be a negative noumena.

Putting these pieces together we can see that “things in themselves” [Dinge an sich selbst] and (negative) “noumena” are concepts that belong to two different distinctions: “thing in itself” is one half of the appearance/thing in itself distinction, which Kant originally defined at A491/B519 in terms of their existence: appearances have no existence “grounded in themselves” while things in themselves do. “Noumena” is one half of the distinction phenomena/noumena which Kant characterizes at B307 as the distinction between what can be an object of our sensible spatiotemporal intuition and what cannot be an object of sensible intuition. (Kant here appears to overlook the possibility of objects of sensible but non-spatiotemporal intuition). One is a distinction in what ground the existence of objects; the other is a distinction in what kinds of intuition can present those objects. However, we can make a connection between them: things in themselves, the objects whose existence is “ground in itself”, and which appear to us in space and time, cannot be objects of any sensible intuition, so they are negative noumena. Whether, additionally, they are also objects of an intuitive intellect, is a separate matter. This is a point about the relations among these concepts; it holds whether or not they are possibly instantiated.

6.2 The transcendental object = X

In the “Phenomena and noumena” section, Kant distinguishes the concept of a noumenon from the concept of a “transcendental object” (A250). This is a reference to a notion introduced in the A version of the “Transcendental Deduction”:

The pure concept of the transcendental object (which in all of our cognition is really one and the same = X) is that which in all of our empirical concepts in general can provide relation to an object, i.e., objective reality. Now this concept cannot contains any determinate intuition at all, and therefore contains nothing but that unity which must be encountered in a manifold of cognition insofar as it stands in relation to an object. (A109; cf. A104)

The “concept of a transcendental object” might be fruitfully thought of as “the transcendental concept of an object”: the concept of “object” that makes experience possible. Our mind’s synthesis of representations into experience of objects is guided and made possible by the idea that there is a way objects are that must be tracked by our representations of them. This wholly abstract concept of “a way things are” is the concept of the transcendental object = X, the indeterminate concept of the “target” of our representational activity. Consequently, the concept of the transcendental object must be distinct from the concept of “things in themselves” or “negative noumena”. The concept of things in themselves is the concept of the (unknowable by us) objects (or aspects of objects) that appear to us the 3D world of space and time. They are the grounds of phenomena, while the transcendental object is the very abstract idea of those objects in space and time as the targets of our cognitive activity.

Another way to appreciate this distinction is to consider the difference in why these notions of object (noumena, transcendental object) are unknowable by us. We cannot cognize things in themselves because cognition requires intuition, and our intuition only ever presents appearances, not things in themselves. We cannot cognize the transcendental object because the transcendental object is a purely schematic, general idea of empirical objectivity. Whenever we cognize a determinate empirical object we are cognitively deploying the transcendental concept of an object in general, but we are not coming to know anything about the object of that concept as such.

This is Kant’s point in “phenomena and noumena” when he writes:

This transcendental object cannot even be separated from the sensible data, for then nothing would remain through which it would be thought. It is therefore no object of cognition in itself, but only the representation of appearances under the concept of an object in general, which is determinable through the manifold of those appearances. (A250–1)

The (negative) concept of a noumenon is the concept of an object that is not an object of our sensible spatiotemporal intuition. But the transcendental object makes no sense in abstraction from intuition, because it is merely the abstract concept that the unity of our intuitions must have in order to constitute experience of an object (cf. Allison’s classic paper

7. Conclusion

This article has traced the meaning of transcendental idealism, sometimes referred to as “critical” or “formal” idealism, through the text of the Critique of Pure Reason and various interpretive controversies. Historically, the main question dividing different interpretations is whether Kant is a phenomenalist about object in space and time and, if so, in what sense. The phenomenalist interpretation of Kant, dominant among Kant’s immediate predecessors and later German idealists, was challenged in twentieth century Anglophone scholarship by, among others, Graham Bird, Gerold Prauss, and Henry Allison. Some later scholars have retained a central idea of these scholars’ reading—that the appearance/thing in itself distinction is a distinction between distinct aspects of objects, not distinct kinds of objects—while jettisoning the purely epistemological interpretation of Kant’s idealism. The meaning and philosophical significance of “transcendental idealism” has been debated by Kant’s readers since 1781, and this debate shows no sign of abating any time soon.


Works of Kant

The standard German edition of Kant’s works is:

  • [Ak.] Königlichen Preußischen (later Deutschen) Akademie der Wissenschaften (ed.), 1900-, Kants gesammelte Schriften, Berlin: Georg Reimer (later Walter De Gruyter).

The most authoritative English translations of Kant’s works are in:

  • Guyer, P. and A. Wood (eds.), 1992–, The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Individual volumes used in the preparation of this entry are:

  • Allison, H. and P. Heath (eds.), 2002, Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Guyer, P. and A. Wood (eds.), 1998, Critique of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Zweig, A. (ed.), 1999, Correspondence, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

We refer to certain Kantian works by the following abbreviations:

  • [Prolegomena] Prolegomena to any future metaphysics. Translation by Gary Hatfield in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781.
  • [On a discovery] On a discovery according to which all future critiques of reason have been rendered superfluous by a previous one. Translation by Henry Allison in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781.

Other Primary Sources

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