#### Supplement to Deontic Logic

## Challenges in Defining Deontic Logic

Defining a discipline or area within one is often difficult. Deontic
logic is no exception. Standard characterizations of deontic logic are
arguably either too narrow or too wide. Deontic logic is often glossed
as the logic of obligation, permission, and prohibition, but this is
too narrow. For example, it would exclude a logic of supererogation as
well as any non-reductive logic for legal notions like claims,
liberties, powers, and immunities from falling within deontic
logic. On the other hand, we might say that deontic logic is that
branch of symbolic logic concerned with the logic of normative
expressions: a systematic study of the contribution these expressions
make to what follows from what. This is better in that it does not
appear to be too exclusive, but it is arguably too broad, since
deontic logic is not traditionally concerned with the contribution of
every sort of normative expression. For example,
“credible” and “dubious” are normative
expressions, as are “rational” and “prudent”
but these two pairs are not normally construed as within the purview
of deontic logic (as opposed to say epistemic logic, and rational
choice theory, respectively). Nor would it be enough to simply say
that the normative notions of deontic logic are always practical,
since the operator “it ought to be the case that,” perhaps
the most studied operator in deontic logic, appears to have no greater
intrinsic link to practicality than does “credible” or
“dubious.” The following seem to be without practical
import: “It ought to be the case that early humans did not
exterminate
Neanderthals.”^{[1]}
Perhaps a more refined link to practicality is what separates deontic
logic from epistemic logic, but this doesn't help distinguish it from
rational choice theory, the former being concerned with collective
practical issues as well as individual ones. Perhaps there is no
non-ad hoc or principled division between deontic logic and distinct
formal disciplines focused on the logic of other normative
expressions, such as epistemic logic and rational choice theory. These
are interesting and largely unstudied meta-philosophical issues that
we cannot settle here. Instead we have defined deontic logic
contextually and provisionally.

Return to Deontic Logic.