Notes to The Logic of Conditionals

1. See Ramsey (1990), pp. 154-55.

2. And the corresponding notion of acceptance cannot be reduced to belief in the truth of any proposition.

3. See Gärdenfors (1988) chapters 1 to 5, and Alchourrón, Gärdenfors, and Makinson (1985).

4. Gärdenfors (1987) explores several variations of (GRT), but none of them seems to offer a better representation of Ramsey's intuitions.

5. In this article he explores various possible definitions of the conditional in this setting. He treats the conditional as a relativized modal [a]b and he also considers its dual, (a)b, which allows for a rich representational framework. A complete characterization of the system B of Burgess is presented. Girard also considers the characterization of B presented here (below, in terms of set selection functions) and compares it with his own account.

6. Of course the proposition ‘|a|’ should be indexed by the model M and written |a|M. The index given by the model of reference is here dropped for simplicity. When needed we will make it explicit.

7. A sentence a is entertainable in a model M if and only if |a|M ∩ $i ≠ ∅.

8. Two additional salient examples of minimal change theories are the theories of Veltman (1985) and Kratzer (1981). We refer the reader to Cross and Nute (2001) for a review of these theories.

9. Theories that adopt the modified informal interpretation of the selection function are called in small change theories by Cross and Nute (2001). The idea of selecting he a-worlds that are sufficiently similar to i to assess the truth value of a conditional a > b was historically proposed by Aqvist (1973).

10. Cross and Nute (2001) call these theories maximal change theories. We prefer to use a different terminology. The selected worlds can differ maximally from the world of reference as long as they respect some local similarity constraints, but they do not need to differ maximally from the world of reference, regarding non-local features. The important issue is that similarity is restricted to a set of local features, while the other details are irrelevant for comparisons.

11. Following notation and presentation used in Cross and Nute (2001).

12. But note that p. 189 of McGee (1994) mistakenly reverses the direction of the conditional and thus puts the nonzero probability condition on the consequent instead of the antecedent.

13. See Hájek and Hall (1994) for a detailed assessment of tenability results. In particular notice that there is an existential and doxastic interpretation of CCCP that might have some credibility, namely that for each P that could represent an agent's belief system, there is some CCCP-conditional.

14. Skyrms (1994) compares Adams's theory of conditionals with different probabilistic models proposed by Skyrms. A more mature theory is presented in Skyrms (1998).

15. Conditional Coherence does not capture, nevertheless, important aspects of De Finetti's ideas about primitive conditional probabilities. Unlike probabilists, De Finetti uses a primitively given notion of information in order to define conditional probability. Such notion of information set does not admit, in his construction, a probabilistic account. Some repercussions of this aspect of De Finetti's notion will be discussed below.

16. Perhaps the most poignant result is presented in Seidenfeld and Kadane (1984), where it is shown that each finitely additive probability fails to have the property that De Finetti called conglomerability in some denumerable partition. See also Dubins (1975).

17. If E1, E2, … is a countable sequence of pairwise disjoint sets in the probabilistic space, the measure of the union of all the events Ei is equal to the sum of the measures of each Ei.

18. Notice that this is just an instance (using propositions rather than sentences) of the previously stated axiom (5).

19. The term ‘expectation’ is not decision-theoretically motivated. Its motivation comes from the field of non-monotonic logic, where ‘expectation’ models of defeasible reasoning are usual. See Arló-Costa (2001) for details.

20. Notice that CA is stronger than the simpler assumption that P(X|U) is either a countably additive measure or has constant value 1.

21. An account of conditional probability compatible with our model is the one offered by Lester Dubins (1975). See Seidenfeld, Schervish, and Kadane (2001) for an overview of the interest and limitations of finitely additive measures.

22. The Generalized Horn Flat patterns have the following form: (a1 > b1), …, (an > bn) ⊢ (a > b); where negations are allowed in the left hand side of the pattern and where the letters ai, a, etc only admit conditional-free instances.

23. We remind the reader that ‘A’ here stands for the proposition expressed by the letter ‘a’.

24. To visualize counterexamples consider the VC, VW or V possible-worlds models where the closest A-worlds to any ¬A- and B-world contain at least an A- and ¬B-world.

25. A fourth solution proposed by Rott (1991) and Cross (1990) consists in making the underlying notion of consequence non-monotonic. Some models of this sort are nevertheless known to lead to triviality as the result of Makinson (1990) indicates, even when Makinson's result does not exactly bear on on the suggestion endorsed by Rott and Cross. The challenge to (GRT) presented in Theorem 3 above cannot be solved by the adoption of models where the monotonicity of the underlying notion of consequence is dropped.

26. For a similar proposal in the probabilistic setting see Skyrms (1987).

27. This property is, as we saw, derivable from (GRT). It plays a crucial role in proving Theorem 4.

Copyright © 2007 by
Horacio Arlo-Costa

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