Supplement to Deontic Logic

Kripke-Style Semantics for SDL

We define the frames (structures) for modeling SDL as follows:

F is an Kripke-SDL (or KD) Frame: F = <W,A> such that:
  1. W is a non-empty set
  2. A is a subset of W × W
  3. A is serial: ∀ijAij.

A model can be defined in the usual way, allowing us to then define truth at a world in a model for all sentences of SDL (and SDL+):

M is an Kripke-SDL Model: M = <F,V>, where F is an SDL Frame, <W,A>, and V is an assignment on F: V is a function from the propositional variables to various subsets of W (the “truth sets’ for the variables—the worlds where the variables are true for this assignment).

Let “Mi p” denote p's truth at a world, i, in a model, M.

Basic Truth-Conditions at a world, i, in a Model, M:
[PC]: (Standard Clauses for the operators of Propositional Logic.)
[OB]: Mi OBp: “∀j[if Aij then Mj p]

Derivative Truth-Conditions:
[PE]: Mi PEp: ∃j(Aij & Mj p)
[IM]: Mi IMp: ~∃j(Aij & Mj p)
[OM]: Mi OMp: ∃j(Aij & Mj ~p)
[OP]: Mi OPp: ∃j(Aij & Mj p) & ∃j(Aij & Mj ~p)

p is true in the model, M (Mp): p is true at every world in M.

p is valid (⊨ p): p is true in every model.

Metatheorem: SDL is sound and complete for the class of all Kripke-SDL models.[1]

Return to Deontic Logic.

Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to