Supplement to David Lewis's Metaphysics

Fundamental Entities

There are two obvious routes Lewis could have taken to a view according to which some particulars are most fundamental.

First route: Lewis holds that all entities, of whatever ontological category, can stand in mereological relations. Thus, a chair is composed of its atoms; it has each atom as a part; two rooms might overlap by having one wall as a common part, etc. He further holds that the relation of parthood is antisymmetric: x is part of y and y is a part of x only if x = y. That allows for a definition of a simple: an entity that has no other entities (i.e., entities not identical to it) as parts. Lewis could then hold that the most “fundamental” particulars are exactly those particulars that are simples. More generally, a particular x might count as more fundamental than particular y if x is part of y but y is not part of x. (But of course that doesn't cover the case of particulars, neither of which is part of the other.)

Second route: Suppose Lewis held that some properties/relations are most fundamental (something he seemed inclined to believe likely of our world, albeit only contingently). Then he could hold that the most fundamental particulars are exactly those that instantiate (or perhaps: are capable of instantiating) the most fundamental properties and relations.

On either approach, a commitment to fundamental particulars will, for Lewis, have to remain at least somewhat tentative. For suppose it turned out that our world is infinitely complex: molecules are composed of atoms, which are composed of protons, neutrons, and electrons, which are composed of quarks, which are composed of strings, which are composed of … with no end. And suppose that at each level, the physical properties instantiated by particulars at that level are more fundamental than those instantiated by particulars at higher levels. Then on neither criterion will it be the case that they are most fundamental particulars. (Nor will there be most fundamental properties and relations.)

More importantly, it's not clear that there is any work to be done within Lewis's system by a notion of a fundamental particular. He has the distinction between more and less natural properties/relations. He has the mereological distinction between part and whole. Again and again, in the accounts he offers of metaphysically interesting topics (laws of nature, causation, persistence through time, etc.), he makes free use of these distinctions. But appealing to the distinction between more and less fundamental entities doesn't look like it will enhance his ability to carry out these projects.

Having said all that, there are some interesting questions in the vicinity that Lewis does not address, having to do with how the mereological hierarchy and the metaphysical hierarchy of properties and relations line up with each other. For example, could it be that a composite particular (a particular that has some other particulars as proper parts) instantiates some perfectly natural property? More generally, could it be that some composite particular instantiates properties more natural than any properties instantiated by its parts? Could a simple particular be extended in space? I know of no extended discussion Lewis gives to any of these questions. But it does seem to me that his metaphysical work presupposes a negative answer, in each case.

Copyright © 2010 by
Ned Hall <ehall@fas.harvard.edu>

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