Supplement to David Lewis's Metaphysics

The Contingency of Humean Supervenience

As soon as one recognizes that there could be non-spatiotemporal, perfectly natural relations—so that, if there are none in the actual world, then that is a contingent fact—one must recognize that HS (as stated in §5) is false, and can only be resuscitated in a weaker form. Perhaps this one: Among worlds in which are instantiated no perfectly natural relations not actually instantiated, no two worlds differ with respect to what is true without differing with respect to the geometrical arrangement of spacetime points, or with respect to which perfectly natural properties are instantiated at those points. (Observe that this form incorporates the thesis that the only actual perfectly natural relations are spatiotemporal ones.) That makes HS a contingent thesis, as no doubt it should be. But Lewis sees a second, quite different reason for taking HS to be contingent. It is, I think, a poor reason; but it deserves some scrutiny nonetheless. Here is what Lewis says:

Humean Supervenience is meant to be contingent: it says that among worlds like ours, no two differ without difference in the arrangement of qualities. But when is a world like ours? I used to say: when it's a world of the “inner sphere”, free of fundamental properties or relations that are alien to our world. Sally Haslanger (forthcoming [1994]) has shown that this answer probably won't do. One lesson of the Armstrong (1980) spinning sphere (also known as the Kripke spinning disk) is that one way to get a difference between worlds with the exact same arrangement of local qualities is to have things that are bilocated in spacetime. Take two worlds containing spheres of homogeneous matter, unlike the particulate matter of our world; in one world the sphere spins and in the other it doesn't; but the arrangement of local qualities is just the same. These are worlds in which things persist through time not by consisting of distinct temporal parts, but rather by bilocation in spacetime: persisting things are wholly present in their entirety at different times. The difference between the spinning and the stationary spheres is a difference in the pattern of bilocation. No worries for Humean Supervenience, so I thought: I believe that ours is a temporal-parts-world, therefore neither of the worlds in the story is a world like ours. But why assume that things that indulge in bilocation must differ in their fundamental nature from things that don't? Why think that if ours is a temporal-parts-world, then otherworldly bilocated things must have properties alien to our world? No good reason, I fear. Haslanger's point seems well taken. I still want to insist that if ours is a temporal-parts-world, then bilocation-worlds don't count as “worlds like ours”, but I think I must abandon my former reason why not. (1994, pp. 474–475)

Lewis's reasoning here involves a bizarre failure of nerve. On inspection, it is quite clear that he has perfectly good metaphysical and methodological grounds for resisting the argument that worries him, thereby preserving the clean statement of HS as a contingent thesis. To see why this is so—and to achieve, thereby, a little more insight into the resources provided by Lewis's conception of fundamental ontology—let us begin by distinguishing two different views one might have about spacetime and its contents (see

Supplement on spacetime points

for more discussion).

On a monist view, the only fundamental entities there are are spacetime points—simple particulars that are called “space-time points” simply because they instantiate spatiotemporal relations. The world is the way it is, then, in virtue of the spatiotemporal relations instantiated by the simple particulars that constitute it, together with the monadic, perfectly natural properties these particulars also instantiate. (And, perhaps, together with other, non-spatiotemporal relations that they instantiate.) On a rival, “dualist” conception, there are two sorts of fundamental entities: simple particulars that instantiate spatiotemporal relations (and are therefore to be called “spacetime points”); and simple particulars that do not instantiate spatiotemporal relations, but do bear a different, perfectly natural relation of “occupancy” to spacetime points (call these “occupants”). The world is the way it is in virtue of the spatiotemporal relations instantiated by the spacetime points, together with their pattern of occupancy by the occupants, together with the pattern of instantiation of perfectly natural monadic properties by these occupants. (A variant would allow the spacetime points themselves to also instantiate perfectly natural properties; we'll set this aside.)

Suppose you take the second, dualist view. Then the difference between a world in which everything persists through time by consisting of distinct temporal parts, and a world in which at least some things persist through time by being “wholly present” at different moments of time, essentially boils down to this: In the first kind of world, each occupant bears the occupancy relation to just one spacetime point. In the second kind of world, this is not the case: some occupants “occupy” distinct spacetime points, located at different times. Now here is the crucial point: You can have no good reason to deny that worlds of the second type are at least metaphysically possible. For what could stand in the way of this? Are we to suppose that there is something about the metaphysical nature of the “occupancy” relation that guarantees that, if one particular X bears it to another particular Y, then that is the only particular X bears it to? What could that be? What's more, the metaphysical possibility granted, the epistemic is not far behind: for what could count as empirical evidence that our world is not of the second kind?

Now, you could take a mixed view, according to which monism and dualism are both contingent claims. In some worlds, there are just spacetime points (i.e., bearers of spatiotemporal relations), which also, in those worlds, instantiate perfectly natural monadic properties. In other worlds, there are spacetime points and occupiers thereof. But the conclusions of the last paragraph still stand: you should hold that there are possible worlds in which at least some things persist through time by being wholly present at different times, and you should admit that you have no special reason for doubting the ours is such a world.

As an aside, there is clear textual evidence that Lewis takes the mixed view:

I don't really mean to say that no two possible worlds whatsoever differ in any way without differing in their arrangements of qualities. For I concede that Humean supervenience is at best a contingent truth. Two worlds might indeed differ only in unHumean ways, if one or both of them is a world where Humean supervenience fails. Perhaps there might be extra, irreducible external relations, besides spatiotemporal ones; there might be emergent natural properties of more-than-point-sized things; there might be things that endure identically through time or space, and trace out loci that cut across all lines of qualitative continuity. It is not, alas, unintelligible that there might be suchlike rubbish. Some worlds have it. And when they do, it can make differences between worlds even if they match perfectly in their arrangements of qualities. (1986a, p. x; italics added)

Here is what I take to be the upshot of our discussion so far: If you believe in a fundamental, perfectly natural relation of occupancy, then you already have reason enough to accept the conclusion of Haslanger's argument; thought experiments concerning spinning spheres add nothing. What is of real interest, then, is whether her argument presents any sort of challenge to a philosopher who—unlike, alas, Lewis—resolutely insists on monism as a necessary truth. (In case it's not clear, this is exactly the view I think Lewis should have espoused.)

I do not think it does. To see this, let's unpack the troublesome argument.

The first step is to establish—presumably, via an appeal to modal intuitions—that there are possible worlds containing homogeneous matter. Some authors (e.g., Callendar 2001) dispute this step, but I won't. The next step is to argue that two such worlds could differ only in that a sphere is spinning in one of them but motionless in the other. The final step is to argue that this difference must consist in different patterns of bilocation. I think the game has been given up at the second step, and will focus my attention there.

We have a world containing homogeneous matter. Presumably, this matter can be in motion, including rotational motion. We should now ask—before considering the two worlds that seem to cause the trouble—whether there is any way for HS to accommodate motion of homogeneous matter. And of course there is. But—crucially—the HS-friendly story of what it is for homogeneous matter to be in motion will necessarily make reference to the fundamental laws of nature for the given world, either directly or via suitably chosen counterfactuals. For example, what it is for a perfectly symmetrical sphere to be rotating might consist, in part, in the truth of such counterfactuals as “were a dot painted on the sphere at time t, the location of the dot at time t′ would be different in such-and-such a way”. The details don't matter for present purposes; all that is important is that, provided an acceptable, HS-friendly account of laws of nature is available (see the companion article on Lewis's applied metaphysics), and provided there is a suitable account of how laws fix truth-values for counterfactuals, there will be no special difficulty in distinguishing, within a world, between rotating and non-rotating spheres. The key move—which will receive much more scrutiny in the companion article, when we turn to Lewis's account of laws of nature—is to view facts about motion of matter not as part of the base-level facts about the world which it is the job of laws of nature to govern[10], but rather as being in part facts about the nomological structure of the world itself.

That may seem an odd perspective to take on motion. So be it; it's a perspective the defender of HS is stuck with anyway. For consider a nice, Newtonian world of point-particles, with nary a speck of homogeneous matter to be found. What is it, according to Lewis, for a particle in such a world to be moving (relative to a specified frame, say)? More exactly, what makes it the case that there is a moving particle, as opposed to its being the case that there is a spatiotemporally contiguous succession of points that just happen all to be occupied? It is, very roughly, for the pattern of occupation of spacetime points in the future to counterfactually depend on the pattern of occupation in the past in a certain way. And these patterns of counterfactual dependence will themselves be fixed by the laws.

And now, finally, it must be remembered that a HS-friendly account of laws of nature will insist that the laws of nature in the two worlds in question—the one with the spinning sphere and the one with the motionless sphere—must be exactly the same. And so, since facts about motion must be grounded in these laws, there is no difference in the motion of the spheres, after all. There cannot be.

Intuition will rebel, of course. And one can easily imagine words such as the following, aimed at helping the rebellion along: “Look, you agree that there can be a single world—call it w—containing both a spinning sphere and a stationary sphere. So now just remove the spinning sphere. Along with it, remove anything else (other than the stationary sphere) that might serve as a landmark. That gives you world w1. Go back to w, and remove the stationary sphere, along with any landmarks; that gives you w2. Since we've removed the landmarks, we cannot say that the spheres in w1 and w2 are in different locations (so that we have a difference in the local arrangement of qualities, after all). So, according to HS, they must be exactly the same. But they're not: in one the sphere is rotating; in the other it isn't.”

The proper response is to ask whether it has been granted that facts about motion just are a certain kind of nomological fact. If not, then the dispute really lies elsewhere—for example, our interlocutor must hold that the defender of HS has already made a mistake, in his description of a Newtonian particle world. But if so, then the argument involves a tacit assumption that one can hold fixed the laws of nature, while moving from w to w1 and w2. That may be true, on a conception of laws of nature that holds that they are something more than mere patterns in the non-modal phenomena. But that is not a conception the defender of HS can endorse. And so again, the real dispute lies elsewhere. The idea that the critic of HS gets some special traction from the spinning sphere argument is simply confused. Had Lewis seen this, he could have said that the argument is no stronger than the various direct attacks to be found in the literature on his HS-friendly account of laws of nature. We will leave consideration of those attacks for the companion article; for now, the important lesson is that the only good reason we have seen so far to reject HS in its strong form consists in the possibility that nature might admit more perfectly natural relations than the purely spatiotemporal.

Copyright © 2010 by
Ned Hall <>

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