Supplement to Deontic Logic

Inaction versus Refraining/Forebearing

Another interesting operator can be defined via a condition involving embedding of “BA”:

RFp =df BA~BAp.

This expresses a widely endorsed analysis of refraining (or “forebearing”)[1]. In quasi-English, it is a case of Refraining by our agent that p if and only if our agent brings it about that she does not bring it about that p. The importance of this in agency theory is based on the assumption that refraining from doing something is distinct from simply not doing something. In the current agential framework, the importance of the above is reflected in the denial of this claim:

*: ~BAp → RFp.

No agent brings about logical truths, but neither does an agent bring it about by (what she does do) that she doesn't bring about such logical truths. It has nothing to do with what she does. That * can't hold is easily proven given any consistent system with BA-RE and BA-NO.[2] So refraining from p is not equivalent to merely not bringing about p. Whether or not it is of great importance in deontic logic itself is a more controversial matter. It would hinge on matters like whether or not there is a difference between being obligated to not bring it about that p and being obligated to bring it about that you don't bring it about that p. For example, if it is true that the only things it can be obligatory for me to not bring about are things I can only not bring about by what I do bring about instead, then it would seem that I am obligated to not bring about p iff I am obligated to bring it about by what I do do that I do not bring it about that p. In this case, I would be obligated too not bring p about iff I am also obligated to bring it about that I don't bring it about that p.

An alternative account sometimes given of refraining is that of inaction coupled with ability: to refrain from bringing it about that p is to be able to bring it about that p and to not bring it about that p (von Wright 1963, on “forebearance”). This might be expressed as follows:

RFp =df ~BAp & ABp,

where “AB” is interpreted as an agential ability operator, perhaps a compound operator of the broad form “◊BAp,” with “◊” suitably constrained (e.g., as what is now still possible or still possible relative to our agent). In some frameworks, the two proposed analysans of RF are provably equivalent (e.g., Horty 2001).[3] Informally one might argue that if I am able to bring it about that p and don't, then I don't bring it about that p by whatever it is that I do bring about, and so I refrain per the first analysis; and if I truly bring it about by what I do that I don't bring it about that p, then I must have been able to bring it about that p even though I didn't, so I refrain per the second analysis.

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Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <paulmunh@gmail.com>

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