Notes to The Limits of Law

1. For other practical problems of enforcement, see Walker 1987, pp. 148-152.

2. Some argue that the Indianapolis Ordinance defining pornography as ‘the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women whether in pictures or words’ might capture and proscribe WB Yeats’ ‘Leda and the Swan’ and Titian's ‘Danae’. Dworkin 1996 (a), p. 217, Dworkin 1996 (b) p. 219).

3. Mill famously defines Utility thus: ‘The creed which holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness.’ (Mill 1993, p. 7). John Gray argues, in the course of his defence of Millian Liberty, that one should not interpret this famous sentence without also considering Mill's other writings: in particular, and contrary to appearances, it should not be taken as a straightforward action-guiding principle (Gray 1996 p. 2 et seq). I say a little more about this later on in the text.

4. Raz allows that some offensive behaviour can be by its nature harmful and therefore a candidate for coercion on that basis, but he disallows offence as an independently valid ground. Judith Thomson suggests that Feinberg might be better off taking a similar line (Thomson 1986). Simester and Von Hirsch have argued, like Feinberg, for the independent validity of the offence principle, but suggest significant changes to Feinberg's position (Simester and Von Hirsch, 2002).

5. The harm principle, or something close to it, though generally considered a liberal principle par excellence, is often proposed from different perspectives. Robert Adams has what would count in Hart's terminology as a revelation-based picture of morality, proposing a very subtle version of the ‘divine command’ theory of morality. From that perspective he supports something close to the harm principle citing Raz's arguments with approval, (Adams, 1999, pp. 318-350). John Finnis, writing in the Natural Law tradition, also claims that Aquinas argued for a principle that was not ‘readily distinguishable’ from Mill's harm principle’ (Finnis 1998, p. 228). Finnis reads Aquinas as asserting that ‘those vices of disposition and conduct which have no sufficient relationship, direct or indirect to justice and peace are not concerns of government or law’ (Finnis 1998, p. 228).

6. ‘Pennant makes Birmingham comeback’, BBC Sport, published 2 April, 2005. [Reprint available online]

7. Though even here one might doubt that imprisonment necessarily leaves someone without an adequate range of valuable options. Consider say the imprisonment of someone constantly found guilty of serious violent public order offences on the closing of pubs on Friday and Saturday nights. Imagine the custodial sentence was for a period of one year but restricted every week to the period from Friday evening to Sunday morning, with his release to pursue work, family and other interests every Sunday morning to Friday evening. Such a sentence would doubtless cause considerable disruption, but it would not necessarily leave the part-time prisoner without an adequate range of valuable options.

8. The analogy drawn here to taxation is not perfect in all cases. Criminal fines sometimes get stiffer with repeat offences. I am grateful to the editors for this point.

9. Cf. the effect on autonomy of human temptations, obsessions and compulsions.

10. Raz distinguishes the ‘exclusion of ideals’ argument from the ‘neutrality’ argument in (Raz 1986).

11. These arguments along with similar arguments from Rawls are criticized in Raz, 1995 (in an essay first published in 1990). Nagel has in part accepted these arguments in Nagel 1991, p. 163. See also the discussion in Barry 1995, pp.177-183. Barry argues that ‘nobody is to be allowed to assert the superiority of his own conception of the good over those of other people as a reason for building into the framework for social cooperation special advantages for it.’ (Barry 1995, p. 160). ‘What?’, one might ask, ‘not even when the view is true and the others false?’ Barry's response to this is sceptical of the possibility of moral certainty, which he argues would be necessary to license the direct appeal to truth on the matters of the good.

12. In fact the drawing of an analogy between the regulation of slavery and abortion is a popular move in Natural Law writing on the limits of the law. See e.g. Finnis 2000, p. 89.

13. According to Jean Hampton: ‘The search by Rawls and Nagel for a neutral but genuinely legitimating form of liberalism is quixotic.’ (Hampton 1993, p.310).

Copyright © 2006 by
John Stanton-Ife <>

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