Latin American Philosophy: Metaphilosophical Foundations

First published Tue Jul 2, 2013

A salient feature of Latin American philosophy is its early engagement in reflection about its nature and significance—indeed, the very possibility of its existence. The result has been substantial debates on issues that are of interest not only to Latin American philosophy, but to metaphilosophy in general. For one thing, they involve questions that similarly arise for other less familiar philosophical traditions. This essay looks closely at those debates about Latin American philosophy. It is focused on the analysis of its main problems and the positions at stake, without special attention to details of the history of the field.


1. Preliminaries

The nature of philosophy in Latin America first drew the attention of philosophically-minded thinkers in the early nineteenth century, when the region began to develop into nations independent from Spain. But it acquired greater significance with the birth of contemporary academic philosophy in the following century, ultimately taking center stage in the second half of the 20th century, where we find it today. In fact, it can be broken down into a number of inter-related questions about Latin American philosophy's existence and its originality, authenticity, significance, and role in culture and society.

But, as in other regions, such questions in the Latin American context were often triggered by discomfort with a philosophical status quo that came to be regarded as inadequate. The critique of the status quo sometimes led to a careful reflection on what philosophy is (or should be), as a practice, and as an academic discipline. Questions of this sort we'll refer to as ‘metaphilosophical’—where this term of art need not be understood as having the connotation that those who engage in metaphilosophy are stepping out of philosophy to look at it from somewhere else (cf. Williamson 2007, p. ix). The metaphilosophy of Latin American philosophy is itself one of Latin American philosophy's central topics. It triggered skepticism about whether there is a philosophy that can rightly be called Latin American, as well as views about which properties are desirable for a philosophy of that sort. More recently, Latin American metaphilosophy itself has become the object of reflection (Hurtado 2007, Vargas 2007). Such reflection, which attempts a theoretical ‘ascent’ that might be properly considered meta-metaphilosophical, will not be of concern here.

1.1 Two Types of Philosophy

Academic philosophy, or autonomous philosophy as practiced in the West since the Enlightenment, did not begin in Latin America until the first half of the twentieth century. Initially, the reigning philosophical paradigm in the Americas was Scholasticism. That medieval style of philosophy prevailed in the colonial period, which extended roughly from the early sixteenth to the early nineteenth century. Mainly confined to teaching the doctrines of great classical and medieval European philosophers, Scholasticism was not to be challenged until the eighteenth century, when the theories of the Enlightenment and the rise of modern philosophy began to be known in the American colonies of Spain and Portugal.

Parallel to these philosophical developments, a non-academic type of philosophy consistently prospered in Latin America from the sixteenth century to the present. It comprises philosophical positions expressed in essay format, a hybrid genre cultivated by political and religious leaders, scientists, and literary figures, who, interested in the intersection of philosophy with literature, religion, and politics, arguably made contributions to the intellectual history of Latin America. As may be expected, however, the line separating academic and non-academic philosophy is not always sharp. Although it's clear that a work such as the Labyrinth of Solitude, by the Mexican writer and diplomat Octavio Paz (1914–1998) [1] falls within the latter, and Lógica viva (Living Logic), by Uruguayan philosopher Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872–1958) falls within the former, there are many borderline cases. Consider Lascasianism: first developed by the Dominican friar and theologian Bartolomé de las Casas (Spanish-born, 1474–1566) in colonial times, the doctrine is still influential in the work of liberation theologians such as the Peruvian Gustavo Guttiérrez. It advocates a perfectionist version of Roman Catholic ethics, according to which the ways of life that should be promoted are those that make people more human –as illustrated by las Casas' vindication of the humanity of Amerindians (i.e., their personhood). Since Lascasianism has philosophical grounds and implications, but is a product of amateur philosophers, it stands out as a prime borderline case between the realms of academic and non-academic philosophy.

1.2 Origins

When did philosophy begin in Latin America? Any answer to this question would depend in part to whether one is asking about the beginning of academic or non-academic philosophy. There is consensus that some form of academic philosophy, mostly connected with teaching, existed during the colonial period. An example of a successful work from this early period is Lógica mexicana, a textbook by the Mexican Antonio Rubio (1548–1615) widely used at the time, even in Spain. But it was not until the early twentieth century that philosophy acquired contemporary scholarly dimensions, including standard institutional manifestations.

An interesting metaphilosophical issue related to the origin of Latin American philosophy is whether the philosophical thought of Pre-Colombian cultures also belongs in the non-academic tradition. Needless to say, pre-Columbian thought unfolds in ways that seem utterly alien to our current standards about form, content, and method for philosophical work. But compliance with such standards falls short of being a necessary condition for a work to count as philosophical. After all, the works of Pythagoras and the other Pre-Socratics are quite unorthodox in those respects yet considered philosophical. And contemporary examples too are not far to seek. Wittgenstein immediately comes to mind. A number of Latin American philosophers are now prepared to agree with Peruvian Francisco Miró Quesada that “[i]n a broad sense, philosophy has always existed in Latin America. The Maya and the Inca had thought that, without abusing the terms, may be considered of philosophical character….” (1978, p. 75, my translation). Textual evidence of the existence of philosophical thought among the Aztecs has been provided and analyzed by a number of experts. For example, Bernardino de Sahagún (1499–1590), a Spanish friar turned into amateur ethnologist, and contemporary philosophers such as Mexican Miguel León Portilla (1963) and American James Maffie (2009).

Nuccetelli (2011) considers pre-Columbian works of philosophical import to be part of Latin American proto-philosophy of the non-academic variety. Gracia's (2008) understanding of Latin American philosophy as ethnic philosophy (more on this later) can also accommodate pre-Columbian philosophical works within that discipline. But until proper historical work can provide more stable and widely accepted answers about what belongs to the canon of that ethnic philosophy and what doesn't, Gracia (especially in his 2010) defers taking a position on whether works such as the Maya folk-cosmology in the Popol Vuh belongs to Latin American philosophy.

2. What Is Latin American Philosophy?

As noted above, in contemporary Latin American philosophy lively metaphilosophical debates, recognized as such by its participants, are a frequent occurrence. The Peruvian Augusto Salazar Bondy (1925–1974) held that such debates belong to “the philosophy of philosophy” (1968, p. 13). He also divided the issues at stake into three categories, descriptive, prescriptive, or identity issues (1968, p. 11), a classification that is for the most part still current. One exception is that, today, questions about whether a philosophy is “original, genuine, or peculiar” are not strictly descriptive. For these predicates seem both descriptive and evaluative, and therefore analogous to others now considered thick moral predicates, such as ‘cruel,’ ‘loyal,’ and the like.

2.1 Some Main Descriptive Questions

The principal purely descriptive question in those debates concerns whether philosophy exists as a practice or discipline in Latin America. When answered in the affirmative, a related question is when did it begin? There is consensus that the practice of philosophy sin más (as such—i.e., for its own sake, autonomous of non-philosophical interests) is an early twentieth-century phenomenon. But, understood in a broader sense, it dates from the colonial period. Thus, some take Latin American philosophy to be a contemporary phenomenon (e.g., Miró Quesada 1974, p. 75), while others trace it back to the sixteenth century (e.g., Gracia et al. 1995, p. 462; Hurtado 2007, p. 47). The disagreement, however, is only apparent, since—as noted by Francisco Romero—one can acknowledge the colonial origins of (broad) philosophy while noting “the prevalence [then] of pedagogical over philosophical concerns with regard to creativity and even the re-thinking of one's ideas and doctrines” (1941, p. 12, see also his 1943, p. 127).

The descriptive question about the existence of a Latin American (academic) philosophy can be sharpened by breaking it down into smaller questions concerning the truth of each of the following claims:

  1. Philosophy exists in Latin America as a practice or discipline autonomous from the sciences, theology, literature, politics, and education.
  2. There are stable philosophical traditions and communities in the region, of the sort commonly found in major centers of Western philosophy.
  3. Philosophy has acquired professional and institutional status according to current Western standards (i.e., it is properly represented in educational systems, learned societies, associations, journals, presses, etc.).

2.1.1 Philosophy's Autonomy and “Normalcy”

Since the early twentieth century, there has been a strong endorsement of claim (I) (Alberini 1927; Romero 1943; Miró Quesada 1978; Moulines 2010). But critics are more cautious about previous periods. As noted by Romero above, during the colonial period philosophy was not autonomous from education. During the nineteenth century, as clearly evident in the work of Latin American positivists, philosophical concerns had close connections to political and social interests. In fact, up to about the 1910s, there was room for skepticism about all three claims. Between the 1910s and the 40s, a generation of philosophers known as the fundadores (‘Founders’) strove to develop philosophy in Latin America as an autonomous discipline within academia, with the usual professional organizations and institutions. It was clearly owing to their efforts that philosophy became a practice in their universities analogous to what their peers were doing at the time in major Western centers of scholarship. For the first time since the Wars of Independence and the national organization that followed (roughly, l810–1898), philosophy began to be studied for its own sake. Moreover, it became a professional activity with recognition in the wider community. Through all of these developments, the Founders' efforts bore fruit in establishing philosophical “normalcy” (maturity). Philosophers of the next generation strove to make the transformations stable. The Argentine Eduardo Rabossi (1930–2005) observes that Latin American philosophy developed relatively quickly compared to philosophy in Europe, since although Latin America followed European models, it was not until the nineteenth century that Europe itself acquired its own philosophical “normalcy” (1994, p. 36).

Be that as it may, we can say that by the 1940s, not only claim (I) but also (III) were true, a fact illustrated in Rabossi's 1994 vivid narrative of the vicissitudes faced by Alejandro Korn (1860–1936) and other Argentinean Founders in their effort to create a Facultad de Filosofía y Letras (College of Liberal Arts) at the Universidad Nacional de Buenos Aires.

2.1.2 The New Skeptics

Given a view that we may call the ‘new skepticism,’ however, claim (II) is false: Latin American philosophy lacks inner and outer dialogue of the sort needed to develop stable philosophical traditions and communities. Ezcurdia (2003), García-Ramírez (2011), Hurtado (2006, 2007), Pereda (2006), and Rabossi (1994, 2008) are all new skeptics committed to denying some version of (II) on the grounds that Latin American philosophy faces what some of them refer to as an “invisibility” problem. Latin American philosophy is invisible because it faces

  • An Internal Dialogue Problem (IDP): There is no (stable) philosophical dialogue among Latin American philosophers, and
  • An External Dialogue Problem (EDP): There is no (stable, reciprocal) philosophical dialogue between Latin American philosophers and their Western peers.

The new skeptics mostly take the IDP for granted, devoting little effort to providing reliable evidence for it. And when available, the evidence is often difficult to test. A notable exception is Pereda 2006, which points out the lack of sufficient reference to Latin American publications in the numerous contributions by Latin Americans to the Enciclopedia iberoamericana de filosofía (a multi-volume reference work whose first volume appeared in 1987).

Other adduced evidence is anecdotal, generally appealing to instances of the IDP in the context of conferences, learned societies, etc. According to these narratives, Latin American philosophers regularly fail to engage in the study and discussion of their own traditions, which they perceive as uninteresting, of poor quality, or disenfranchising. For example, adopting Enrique Dussel's 1998 center/periphery distinction, Rabossi (2008, pp. 102ff.; see also his 1994) tells us that the Latin American philosopher is a “periphery philosopher,” with the self-image of a ‘guacho’ (slang for ‘orphan,’ or even ‘street urchin’). The guacho not only fails to acknowledge his own “philosophical parents,” but doesn't want to know about them at all: “he doesn't take them into account, he doesn't read them, he is not even interested in criticizing their defects or limitations; for him, his own philosophical past doesn't exist” (2008, p. 103, my translation). Without awareness of his own philosophical past and dialog with regional peers, the Latin American philosopher can have neither philosophical traditions nor genuine philosophical communities. A related claim is made by Hurtado (2006, pp. 206ff.; 2007. pp. 24ff.), for whom the IDP arises for Mexican philosophy, and by extension for Latin American philosophy, owing to the fact that many of its practitioners have followed a “modernizing model.” Among the numerous unwelcome traits of this model are the tendencies of its followers to form small groups and spend most of their time trying to learn some imported philosophy, citing only foreign philosophers without paying much attention to regional peers. Those who adopt this model proceed to study the latest modern tradition, which uncritically replaces previous ones. At the end of the day, in Latin American philosophy “…each modernizing movement got lost for the upcoming movement…” (Hurtado 2006, p. 206), and there are neither traditions nor stable communities of dialogue. “But the foreign philosophers,” laments Hurtado, “even those who visit our countries to deliver talks, very rarely quote us in their work. There is therefore no genuine dialogue…” (Hurtado 2006, p. 205). So Hurtado thinks that Latin American philosophy also faces the EDP. Of the two problems, however, the IDP is the “central” one, thus the EDP appears to depend on the IDP (see also García-Ramírez 2011, and compare Ezcurdia 2003). In any event, on this view, Latin American philosophers will continue to face the IDP “unless we create a genuine critical dialogue among ourselves and simultaneously exercise a constantly renewed memory of past dialogues” (2006, p. 210). Until then, claim (II) is false.

But the new skeptics, confident that the IDP and EDP can both be fixed, invariably offer a list of suggestions about how to do that. There is, however, considerable unacknowledged overlap in such “repair manuals,” which suggests that the new skeptics fail to establish among themselves an internal philosophical dialogue whose very absence from Latin American philosophy they see as a problem. If this ad hominem is strong, then the new skeptics' challenge to claim (II) is not without problems of its own. For the argument charges that new skepticism appears itself to suffer from the very flaw it criticizes in Latin American philosophy: namely, it omits not just establishing a dialogue with, but even acknowledging, current works by Latin American philosophers on the topic at issue. And although some new skeptics do make some such references (e.g., García-Ramírez 2011), these are limited to the work of other new skeptics. On the other hand, there is abundant textual evidence that the metaphilosophical questions of concern here have generated intense dialogue among Latin American philosophers and, as we shall see next, discernible skeptical and anti-skeptical traditions. For this reason, claim (II) –viz., that there are stable philosophical traditions and communities in the region, of the sort commonly found in major centers of Western philosophy— has not yet been shown false.

2.2 Some Main Evaluative Questions

Answers to the evaluative questions of whether there is, or could be, a Latin American philosophy that is original, authentic, peculiar, or in some other ways distinctive constitute a wide philosophical spectrum, with what may be called ‘strong universalism’ at one extreme, ‘strong distinctivism’ at the other, and ‘middle-way theories’ in between.

2.2.1 Universalism vs. Distinctivism

Strong universalism is the view that all philosophical theories, methods, and topics have an import that is universal rather than relative to regions, persons, groups, or cultures. It conflicts with strong distinctivism, the view that all of philosophy's theories, methods, and topics represent the point of view of a region, person, group, or culture. The contemporary representatives of universalism in Latin American philosophy are many and have different philosophical orientations (for an overview of classic universalism, see Salazar Bondy 1968, pp. 45ff.). Universalism appears to be what Argentinean Pablo Navarro has in mind when he asserts “Legal philosophy in Latin America does not differ significantly from philosophical studies of the law in the United States, Germany, the UK, or Sweden” (2009, p. 439).[2] Gracia 2000 and Montemayor 2011 associate being a scientifically-minded philosopher with favoring universalism. Perhaps the connection is grounded in some such philosophers' previous commitment to the objectivity of science, together with their thesis that science is the model for philosophy.

For a classic representative of universalism we need to look no further than the work of the Argentine Risieri Frondizi (1910–1983), who by combining universalism with originalism was led to the skeptical conclusion that, in the late 1940s, only a very small part of philosophy in Latin America deserved to be considered philosophy at all. But as pointed out earlier by his compatriot José Ingenieros (1887–1925), not everything needs to be (indeed we might say, ‘can be’) original in the work of “a true philosopher” (Ingenieros 1914, p. 7). Furthermore, not only is originality a matter of degree but the term ‘original’ is itself ambiguous. It has been used with connotations such as

  • Being creative, novel, and autochthonous (Ingenieros 1914).
  • Being creative and non-imitative (Cannabrava 1927; Frondizi 1949).
  • Being a philosophical product that “makes some degree of contribution to ideas or approaches, with respect to previous works, and is sufficiently discernible as a creation and not a repetition in content. In this sense, an original philosophy is identified by its new conceptual constructions of recognized value” (Salazar Bondy168, p. 100, my translation).
  • Being tradition-originating (Hurtado 2007).

Putting aside Hurtado's more idiosyncratic understanding of the term and Ingenieros's too permissive ‘autochthonous,’ we have:

A philosophical work is original just in case it makes some degree of contribution to philosophy by being creative, non-imitative, or novel with respect to previous works.

2.2.2 The Originality Problem

We'll now consider two positions, Frondizi 1949 and Pereda 2000, each committed to holding that Latin American academic philosophy faces an originality problem: namely, it fails to be sufficiently original in the above sense. Frondizi's commitment to that thesis is explicit: he concludes that based on the evidence, only 10% of philosophy ‘as such’ in Latin America is original. Since the works of non-academic philosophers are excluded from this evidence, we must infer that Latin American philosophy is devoid of significant history, theories, methods, and number of creative practitioners. Nuccetelli 2003 argues that in Latin America, many of those who have offered the more original philosophical positions were in fact the non-academics. Furthermore, in other parts of the world contributions by non-academics are often counted as philosophy, as exemplified by works of Hume, Bentham, Mill, Saint Simon, Marx and many others. If this is correct, then Frondizi's criterion turns out to be too demanding. As Gracia (2003) notes, originalism of this sort verges on the absurd, since in no other ethnic philosophy (more on this later) is originality set as a necessary and sufficient condition.

Pereda's recent work also shows his commitment to the originality problem, which is presupposed by his skeptical claim that Latin American philosophy is “invisible” (i.e., suffers from the IDP and EDP mentioned above). Like Frondizi, Pereda first praises the work of Latin American essayists, and even takes it to be a model that philosophy must emulate in order to overcome its problems. But to be a model of success is one thing, to be Latin American philosophy quite another. Since Pereda also locates non-academic philosophy somewhere else, as a result, he runs head-on into a similar skeptical conclusion about the features of Latin American philosophy. Such skepticism is inevitable because on his view, Latin American philosophy suffers from the “arrogant reasoning” of its practitioners, which fuels the epistemic vices of “nationalist enthusiasm” (in the case of distinctivists) or “subaltern fervor” and “craving for novelty” (in the case of universalists). Such vices, and ultimately arrogant reasoning itself, are to be blamed for the internal and external invisibility of Latin American philosophy.

It can now be shown that these alleged vices of universalists, if substantiated, would raise an originality challenge to Latin America philosophy. After all, universalism has many representatives of a great variety of persuasions (Gracia and Jaksić 1986, p. 214; Miró Quesada 1978, p. 76; Salazar Bondy 1968, pp. 49ff.). If universalists are driven by subaltern fervor and a craving for novelty, then they need perforce to devote considerable time and effort to assimilating the latest fads (something they have done, according to Hurtado's 2006 critique of the modernizing model). Since producing work that is to a significant degree original requires considerable time and effort, there would be empirical constraints on those philosophers in their capability to produce original work.

Therefore, it seems that the invisibility problem entails the originality problem. But although all new skeptics think there is an invisibility problem for Latin American philosophy, they disagree about what to make of the originality problem. For Ezcurdia 2002 it does arise: of four kinds of originality she identifies as desirable in philosophy (viz., interpretative, argumentative, problem-making, and problem-solving), she concedes that Latin American philosophy may have interpretative originality, but finds it lacking in originality of the other kinds. In particular, she contends that an improvement in problem-solving originality is needed for fixing the EDP facing Latin American philosophy, which on her view would, in turn lead to a solution to the IDP. On the other hand, García-Ramírez (2011, p. 13) dismisses the originality problem but writes: “even though there is enough originality, most Latin American philosophy is haunted by the two proceedings of arrogant reasoning: internal visibility is a function of the external partly because Latin American philosophy is not used to thinking on its own.” Questions arise, however, as to how could there be enough originality in a philosophy that's not used to thinking on its own?

2.2.3 The Authenticity Problem

According to distinctivists, a chief distinguishing characteristic of Latin American philosophy is—or should be—authenticity, a feature of any “philosophical product that, like any other cultural product has integrity and is devoid of falsity or pretense. In this sense, we say, for example, that Kant's philosophy is authentic, but spiritism is pseudo-philosophy” (Salazar Bondy 1968, pp. 100–101, my translation). Salazar (1968, p. 101) and (Hurtado 2006, p. 209) distinguish authenticity from peculiarity, the regional coloring of a philosophical product that is characteristically Latin American. A philosophical work may be peculiar by virtue of discussing a Latin American theme or by virtue of being the product of a Latin American author, even when it could lack authenticity, originality, or both. At the same time, it could be original and/or authentic without being peculiar. Since a full account of such conceptual inter-relations goes beyond our present purpose, let's stipulate that a Latin American philosophy is

  1. Original just in case it is creative, non-imitative, or novel;
  2. Authentic just in case it is genuine or non-spurious; and
  3. Peculiar just in case it is characteristically Latin American.

As pointed out by Salazar, feature (3) is the cheapest of all: it can easily be obtained by a work whose topic, or even author, is relevantly related to Latin America. Although, as we'll soon see, peculiarity may be what some distinctivists actually have in mind, more often they care most about authenticity– holding that originality will come ‘for añadidura’ (as an addition).

An early proposal to develop a peculiar Latin American philosophy is perhaps that of the Argentine Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810–1884) in his “Ideas….” This short newspaper article, published in Montevideo in 1840, offers advice about how to develop a high school course in philosophy to be taught at the Colegio de Humanidades (School of Humanities). It recommends that the course be aimed at “instruct[ing] the youth in the principles that reside in the conscience of our societies” (1840, p. 97, my translation). On this view, Latin American philosophy should be devoted, not to abstract metaphysics, but rather to applied philosophy, focusing on the social and political issues of the day in the newly independent nations of the region. But Alberdi's article also ventures into metaphilosophical issues that were far beyond politics and diplomacy, his areas of expertise—notoriously opining, among other things, that it was for Europe, not Latin America, to do the theoretical philosophical thinking (1840, p. 95). Not to be reprinted until the following century, this article is unlikely to have had the influence ascribed to it by some Mexican distinctivists of the 1940s and their followers. The point is made forcefully by the Uruguayan Arturo Ardao (1912–2003), a well-known historian of Latin American philosophy who contends that the article “came to have influence in Latin America in the context of the philosophical innovations of the 1940s, precisely a year after its centennial. Its most decisive apologist turned out to be the magisterial philosopher Gaos in Mexico.” (1991, p. xxiii, my translation). Arturo Roig also regards the twentieth-century fascination with Alberdi's “Ideas” as an ideological coincidence. He writes:

Gaos's opinions and theses conferred on Alberdi's text a significance more vast [than its actual one], which goes beyond the topic of a ‘national philosophy’ that was the framework within which the text was evaluated in Argentina. It also ascribed to it a scope unimagined by Alberdi. It appears, rather, that Alberdian historicist circumstantialism ended up coinciding with Mexican circumstantialism… (Roig 1981b, p. 1, my translation)

For a more contemporary vindication of features of Latin American philosophy akin to peculiarity, we'll need to turn to some of the middle-way theories below. But first, let's consider the two main strands of extreme distinctivism in Latin American philosophy, the ‘the critical theory’ and ‘circumstantialism’ (also known as ‘critical view,’ and ‘culturalism’ respectively; see e.g., Gracia and Jaksić 1986).

The critical theory is a hybrid that includes theses from early twentieth century Marxists as well as the views of contemporary ‘liberation philosophers,’ who in turn combine Marxist ideas with European doctrines from French structuralism, the Frankfurt School and other sources. Abundant textual evidence suggests that, for the critical theorist, Latin America philosophy commonly lacks originality, authenticity, and/or peculiarity. Thus, an early representative of the view laments that:

All the thinkers of our America have been educated in European schools. The spirit of the race is not felt in their work. The continent's intellectual production lacks its distinguishing traits. It does not have an original profile. Hispanic-American thought is generally only a rhapsody composed from the motifs and elements of European thought. To prove this, one needs only review the work of the highest representatives of the Indo-Iberian intellect. (Mariátegui 1925, p. 113, my translation)

Similarly, a critical theorist of the 1940s regards Brazilian (and, by extension, Latin American) philosophy as lacking features (1)–(3) by virtue of its “colonial mentality,” a situation that would persist until Latin America has won “complete independence –economic, and cultural—from the imperialistic powers” (Coutinho 1943, pp. 187–188). Analogous arguments were offered later by Salazar, for whom Latin American philosophy had been, from its colonial beginnings, only “a thought of the upper class or of a refined oligarchical elite, when it has not corresponded openly to waves of foreign economic and political influence. In all these cases underdevelopment and domination are influential” (1969, p. 241). Endorsing this line of reasoning, Roig declares that the work of Founders such as the Peruvian Alejandro Deustua (1849–1945) is “a prime example of the uprooting and the alienation in Latin American thought denounced so vehemently by Augusto Salazar Bondy” (1976, p. 251).

But it seems reductionist at best to hold that cultural dependence and economic underdevelopment always determine a philosophy's shortcomings in features (1), (2) and/or (3). A prime counterexample is the ethics of las Casas mentioned above, which is original, authentic, and peculiar, though developed under extreme cultural and economic dependence (for more on this, see Nuccetelli 2012). Furthermore, the critical theory also faces the following ad hominem objections:

  • Since the critical theorist usually belongs to the upper class in Latin American societies, which on her own view are incapable of producing a philosophy with features (1)–(3), the critical theory itself lacks (1)–(3) and should be rejected.
  • The critical theorist usually borrows from European traditions such as Marxism, existentialism, structuralism, and the Frankfurt School. But borrowed traditions are, on her own view, incapable of generating an authentic Latin American philosophy. It follows that the critical theory is not authentic and should be rejected.

Objections along these lines (e.g., Gracia 2003 and Hurtado 2007), together with its vulnerability to counterexamples, make the critical theory implausible.

There is, however, another distinctivist theory that might be plausible: circumstantialism. Famously expounded by the Mexican Leopoldo Zea (1912–2004), its main concern is authenticity. Putting aside its contention that an authentic philosophy is bound to acquire originality and peculiarity at some point, here is circumstantialism's main argument:

  1. All philosophical works are authentic in that they invariably show the cultural circumstance of their production.
  2. Therefore, all Latin American philosophical works show the cultural circumstance of their production.
  3. Therefore, all Latin American philosophical works are authentic.

Thus, the circumstantialist maintains,

The abstract issues [of philosophy] will have to be seen from the Latin American man's own circumstance. Each man will see in such issues what is closest to his own circumstance. He will look at these issues from the standpoint of his own interests, and those interests will be determined by his way of life, his abilities and inabilities, in a word, by his own circumstance. In the case of Latin America, his contribution to the philosophy of such issues will be permeated by the Latin American circumstance. Hence, when we [Latin Americans] address abstract issues, we shall formulate them as issues of our own. Even though being, God, etc., are issues appropriate for every man, the solution to them will be given from a Latin American standpoint. (Zea 1948, p. 226)

In this way, the circumstantialist appears to have dissolved the alleged conflict between universalism and distinctivism. For, given the above argument, the following claims are all compatible:

  • There is an authentic Latin American philosophy.
  • The problems and methods of philosophy are universal.
  • Philosophers' ‘circumstances’ always shape their theories and methods.

But the soundness of the cirumstantialist argument hinges on its premise 1. This is a very strong claim which entails not only that (a) the context of discovery (or creation) is to some degree apparent in any philosophical theory, so that all theories are peculiar in the above sense, but also that (b) such context renders them authentic. Yet (a) is at the very least controversial, given that it is not obvious what is ‘Greek’ about Aristotle's theory of the syllogism or German about Kant's categorical imperative (see Nuccetelli 2003, but compare Monahan 2005). Moreover, (a) may entail peculiarity, not authenticity. For the latter, the circumstantialist needs (b), a claim for which no sound argument is in the offing. In addition, as argued in Gracia's 2003, there is an irresolvable problem for anyone attempting to specify what's necessary and sufficient for being a Latin American cultural circumstance, as opposed to the circumstances of other cultures. And no less difficult would be the task of tracing the connections between philosophical theories and culture in Latin America, given the bewildering diversity of cultures that have flourished there.

2.3 Middle-Way Theories

Middle-way theories reject both strong universalism and strong distinctivism. If successful, they would avoid the problems facing each of those extremes—which, as we saw above, are skepticism about Latin American philosophy (in strong universalism) and ungrounded assumptions (in strong distinctivism). Here we'll briefly consider three recent middle-way positions. The first two are in agreement in their view that it would be possible to provide examples of sufficient conditions for a work to count as Latin American philosophy. The position discussed last undertakes the more ambitious project of proposing a set of conditions that are necessary and jointly sufficient.

What we may call ‘the ethnic-philosophy account’ (Gracia's 2003, 2008) is a neo-Wittgensteinian view holding that Latin American philosophy (and more broadly, Hispanic and Latino/a philosophy) is

[T]he philosophy of an ethnos, and insofar as it is so, and members of ethne do not necessarily share features in common, then what the philosophy of a particular ethnos is exactly will not require any features in common with other philosophies outside the ethnos or even within the ethnos throughout its history. This, I claim, is the best way of understanding the unity of Latin American philosophy. (Gracia 2008, p. 140)

On this account, being the philosophy of the Latin American ethnos is sufficient for counting as Latin American philosophy. At the same time, the account holds that it is not possible to provide conditions that are necessary and jointly sufficient for being an instance of this ethnic philosophy. No such conditions are to be had, even in the case of ‘Spanish philosophy,’ another ethnic philosophy for which no necessary and sufficient conditions of inclusion can be offered, even though it appears identifiable in nationality terms—a conclusion suggested by the fact that ‘Spanish philosophy’ commonly includes figures such as “Seneca and Averroes, philosophers who lived long before the Spanish nation was constituted as a political reality, and whose relationship to this nation, as we have known it since the sixteenth century, is less than tenuous” (Gracia 2003, p. 57).

This conception of Latin American philosophy as an ethnic philosophy is inspired by Wittgenstein's ‘family resemblances’ theory for concepts such as ‘game’ and ‘funny.’ For example, there is no distinguishing feature that all games have in common in virtue of which they are games. Rather, there are resemblances between activities we call ‘games’ that are like the resemblances between members of a single family. Similarly, there are no distinguishing properties of an ethnic philosophy but numerous properties that would each be a sufficient condition for belonging to it. This seems to entail that that an ethnic philosophy can be categorized in a variety of ways, given that its identity hinges at least in part on the adopted “selective point of view” with regard to its properties. Some cases illustrating the claim come readily to mind. Consider Picasso's works. They may be legitimately categorized as French under one selective point of view, and as Spanish under another. Thus, whether they fall under one or the other is at least in part contingent upon a selective point of view (Gracia 2003, p. 65). Likewise, it is possible that certain philosophical works belong to Latin American philosophy under one selective point of view, but not under another. Thus, whether Latin American philosophy turns out to be thin or robust would then itself be contingent, at least in part, upon which selective point of view one were to adopt. In short, since ‘Latin American philosophy’ is relevantly analogous to ‘game’ or ‘funny,’ there are no necessary and sufficient conditions for individuating it; but a variety of selective criteria are possible. Each such criterion would be legitimate, provided that it captured a contextually determined, sufficient condition for being an instance of Latin American philosophy. Here is how the ethnic-philosophy theorist spells out his view on this matter

In a context in which all texts are in English and have American authors except for one, who is Uruguayan, the origin of the author could be sufficient to identify the text as belonging to Latin American philosophy. In a situation in which we have a series of Latin texts published in Spain, but one of which was written by an author who spent the greatest part of his life in Mexico, we could identify this text as Latin American. (Gracia 2003, p. 64)

One of the advantages of this account is its flexibility. For it entails that Latin American philosophy can accommodate whatever works meet an appropriate contextually determined condition, whether they be nonstandard works such as those of las Casas and Guttiérrez, or mainstream ones such as those of Newton da Costa or C. Ulises Moulines (the issue is discussed further below). The account is also capable of accommodating the fact that some works seem characteristically Latin American while others have a universal import. Furthermore, it allows one to classify, e.g., Kant's categorical imperative as German philosophy in a context where an author's place of origin is relevant, and as universal deontology in a context where birthplace is not relevant.

The main challenge for this view is how to avoid an anything-goes form of metaphilosophical relativism. Gracia (2003, p. 66) has sought to eliminate this threat by emphasizing that it is not only a contextually determined, selective point of view that matters for individuating ethnic philosophies. Reality also has a role, possibly in connection with history, which Gracia invokes to explain the nature of “philosophical texts.” On his view, these are “historical entities, the product of historical beings in particular times and places whose identities are linked to the context in which they were produced and which, for that reason, depend on them” (2003, p. 65). Metaphilosophical relativists can, however, welcome this appeal to history, though they would further insist that it is not only philosophical texts but also the truth of philosophical theories that's similarly contingent upon historical context. In fact, more than a mere logical possibility, relativism of this sort is by now a strong twentieth century tradition in the philosophy of science (see, e.g., Kuhn 1962, especially chapter 10).

Also a middle way between universalism and distinctivism is Moulines's 2010 position. Like Gracia's account, it vindicates only sufficient conditions for being an instance of Latin American philosophy. But unlike Gracia's account, Moulines's does not argue against the possibility of conditions that are both necessary and jointly sufficient. His positive proposal consists of four sufficient conditions that, on his view, a number of recent works meet– namely,

[T]hey are ‘universal’ in the sense that they use concepts and provide arguments that are intended to be universally valid; (2) they have been developed by Latin American authors; (3) they have been originally devised, at least partially, in some Latin American countries; and (4) they have found widespread interest both in and outside Latin America. (Moulines 2010, p. 460)

Satisfying (1) through (4) is considered sufficient for a work to be “an instantiation of ‘Latin American philosophy’” (Moulines 2010, p. 460). Moulines's sample of such instances includes several brands of theories and/or methods developed by contemporary Latin American philosophers such as paraconsistent logic (by Brazilian Newton da Costa and his collaborators), formal deontic logic (by Argentinean Carlos Alchourrón and Eugenio Bulygin), belief revision (in part by Alchourrón), scientific realism (by Argentinean Mario Bunge), a historical approach to the foundations of physics (by Chilean Roberto Torreti), and structuralist theory of science (by Venezuelan Moulines and his collaborators).

According to Moulines, conditions (1) through (4) express an understanding of Latin American philosophy that is “‘universalist’ as much as ‘distinctivist’” (2010, p. 460). A quick look at them suggests that (1) is relevant to universalism, (2) and (3) to distinctivism, and (4) to neither (it is neutral, though it bears on the external invisibility problem mentioned above). But note that(2) and (3) are distinctivist only in terms of ‘peculiarity’—which, as pointed out earlier, is the cheapest of the distinctive properties being debated.

The last mid-way position to be considered here was developed in Nuccetelli 2002 and 2009. It proposes a set of conditions that are taken to be both necessary and jointly sufficient for being an instance of a characteristically Latin American philosophy—namely, that any qualifying work must

  1. Contain philosophical arguments or methods that are sufficiently original, and
  2. Be sensitive to a Latin America context.

Any work satisfying (1) and (2) would count as characteristically Latin American in Nuccetelli's sense. She further contends that there is a robust body of philosophical work in Latin America that satisfies these conditions. It is mostly devoted to issues of moral, social, and political philosophy and includes the works of both, non-academic and academic philosophers. Thus construed, Latin American philosophy comes out as a branch of applied philosophy and its existence is consistent with that of universal philosophy—which is grounded in a variety of traditions of Western philosophy and devoted to problems that have universal import (e.g., knowledge and skepticism, the nature of consciousness, moral reasoning, and the existence and attributes of God). A Latin American philosopher may cultivate either universal philosophy or some branch of applied philosophy (including Latin American). From the time of the Founders to the present, there has been a long list of those who in fact did both.

3. The Issue of the Name

A final note on the issue of the name: Latin American philosophers have expressed a number of different preferences about what to call the field. The standard name preferred here has been ‘Latin American philosophy.’ But there are other options, depending on whether ‘thought’ takes the place of ‘philosophy,’ and/or ‘Iberoamerican,’ ‘Hispanic,’ ‘Hispanic-American’ or ‘Latino/a’ (among other qualifiers) takes the place of ‘Latin American.’ Keeping in mind that not all replacements would be semantically equivalent (more on this later), note that the rationale for using ‘thought’ in lieu of ‘philosophy’ is to do justice to the breadth of philosophical developments in Latin America—which, as we've seen, includes a vast corpus of non-standard, non-academic philosophical works. There is no common rationale for substituting any of the above qualifiers for ‘Latin American.’ But each proposed qualifier (including ‘Latin American’) inherits a problem faced by the proper name from which it derives. The problem may be semantic or pragmatic, where

  • A semantic problem arises for the use of a term in the absence of satisfactory criteria for determining its meaning or reference, and
  • A pragmatic problem arises for the use of a term in the presence of morally, politically, or socially unacceptable connotations associated with that term.

As an illustration, let's consider the term preferred here, ‘Latin American philosophy.’ Its qualifier derives from ‘Latin America,’ which appears to suffer from both types of problem. With few exceptions (e.g., Oliver 1998), those who have recently reflected on this term go beyond geography and politics to consider also factors such as culture and history in order to determine its meaning and reference. But it has proved difficult to find criteria that avoid semantic problems such as

  • Being too broad—i.e., sanctioning that ‘Latin America,’ when used literally and directly, refers to certain people and territories which are not ordinarily taken to be Latin American (e.g., the Quebecois).
  • Being too narrow—i.e., sanctioning that ‘Latin America,’ when used literally and directly, does not refer to peoples and territories that are ordinarily taken to be Latin American (e.g., the indigenous peoples of Latin America).
  • Being both too broad and too narrow—i.e., having both of the previous problems.

Jorge Gracia (2011a, p. 8) offers a way around these problems by taking ‘Latin America’ to refer to “everything in the Americas that is not American (U.S.) or Canadian.” This extensional, negative criterion gets things right provided it assumes a cultural understanding of ‘American (U.S.)’ and ‘Canadian.’ Without that assumption, the criterion would be both too narrow and too broad, for it would exclude Puerto Rico, which is politically part of the U.S., and include St. Pierre and Miquelon, which are French islands off the coast of Canada. But Gracia seems to have in mind the relevant cultural understanding of the term, since we are told (2011a, p. 8) that “those parts of the Caribbean and South America that were French, Dutch, or English colonies, such as Haiti and Jamaica” are not part of Latin America (i.e., culturally understood).

On the other hand, Rabossi (2003) explicitly provides a set of intensional criteria, which he appears to consider necessary and sufficient for falling under the reference of ‘Latin America.’ According to them, the term denotes certain “states” of North, Central, and South America by virtue of their sharing “a common political origin (Spanish/Portuguese conquest), a similar linguistic heritage (Spanish/Portuguese), a dominant religion (Catholicism), and comparable predicaments vis à vis local, regional, and international affairs” (Rabossi 2003, p. 507). Rabossi's criteria, which are more restrictive, avoid being too broad, but face the problem of being too narrow, which makes them unsatisfactory.

Guillermo Hurtado's (2010) reflection on the adequacy of the qualifier ‘Latin American’ illustrates the pragmatic problem mentioned above. First, Hurtado too takes ‘Latin America’ to denote a culturally specific region of the Americas, one individuated by appeal to language: viz., being a region of the Americas that mostly speaks Spanish, Portuguese or French. Perhaps aware of the problem of being too broad, Hurtado attempts to avoid it by excluding Quebec from the designation of ‘Latin America’ on the seemingly ad hoc ground that the region is surrounded by mostly ‘Anglo-Saxon’ Canada. In any case, his account of ‘Latin American’ and ‘the Latin American’ appears to point to a pragmatic problem arising from some facts about those terms' introduction into public discourse. According to Hurtado, there is historical evidence that they were introduced into public discourse in the late nineteenth century by the French, who did so in order to advance their national interest in dealing with the Latin and Catholic nations of the Americas (as opposed to the Protestant and ‘Anglo-Saxon’ nations). Once these terms had caught on in thought and language, their role in discourse was unaffected by the defeat of the French in the region, except for the fact that ‘Latin America’ came instead to be just “an ideal of union among the nations that compose it” (Hurtado 2010, p. 11, my translation and emphasis). At the end of the day, however, Hurtado continues to use these terms without explaining why we should do so, given that, according to his own story, they were introduced for colonialist purposes—and therefore face the pragmatic problem.[3] In addition, given this account, it would seem that those terms now refer to nothing objective at all.

Be that as it may, let's now consider some of the other options. ‘Iberoamerican’ and ‘Hispanic American’ are the closest relatives of ‘Latin American.’ Neither of these alternatives is problem free, since they inherit the pragmatic problem facing the nouns from whence they derive, ‘Iberia’ and ‘Hispania.’ Each of these ancient proper names designates the European peninsula today divided into Spain and Portugal. Thus, taken literally, each has connotations unacceptable to the descendants of the victims of these countries' colonial policies in the Americas.

On the other hand, ‘Hispanic philosophy’ and ‘Latino/a philosophy’ are more recent terms whose semantic features are not yet fully settled by usage. Roughly, ‘Hispanic philosophy’ may include Iberian philosophy too (Gracia 2000), while ‘Latino/a philosophy’ is the philosophy of or about the descendants of Latin Americans abroad, especially in the United States (Gracia 2011b). As noted above in the cases of ‘Iberoamerican’ and ‘Hispanic American,’ both ‘Hispanic’ and ‘Latino/a’ also appear to have inherited the pragmatic problem for the proper nouns from which each derives (it should now be obvious to the reader what those problems are).

But it may be that no such pragmatic problem matters after all for justifying the current use of ‘Latin American’ or some of the alternative terms. That would be so if the reference of the proper name from which any such term derives is direct, in the sense that it is not mediated by the term's meaning.[4] On this account, the justification for using the term needs only appeal to linguistic convention.

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