Supplement to Deontic Logic

Collapse of Conflicts into Impossible Obligations

We saw above that Kant's Law, when represented as OBp → ◊p, is a theorem of KTd. If we interpret possibility here as practical possibility, then as the indebtedness example above suggests, it is far from evident that it is in fact true. However, a weaker claim than that of Kant's Law is that something cannot be obligatory unless it is at least logically possible. In SDL, this might be expressed by the rule:

If ⊢ ~p then ⊢ ~OBp.

This is derivable in SDL, since if ⊢ ~p, then ⊢ OB~p by OB-NEC, and then by OB-NC, we get ⊢ ~OBp. Claiming that Romeo is obligated to square the circle because he solemnly promised Juliet to do so is less convincing as an objection than the earlier financial indebtedness case. So SDL is somewhat better insulated from this sort of objection, and, as we noted earlier, we are confining ourselves here to theories that endorse OB-OD (i.e., ⊢ ~OB⊥).[1]

However, this points to another puzzle for SDL. The rule above is equivalent to ⊢ OB-OD in any system with OB-RE, and in fact, in the context of SDL, these are both equivalent to OB-NC. That is, we could replace the latter axiom with either of the former rules for a system equivalent to SDL. In particular, in any system with K and RM, (OBp & OB~p) ↔ OB⊥ is a theorem.[2] But it seems odd that there is no distinction between a contradiction being obligatory, and having two distinct conflicting obligations. It seems that one can have a conflict of obligations without it being obligatory that some logically impossible state of affairs obtains. A distinction seems to be lost here. Separating OB-NC from OB-D is now quite routine in conflict-allowing deontic logics.

Some early discussions and attempted solutions to the last two problems can be found in Chellas 1980 and Schotch and Jennings 1981, both of whom use non-normal modal logics for deontic logic.[3] Brown 1996a uses a similar approach to Chellas' for modeling conflicting obligations, but with the addition of an ordering relation on obligations to model the relative stringency of obligations, thus moving in the direction of a model addressing Plato's Dilemma as well.

Return to Deontic Logic.

Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <>

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