Notes to Location and Mereology

1. Different authors, and different time-slices of the same author, use different phrases to express the given relation.

  • Moore (1953: 356–7), van Inwagen (1990b: 10), Lewis (1991: 32; 1999: 194, 226–7), Sattig (2006), McDaniel (2007a,b), and Gilmore (2007) all use ‘occupies’.
  • Thomson (1983), Hudson (2001), Hawthorne (2006: 103–4), Uzquiano (2006), Gilmore (2006; 2009), and Eddon (2010) use ‘exactly occupies’.
  • Lewis (1999: 11), Gilmore (2002; 2003), and Gibson and Pooley (2006) all use ‘is wholly present at’.
  • Casati and Varzi (1999), Bittner, Donnelly, and Smith (2004), and Parsons (2007) use ‘is exactly located at’.
  • Hawthorne (2008: 276) and Kleinschmidt (2011) use ‘is wholly located at’.
  • Balashov (2010), Donnelly (2010), and Saucedo (2011) use ‘is located at’.

Admittedly, there is some controversy as to whether all these authors have exact location in mind. For example, Parsons (2007: 219–20) denies that Gilmore's ‘exactly occupies’ expresses exact location.

2. Though it should be noted that it is not entirely clear whether Schaffer would endorse H1–H8 when they are interpreted as quantifying over all entities unrestrictedly. Perhaps he holds that H1–H8 are true only when the variables are interpreted as ranging over concrete material objects. (As we shall see, there are potential counterexamples to some of these principles involving entities that seem not to be material objects, such as universals and tropes.)

3. This principle, minus the necessity operator, is endorsed in Casati and Varzi (1999) and labeled ‘Weak Expansivity’ by Parsons (2007).

4. Uzquiano (2006: 443) formulates principles very similar to (11) and (12) and notes that they are especially uncontroversial.

5. Interestingly, Lewis considers a similar argument against immanent universals (viz., that if they existed, they would violate the transitivity of co-location) and rejects it very casually: “by occurring repeatedly, universals defy intuitive principles. But this is no damaging objection, since plainly the intuitions were made for particulars” (1999: 11). Why not reject his argument against states of affairs on similar grounds? (One might say: yes, states of affairs violate the uniqueness of composition, but that is no damaging objection, since plainly that principle holds only for material objects.) See Donnelly (2011a) for a critical discussion of arguments that, in her terms, ‘use mereological principles to support metaphysics’.

6. Though see Bird (2007) for a defense of the view that such laws are metaphysically necessary.

7. Supersubstantivalism is defended by Sider (2001), Skow (2005), and Schaffer (2009). Schaffer offers a variety of arguments for it, including arguments from parsimony, from Mereological Harmony, from General Relativity, and from Quantum Field Theory.

8. (48) is a bit stronger than McDaniel's NNC. It needs to be to yield the possibility of extended simples. Using just NNC, McDaniel can get only the weaker, disjunctive conclusion that: either it's possible for there to be a simple object exactly located at a complex region or it's possible for there to be a complex object exactly located at a simple region.

9. The literature on universals and their relation to space and spacetime is very large. A small sample of post-19th century work might include Russell (1956), Moore (1966: 77–86), Armstrong (1989), Bigelow (1988), Newman (1992, 2002), Zimmerman (1997), MacBride (1998), O'Leary-Hawthorne and Cover (1998), Paul (2002), Ehring (2002; 2004), and Gilmore (2003).

10. For more rigorous definitions, see Sider (2001: 59), Gibson and Pooley (2006: 163), Parsons (2007), Noonan (2009), Balashov (2010: 73), and Kleinschmidt (2011).

11. Locational endurantism is endorsed by van Inwagen (1990a and 1990b), Bitter, Donnelly and Smith (2004), and Sattig (2006), and it is discussed sympathetically in Hawthorne (2006, 2008). Lewis (1999: 227) claims that there are possible worlds at which things endure via multilocation. Gilmore (2006) presents a relativity-based argument against locational endurantism. Gibson and Pooley defend locational endurantism against Gilmore's argument and others, though they do not positively endorse the view. Calosi (2010b: xi–xvi) presents a different relativity-based argument against locational endurantism. Gilmore (2007) presents a time-travel based argument in favor of locational endurantism; Eagle (2010a) responds; Gilmore (2010) and Eagle (2010b) are rejoinders. Rychter (2011) offers a different response to Gilmore (2007). Balashov (2010) mounts a series of detailed relativity-based arguments against locational endurantism. Gilmore (2009), Donnelly (2010), and Kleinschmidt (2011) discuss the ways in which standard mereology would need to be modified if locational endurantism were true. Hofweber and Velleman (2011) deny the intelligibility of locational endurantism.

12. For further relevant discussion see, Sider (2001: 101–109), who argues that backward time travel poses problems for endurantism, and Simon (2005), who replies. Effingham (2011) argues that backward time travel poses problems for standard definitions of ‘temporal part’.

13. For more on relativizing responses to the traditional problem of change, see Haslanger (2003), Hawley (2010), and Carroll (2011), who focuses on time travel. G. E. Moore (1953: 356) discusses a view according to which colors are multilocated and bear incompatible ‘shape-relations’ to different regions. Ehring (2002) develops a variant of the problem of change that involves incompatible spatial relations rather than incompatible intrinsic properties. He argues that it applies to entities (such as immanent universals) that are capable of both multilocation and co-location. In response to Ehring, Gilmore (2003) develops a relativizing approach that treats apparently n-place spatial relations as being 2n-place, with n slots for spatially related things and another n slots for locations of those things. Calosi (2010b) suggests that the problem of change for multilocated objects becomes especially serious in the context of Minkowski spacetime.

Copyright © 2014 by
Cody Gilmore <csgilmore@ucdavis.edu>

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