Supplement to Deontic Logic

Deontic Complements

One current issue in dispute is whether or not deontic operators call for agential complements or not. We outline the issue loosely here. Consider:

Libertarian Deontic Complement Thesis (LDCT): Any of the fundamental five deontic operators followed by any sentential complement is well-formed.

Let an LDCT system be any classical sentential modal logic containing any of the above deontic operators (but at least OB) that satisfies LDCT. In contrast, consider the

Strict Deontic Complement Thesis (SDCT): Each fundamental deontic status must be followed immediately by an operator ascribing agency to an agent (here, by “BA”) to be well-formed.

A strict omission is now a wff of the form RFp (i.e., BA~BAp). “~BAp” is just a non-action. Strict deontic omissions are deontic operators immediately followed by strict omissions.

Recall that if we substitute “BAp” for “p” in the equivalences associated with the Traditional Definitional Scheme, we get:

OPBAp ↔ ~OBBAp & ~OB~BAp

The instances above are all consistent with LDCT, but not SDCT. Essentially, non-action statements would have to be replaced by strict omissions. Compare the left and right versions below:

OMBAp ↔ ~OBBAp (original is fine per SDCT)

Belnap 2001 provisionally defends SDCT. McNamara 2004a raises doubts about SDCT. He notes that we are sometimes obligated to be a certain way (e.g., to be in our office), and furthermore, it is plausible to think that agential obligations reduce to this form—to obligations to be the agents of states of affairs, so that obligations to be a certain way are analytically prior to agential obligations.

Return to Deontic Logic.

Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <>

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