Notes to Deontic Logic

1. The term “deontic logic” appears to have arisen in English as the result of C. D. Broad's suggestion to von Wright (von Wright 1951); Mally used “Deontik” earlier to describe his work (Mally 1926). Both terms derive from the Greek term, δεον, for ‘that which is binding’, and ικ, a common Greek adjective-forming suffix for ‘after the manner of’, ‘of the nature of’, ‘pertaining to’, ‘of’, thus suggesting roughly the idea of a logic of duty. (The intervening “τ” in “δεοντικ” is inserted for phonetic reasons.)

2. In keeping with very wide trends in logic over the past century or so, we will treat both modal notions and deontic notions as sentential (or propositional) operators unless otherwise stated. Although it is controversial whether the most fundamental (if there are such) modal and deontic notions have the logical form of propositional operators, focusing on these forms allowed for essentially seamless integration of these logics with propositional logics.

3. The color-coded key used on the preceding partition and forthcoming square will be relied on through out for similar diagrams (with pale icy blue lines for secondary items external to partitions, and light grey lines for purely aesthetic figure completion). Recall that propositions are contraries if they can't both be true, sub-contraries if they can't both be false, and contradictories if they always have opposing truth-values. The square can be easily augmented as a hexagon by including nodes for contingency. Cf. the deontic hexagon below.

4. Only deontic operators will appear in bold face. These abbreviations are not standard. “O” is routinely used instead of “OB”, and “O” is often read as “It ought to be the case that”. “P” instead of “PE”, and if used at all, “F” (for “forbidden”) instead of “IM” and “I” (for “indifference”) instead of “OP”. Deontic non-necessity, here denoted by “OM” is seldom ever named, and even in English it is hard to find terms for this condition. The double letter choices used here are easy mnemonics expressing all five basic conditions (which, from a logical standpoint, are on a par), and they will facilitate later discussion involving just what notions to take SDL and kin to be modeling, and how it might be enriched to handle other related normative notions. Both deontic logic and ethical theory is fraught with difficulties when it comes to interchanging allegedly equivalent expressions for one another. Here we choose to read the basic operator as “it is obligatory that” so that all continuity with permissibility, impermissibility, and indifference is not lost, as it would be with the “it ought to be the case that” reading. A choice must be made. “It is obligatory that” may also be read personally, but non-agentially as “it is obligatory for Jones that” ( Krogh and Herrestad 1996) We will return to these issues again below.

5. In this essay we will generally call such equivalences “definitions”, sloughing over the distinction between abbreviatory definitions of operators not officially in the formal language, and axiom systems with languages containing these operators, along with axioms directly encoding the force of such definitions as equivalences.

6. Note the use of OP~p rather than ~OPp, and the relation of co-implication, rather than proper implication (sub-alternation). This breaks with the symmetries of the traditional square of opposition in order to represent a fundamental deontic feature of this operator, its indifference to negation, which is not tautological. Later we do the same for the indifference operator, not to be confused with the optionality operator which it properly implies. (See A Framework for Common Sense Morality). For new work on the geometric representation of logical relations, as well as fascinating history on the same, see Moretti 2004, 2009, for N-Opposition Theory (NOT), a framework offering a powerful and strict generalization of the traditional square of opposition. See also the entry on the Traditional Square of Opposition.

7. The logic of Mally 1926 was saddled with the T-analog above as a theorem: OBpp. Mally reluctantly embraced it since it seemed to follow from premises he could find no fault with. See the entry on Mally's Deontic Logic.

8. If Romeo solemnly promised Juliet to square the circle did it thereby become obligatory that he do so?

9. For DS becomes (OBp ↔ ~~OBp) & (OB~p ↔ ~~OB~p) & ~(OBp & OB~p) & ~(~~OB~p & ~~OBp) & (OBp → ~OB~p) & (OB~p → ~OBp), and although the first two conjuncts are tautologies, the remaining four are each tautologically equivalent to NC above. Similarly, TTC becomes (OBp ∨ (~OBp & ~OB~p) ∨ OB~p) & [~(OBp & OB~p) & ~(OBp & (~OBp & ~OB~p)) & ~((~OBp & ~OB~p) & OB~p)], and the exhaustiveness clause is tautological, as are the last two conjuncts of the exclusiveness clause, but the first conjunct of that clause is just NC again. Likewise for the assumptions that the omissible is the disjunction of the permissible and the obligatory and that the permissible is the disjunction of the obligatory and the optional.

10. In a monadic system one can easily define dyadic deontic operators of sorts (Hintikka 1971). For example, we might define “deontic implication” as follows: p dq=df OB(pq). We will consider non-monadic systems later on.

11. “⊢” before a formula indicates it is a theorem of the relevant system.

12. Note that this axiomatization, and all others here, use “axiom schema”: schematic specifications by syntactic pattern of classes of axioms (rather than particular axioms generalized via a substitution rule). We will nonetheless slough over the distinction here.

13. It also justifies a version of Deontic Detachment, from OBp and OB(pq) derive OBq, an inference pattern to be discussed later.

14. Compare the rule that contradictions are not permissible: if ⊢ ~p then ⊢ ~PEp. R2 is often said to be equivalent to “not everything is permissible”, and thus to rule out only “normative systems” that have no normative force at all.

15. We ignore most of the simple definitional equivalences mentioned above, as well as DS and TTC.

16. Compare OB-N and OB-D with OB (p ∨ ~p) and ~OB(p & ~p), respectively.

17. RE is the fundamental rule for “Classical Systems of Modal Logic”, a class that includes normal modal logics as a proper subset. See Chellas 1980.

18. Equivalently, it is required that only permissible things are true: OB(pPEp).

19. For OB(OBpp) →(OBOBpOBp) is just a special instance of OB-K. So using A4 above, and MP, we get OBOBpOBp directly.

20. See Chellas (1980, 193-194) for a concise critical discussion of the comparative plausibility of these two formuli under their standard possible worlds interpretation. (Note that Chellas' rich chapters on deontic logic in this exceptional and seminal textbook are gems generally.) However, where Chellas states that if there are any unfulfilled obligations (i.e., OBp and ~p both hold), then “ours in one of the worst of all possible worlds”, this is misleading, since the semantics does not rank worlds other than to sort them into acceptable and unacceptable ones (relative to a world). The illuminating underlying point is that for any world j whose alternatives are all p-worlds, but where p is false, it follows that not only can't j be an acceptable alternative to itself, but it can't be an acceptable alternative to any other world, i, either. Put simply, A4 implies that any (OBp & ~p)-world is universally unacceptable. However, this qualifier, though indeed significant, does not express a degree or extent of badness: given some ranking principle allowing for indefinitely better and worse worlds relative to some world i (such as in preference semantics for dyadic versions of SDL and kin—see below), j might be among the absolute best of the i-unacceptable worlds (i.e., ranked second only to those that are simply i-acceptable through and through), for all A4 implies.

21. For an earlier critical discussion of deontic iteration, see Marcus 1966.

22. von Wright 1953 and in the earlier (and first) edition of Prior 1962 [1955].

23. The worlds related to i by A are also often called “ideal worlds”. This language is not innocent (McNamara 1996b).

24. But see Goble 2003.

25. Kanger 1971 [1957] (circulating in 1950 as a typescript) and Anderson 1967 [1956] and Anderson 1958.

26. K is the basic (weakest) normal modal logic. (See the entry modal logic.) Traditionally, and in keeping with the intended interpretation, the underlying modal logic had T as a theorem, indicating that necessity was truth-implicating. We begin with K instead because T generates a system stronger than SDL. We will look at the addition of T shortly. Åqvist 2002 [1984] is an excellent source on the meta-theory of the relationship between SDL-ish deontic logics and corresponding Andersonian-Kangerian modal logics, as well as the main dyadic (primitive conditional operator) versions of these logics. Smiley 1963 is a landmark in the comparative study of such deontic systems. McNamara 1999 gives determination results for various deontic logics that employ three deontic constants.

27. Scare quotes because Kant's law is more accurately rendered as involving agency (if Doe is obligated to bring something about then Doe is able to do so), but the label is often used in deontic logic for almost any implication from something's being obligatory to something's being possible, roughly whatever formula comes closest to Kant's in the system. I will follow suit here.

28. We proved the first above, and given our definition of OB, RM′ and NEC′ follow from standard features of the modal logic K alone, but Kant's Law and NC′ also depend on the distinctive deontic axiom, ◊d.

29. Proof: By T, ⊢ □ (dp) → (dp). Then by PC, we canget ⊢ d → [□(dp) → p]. From this in turn, by NEC, we have ⊢ □(d → [□(dp) → p]), that is, OB(OBpp).

30. Note that this means that, for generality, we assume that what is possible may vary from one world to another. This is standard in this sort of semantics for modal logics. For example, if we wanted to model physical possibility and necessity, what is physically possible for our world, may not be so for some other logically possible world with different fundamental physical laws than ours. By adding certain constraints, we can generate a picture where what is possible does not vary at all from one world to another. See the entry on modal logic.

31. Note that we could add an ordering-relation semantics like that described at the end of our section on SDL in order to generate the DEM component of these models. The main difference would be that instead of a set of world-relative ordering relations, one for each world (e.g., ≥i) there would be just one ordering relation, ≥, whereby all worlds in W (in a given model) would be ranked just once. This relation would be reflexive, transitive and connected, while satisfying the Limit Assumption in W. DEM would then be the set of all the best worlds in W, and then the truth conditions for d and the five deontic operators would be cast via DEM so generated.

32. More explicitly, since OBp = df □(dp), we need only look at □(dp). The latter will be true at a world i, iff (dp) is true at all the i-accessible worlds. But given the truth-conditions for the material conditional “→”, that just amounts to saying p is true at all those i-accessible worlds (if any) where d is true, which in turn holds iff p is true at all the i-accessible worlds falling within DEM, i.e., at their intersection (which is non-empty by strong seriality). Similarly for the other four deontic operators.

33. Let me here mention that closely associated with this dilemma are two related traditions, one attempting to work out a logic for imperatives, the other rejecting the prospect for a logic of imperatives, but stressing the importance of imperatives as semantic components in devising a logical foundation for normative propositions. In the former tradition, see Vranas 2010 which provides an impressive defense of the cogency of a logic of imperatives, and Vranas 2008 for a sketch of a new framework for a logic of simple imperatives. In the latter tradition, see Hansen 2004, and more comprehensively, Hansen 2008, which includes a history of both traditions, and a defense of, and systematic technical contributions to, the latter tradition.

34. von Wright 1963; Hedenius 1963 [1941]; Alchourron and Bulygin 1971; Alchourron and Bulygin 1981; Makinson 1999. von Wright 1963 attributes the distinction to Ingemar Hedenius (Hedenius 1963 [1941]). Most recently, see Makinson and van der Torre 2003 for an attempt to provide a logic of norms in a novel framework devised for this: "input-output logic". See also Makinson 1999 for the sketch and motivation for this new approach.

35. See Lemmon 1962a; Kamp 1974, 1979. It is often thought that performative utterances generally work this way (Kempson 1977). For example, if a marriage ceremony conducted by a legitimate authority requires that authority to end the ceremony with the proverbial (but dated) “You are now man and wife” in order to complete an act of marriage, the speech act utilizing this sentence not only marries the couple (in the context), but it appears to also be a true description of their state as of that moment.

36. I will underline key letters to serve as clues for symbolization schemes left implicit, but hopefully clear enough.

37. This follows from RM and the definition of PE: Suppose ⊢ pq. Then ⊢ ~q → ~p. So by RM, ⊢ OB~qOB~p, and thus ⊢ ~OB~p → ~OB~q, i.e., ⊢ PEpPEq. Now just let q be (pq).

38. For suppose something was obligatory, say OBp. Then by NC, it follows that PEp. One instance of ** above is PEpPE~p. So we would then have PE~p, which by RE, PC and the definition of PE amounts to ~OBp, contradicting our assumption. Thus nothing could be obligatory.

39. For example, one sense would be as in SDL (the simple absence of a prohibition), the other being a stronger sense of permission (von Wright 1968) with a distinct logic that would, for example, ratify *, but not **, above. Another approach was to say that this is a pseudo-problem, since the conjunctive use of “or” in the context of a permission word can be expressed as a conjunction of permitting conjuncts, PEp & PEq (Føllesdal and Hilpinen 1971). Kamp 1974, 1979 contain detailed analyses of these issues, one sensitive to both the semantics and pragmatics of permission.

40. Prior cast it using this variant of RM: If ⊢ pq then ⊢ IMqIMp (the impermissibility of Smith being robbed then appears to wrongly imply the impermissibility of helping him who has been robbed). See also Åqvist 1967, which has been very influential.

41. This paradox can also be cast equivalently with just one agent, and via IM as easily as OB: “The Victims Paradox” notes that the victim of the crime helps herself only if there was a crime. If it is impermissible that there be a crime, it will follow under similar symbolization that it is impermissible for the victim of the crime to help herself, which hardly sounds right. Similarly for “The Robber's (Repenter's) Paradox”, where now we focus on the robber making amends (or repenting) for his crime, and again we seem to get the result that it is impermissible for the robber to make amends for his crime, suggesting a rather convenient argument against all obligations to ever make amends for one's crimes. These early variations were used to show that certain initially proposed solutions to the Good Samaritan paradox didn't really solve the problem. Both versions are found in Nowell Smith and Lemmon 1960.

42. One standard response to Ross's Paradox, the Good Samaritan Paradox (and the Paradox of Epistemic Obligation) is to try to explain them away. For example, Ross paradox is often quickly rejected as elementary confusion (Føllesdal and Hilpinen 1971) or it is rejected on the grounds that the inference is only pragmatically odd in ways that are independently predictable by any adequate theory of the pragmatics of deontic language (Castañeda 1981). Similarly, it has been argued that the Good Samaritan paradox is really a conditional obligation paradox, and so RM is not the real source of the paradox (Castañeda 1981; Tomberlin 1981). However, since these paradoxes all at least appear to depend on OB-RM, a natural solution to the problems is to undercut the paradoxes by rejecting OB-RM itself. Two accessible and closely related examples of approaches to deontic logic that reject OB-RM from a principled philosophical perspective are Jackson 1985 and Goble 1990a. Jackson 1985 argues for an approach to “ought to be” that links it to counterfactuals, and he informally explores its semantics and logic; Goble 1990a makes a similar case for “good” and “bad” (as well as “ought”), formally tying these to logical features of counterfactuals explicitly. (Goble 1990b contains the main technical details.) Interestingly, their approaches also intersect with the issue of “actualism” and “possibilism” as these terms are used in ethical theory. Roughly, possibilism is the view that I ought to bring about p if p is part of the best overall outcome I could bring about, even if the goodness of this overall outcome, depends on all sorts of other things that I would not in fact bring about were I to bring about p. In contrast, actualism is the view that I ought to bring about p if doing so would in fact be better than not doing so, and this of course can crucially depend on what else I would do (ideal or not) were I to bring about p. (See Jackson and Pargetter 1986; Jackson 1988, and for early discussions of this issue, see Goldman 1976 and Thomason 1981a.) In Hansson 1990, and more elaborately in Hansson 2001, S.O. Hansson develops systems of deontic logic where he analyzes prohibitive and prescriptive deontic notions in terms of abstract properties of various preference orderings (e.g., a normative status is prohibitive whenever anything worse than something that has that status also has it). He also sees OB-RM as the main culprit in the paradoxes of standard deontic logic, and thus he methodically explores non-standard frameworks where OB-RM is not sound. Hansson 2001 is also important for its extensive and original work on preference logic and preference structures, which, as we have already noted, are used regularly in deontic logic (and elsewhere). A very useful general source that covers some of the issues surrounding OB-RM well, along with many others, is van der Torre 1997.

43. I change the example to have the conflict be direct and explicit (i.e., the one obligation content is the negation of the other). Sartre's much cited example is of a man obligated to join the resistance (to avenge his brother's death and fight the Nazi occupation) and obligated to stay home and aid his ailing mother (devastated by the loss of the man's brother, her son, and deeply attached to the one son still alive). von Wright 1968 refers to a conflict of obligations as a “predicament” and illustrates with the much-cited example of Jephthah (from the Book of Judges), who promises God to sacrifice the first living being he meets upon returning home from war, if God gives him victory, which wish is granted, but his daughter is the first living being he meets upon his return.

44. Marcus 1980 stresses the possibility of such one-principle-sourced conflicts of obligation.

45. Whether or not these obligations are both all-things-considered-non-overridden obligations is a further issue. For our purposes here, the point is that they appear to be obligations. See the upcoming puzzle, Plato's Dilemma, for further issues.

46. Lemmon 1962a stresses that a conflict of obligations does not entail a contradiction. Williams 1965 stresses the contingency of conflicts of obligation and contrasts this in passing with inconsistency as unrealizability in any world. Marcus 1980 stresses more explicitly the standard world-theoretic conception of consistency, and applies it to moral codes whereby a code's consistency entails only that there is some eligible world where the code is obeyable, and that this by no means entails that the code must be obeyable in all eligible worlds. Cf. Marcus 1996.

47. Here too I change the example. Plato's case involves returning weapons as promised to someone who (now in a rage) intends to unjustly kill a friend with the weapon. Lemmon interprets the issues raised by Sartre's dilemma a bit differently than I do here.

48. von Wright 1968 suggested that minimizing evil is a natural approach to conflict resolution, thereby suggesting that a sort of minimizing (and thus reliance on an ordering) is apt. Alchourron and Makinson 1981 provide an early formal analysis of conflict resolution via partial orderings of regulations and regulation sets. Chisholm 1964 has been very influential conceptually, as witnessed, for example, by Loewer and Belzer 1983. In ethical theory, the informal conceptual landmark is Ross 1939. Horty 1994 is a very influential discussion forging a link between Reiter's default logic developed in AI (see Brewka 1989), and an early influential approach to conflicts of obligation, van Fraassen 1973, which combines a preference ordering with an imperatival approach to deontic logic. Prakken 1996 discusses Horty's approach and an alternative that strictly separates the defeasible component from the deontic component, arguing that handling conflicts should be left to the former component only. See also Makinson 1993 for a sweeping discussion of defeasibility and the place of deontic conditionals in this context. Other approaches to defeasibility in deontic logic that have affinities to semantic techniques developed in artificial intelligence for modeling defeasible reasoning about defeasible conditionals generally are Asher and Bonevac 1996 and Morreau 1996, both of which attempt to represent W.D. Ross-like notions of prima facia obligation, etc. Also notable are the discussions of defeasibility and conditionality in Alchourron 1993, 1996, where a revision operator (operating on antecedents of conditionals) is relied on in conjunction with a strict implication operator and a strictly monadic deontic operator. Note that Alchourron 1996, Prakken 1996, Asher and Bonevac 1996, Morreau 1996, and Prakken 1996 are all found in Studia Logica 57.1, 1996 (guest edited by A. Jones and M. Sergot). Nute 1997 is dedicated to defeasibility in deontic logic and is the best single source on the topic, with articles by many of the key players, including Nute himself. See Bartha 1999 for an approach to contrary-to-duty conditionals and to defeasible conditionals layered over a branching time framework with an agency operator. Smith 1994 contains an interesting informal discussion of conflicting obligations, defeasibility, violability and contrary-to-duty conditionals. Since it is very much a subject of controversy and doubt as to whether deontic notions contribute anything special to defeasible inference relations (as opposed to defeasible conditionals), we leave this issue aside here, and turn to conditionals, and the problem in deontic logic that has received the most concerted attention.

49. Here we follow tradition (albeit self-consciously) in sloughing over the differences between what ought to be, what one ought to do, and what is obligatory.

50. The remaining truly strained combination would replace 2′) with 2′′) and 3′) with 3′′), but that just doubles the trouble with the second and third readings, so it is routinely ignored.

51. von Wright 1956, 1971 take the now-classic non-componential dyadic operator approach to the syntax of CTDs. Danielsson 1968; Hansson 1969, Lewis 1973, 1974, and Feldman 1986 provide samples of a “next best thing” approach: the interpretation of conditional obligations via a primitive non-componential dyadic operator, in turn interpreted via a preference ordering of the possible worlds where the (perhaps obligation-violating) antecedent holds; see also Åqvist 2002 [1984] for an extensive systematic presentation of this sort of approach (among other things), and al-Hibri 1978 for an early widely-read systematic discussion of a number of approaches to CTDs (among other things). van Fraassen 1972, Loewer and Belzer 1983, and Jones and Porn 1985 also offer influential discussions of CTDs and propose distinct formal solutions, each also employing orderings of outcomes, but offering some twists on the former more standard pictures. An important source on the metatheory of classical and near-classical logics via classic and near-classic ordering structures for the dyadic operator is Goble 2003. Mott 1973 and Chellas 1974 (and Chellas 1980) offer influential analyses of the puzzle by combining a non-material conditional and a unary deontic operator to form a genuine componential compound, pOBq, for representing conditionals like 3) above); DeCew 1981 is an important early critical response to this sort of approach. Tomberlin 1983 contains a very influential informal discussion of various approaches. Bonevac 1998 is a recent argument against taking conditional obligation to be a primitive non-componential operator, suggesting roughly that techniques like those developed in AI (see Brewka 1989) for defeasible reasoning suffice for handling woes with CTDs. Smith 1993, 1994 contain important discussions stressing the difference between violability and defeasibility, and the relevance of the former rather than the latter to CTDs. Åqvist and Hoepelman 1981, and van Eck 1982 (and again, Loewer and Belzer 1983) are classic representatives of attempts to solve the puzzle by incorporating temporal notions into deontic logic. Jones 1990 contains an influential argument against any temporal-based general solution to the puzzle. Castañeda 1981 argued that by carefully distinguishing between (roughly) propositions and actions in the scope of deontic operators, Chisholm's puzzle, as well as most puzzles for deontic logic, can be resolved; Meyer 1988 offers a version of this general approach using dynamic logic. Prakken and Sergot 1996 contains an influential argument against any such action-based general solution to the puzzle. For recent work on CTDs in the context of a branching time framework with agency represented a la Horty-Belnap, see Horty 1996, 2001, Bartha 1999, and Bartha's contribution (chapter 11) to Belnap 2001. A recent source that reviews a good deal of the literature on CTDs and proposes its own solution is Carmo and Jones 2002; but see also material on this problem in Nute 1997 (especially van der Torre and Tan 1997, and Prakken and Sergot 1997).

52. Also called “Forrester's Paradox”.

53. Some have suggested this is a problem stemming from scope difficulties, others have argued that the problem is that OB-RM is in fact invalid, and rejecting it solves the problem. (Sinnott-Armstrong 1985 argues for a scope solution; Goble 1991 criticizes the scope solution approach, and argues instead for rejecting OB-RM.) We have listed this puzzle here rather than under the Good Samaritan Puzzle (in turn under puzzles associated with OB-RM) since, unlike the Standard Good Samaritan, this puzzle seems to crucially involve a contrary-to-duty conditional, and so it is often assumed that a solution to the Chisholm Paradox should be a solution to this puzzle as well (and vice versa). Alternatively, one might see the puzzle as one where we end up obligated to kill our mother gently because of our decision to kill her (via factual detachment), and then by OB-RM, we would appear obligated to kill her, which has no plausibility by anyone's lights, and thus calls for rejecting OB-RM. However, this would still include a stance on contrary-to-duty conditionals and detachment.

54. See also Alchourron and Bulygin 1971.

55. Jones and Porn 1986 gives an early attempt to distinguish the two, although “must” ends up looking more like practical necessity in their framework (that which holds in all scenarios—permissible or not) than deontic necessity (that which holds in all permissible scenarios). McNamara 1996b provides a cumulative case arguments that “must” not “ought” is the dual of permissibility, and thus that it is this almost universally ignored term “must”, not “ought”, that tracks the traditional concern in ethical theory and deontic logic with permissibility.

56. The following formulation of the problem has the status of reconstructed deontic folklore in the form of an argument or problem explicitly showing the inability of SDL to be taken to represent agential obligations. Explicit early arguments for the need to eventually represent agency in order to represent agential obligations are hard to find. The earliest reference I have found that comes close to formulating the problem in just the following way is Lindahl 1977, p.94, which explicitly uses the “none of your business” terminology. However, it was surely known to Kanger, and fair to say it was presupposed by him in his attempted analysis of rights-related notions as far back as his seminal paper, Kanger 1971 [1957]. Cf. also von Wright 1968.

57. Cf. “Jane Doe is obligated to see to it that __”, von Wright 1971.

58. “E” is often used for this operator. With two or more agents, we would need to represent agents explicitly: BAsp, BAsp, etc.

59. This “passivity” terminology, although used elsewhere, is perhaps not ideal and can't seriously be viewed as an analysis of “passivity” per se, since one might bring about neither a proposition nor its negation, and yet be quite influential regarding it (e.g., intentionally and actively increasing its probability without making it happen), thus the longer and more cumbersome expression.

60. Where here we read the antecedent as implying that BAp and BAq both now hold.

61. For example, see the following sources, and the references there in: Segerberg 1982; Elgesem 1993, 1997; Hilpinen 1997a, 1997b; Segerberg 1997; Belnap 2001.

62. Meinong 1972 [1917]. Chisholm 1964 attributes the idea's endorsement to Nicolai Hartmann as well.

63. More generally, it can be seen as a reduction of an agential deontic operator to a non-agential deontic operator (but not necessarily an impersonal one) and a non-deontic agency operator (Krogh and Herrestad 1996).

64. For example, see Porn 1970; Kanger 1971 [1957]; Lindahl 1977; Porn 1977, 1989; Horty 1996; Jones and Sergot 1996; Santos and Carmo 1996; Belnap 2001. As indicated earlier, Horty 1996 and Horty 2001 is of interest for (among other things) its argument against the Meinong-Chisholm reduction, and for providing an alternative non-componential analysis of agential obligation in the context of a branching-time analysis of agency. McNamara 2004b provides a quick informal exposition of the basic framework. This is in contrast to the branching-time approach to deontic contexts in Belnap 2001 (with Paul Bartha), where agential obligation is a componential compound of an agency operator and an obligation operator (one in turn analyzed via an Andersonian-Kangerian reduction). Another alternative to the major trend above, one that would unfortunately also take us too far afield, is the adaptation of modal logics for representing computer programs (e.g., dynamic logic) to represent actions in deontic logic. A classic sources here is Meyer 1988 which combines a dynamic logic approach to action with an adaptation of the Andersonian-Kangerian reduction to generate deontic notions. See also Segerberg 1982.

65. The theory of normative positions has been an important and active sub-area since its inception in Stig Kanger's seminal work (Kanger 1971 [1957], 1972), developed in a book-length study in Lindahl 1977, and thus sometimes referred to as “the Kanger-Lindahl theory”. It has been used in attempts to analyze legal relations, like those made famous by Hohfeld 1919, among other things. The Kanger-Lindahl theory has been further developed by Jones and Sergot 1993, Sergot 1999, Herrestad and Krogh 1995 and Lindahl 2001. See also Allen 1996 for a somewhat different approach to Hohfeldian legal relations, and Porn 1970 and 1977 for a framework employed to analyze various normatively laden social positions and relations. Lindahl 2001 provides an excellent overview and orientation on Kanger's work in this area, and various problems informing subsequent research. (Other stunning contributions of Kanger to deontic logic are discussed in Hilpinen 2001b in the same volume.) Sergot 1999 takes the formal work of normative positions to a new level of abstraction and precision, and the later work mentioned above by Lindahl, and Herrestad and Krogh continue the exploration of refinements of the earlier Kanger-Lindahl conceptual framework to adapt it better to the analysis of legal notions.

66. Although the puzzle/dilemma as such is not in Krogh and Herrestad 1996, the issue derives from that article, where they note that obligations can be yours yet fulfilled by someone else, and they use this distinction to offer a solution to the Leakage Problem (below).

67. Two classics on time and deontic logic are Thomason 1981b and Thomason 1981a, where temporal and deontic interactions are discussed, including an often invoked distinction between deliberative ‘ought’s (future-oriented/decision-oriented ‘ought’s) versus judgmental ‘ought’s (past, present or future oriented ‘ought’s from a purely evaluative, rather than action-oriented perspective). (Cf. the notion of “cues” for action in van Eck 1982.). Some other important earlier entries are Loewer and Belzer 1983, van Eck 1982, Åqvist and Hoepelman 1981, and Chellas 1969. For a sample of some recent work, see Bailhache 1998 and her references to her earlier work and that of others, as well as Brown 1996b for an attempt to develop a diachronic logic of obligations, representing obligations coming to be, and being discharged over time, where, for example, someone can now have an obligation to bring about p only if p is (now) false.

Notes to Supplementary Documents

A Framework for Common Sense Morality in Non-Conflict Contexts

1. To minimize complications, we will assume no one else can do these things for me.

2. I pass over subtleties here about the philosopher's use of the term "supererogatory".

Challenges in Defining Deontic Logic

1. Although this example has no practical significance for us, it is still true that without such capacities for counterfactual evaluation, we would have no capacity for such deeply human traits as a sense of tragedy and misfortune, and of course some judgments about what ought to be the case do and should guide our actions, but the link is not simple, and it is not clear that such evaluations of states of affairs are any less a part of deontic logic than evaluations of the future courses of action of agents.

von Wright's 1951 System and SDL

1. Cf. the deontic logic in Meyer 1988, where a set of operators for action (drawn from dynamic logic) are used along with a separate set of propositional operators.

Alternative Axiomatization of SDL

1. The interrelationships between the rules and axioms which constitute the equivalence between these systems is taken for granted in work on deontic logic, and is thus useful to know.

2. A direct proof of A2 without first proving RM is:

Show: ⊢ OB(pq) → (OBpOBq) (A2 or OB-K)

Proof: By PC, ⊢ ((pq) & p) ↔ (p & q). So by R2′, ⊢ OB((pq) & p) ↔ OB(p & q). But by A2′ conjoined with A3′, we get ⊢ OB((pq) & p) ↔ (OB(pq) & OBp). So from the last two results, by PC, we get ⊢ (OB(pq) & OBp) ↔ OB(p & q), and thus ⊢ (OB(pq) & OBp) → OB(p & q). But by A2′, we have ⊢ OB(p & q) → (OBp & OBq). So from the last two results, by PC, we get ⊢ (OB(pq) & OBp) → (OBp & OBq), and thus ⊢ (OB(pq) → (OBpOBq).

Kripke-Style Semantics for SDL

1. That is, any theorem of SDL is valid per this semantics (soundness), and any formula valid per this semantics is a theorem of SDL (completeness).

Two Counter-Models Regarding Additions to SDL

1. Note that this is in contrast to j itself, where the latter formula does hold, for the reader can easily verify that (OBpp) holds at k in this model, and k is the only world acceptable to j.

2. The remaining items hold independently of seriality. Completing the proof amounts to both a proof of SDL's soundness with respect to our semantics, and of A4's independence (non-derivability from) SDL.

SDL Containment Proof

1. An examination of our earlier proof that RM for OB was one of the derived rules within SDL reveals that for any system with NEC and K governing a necessity operator, the rule RM is derivable. Here it is again adapted for □:

Show: If ⊢ pq, then ⊢ □p → □ q. (RM)

Proof: Suppose ⊢ pq. Then by NEC, ⊢ □(pq), and then by K, ⊢ □p → □q.

2. The “pure deontic fragment” is the set of theorems of Kd that can be abbreviated using only the truth-functions and the five standard deontic operators.

The Logical Necessity of Obligations Problem

1. I know of no standard names for this and the next problem, so I just give descriptive labels.

The Violability Puzzle

1. von Wright 1963, p.154 comes very close to stating this objection.

2. For suppose OBp. Then since by PC, ⊢ p → ⊤, it follows by OB-RM that ⊢ OBpOB⊤. But since by PC, ⊢ ⊤, by Violability, it follows that ⊢ ~OB⊤. So by PC, ⊢ ~OBp, for any p.

The Paradox of Epistemic Obligation (Aqvist 1967)

1. 1′) is not really essential here, it just helps to clarify that 2) does not express some strange standing obligation but a transient one that emerges as a result of the de facto robbery.

2. Theoretically one could claim that we have a conflict of obligations here, but this seems quite implausible. The banks' being robbed appears to be definitely non-obligatory.

A Puzzle Surrounding Kant's Law

1. As noted earlier, this is a weakened version of that law, as here no agential notion of ability is present.

Collapse of Conflicts into Impossible Obligations

1. However see Da Costa and Carnielli 1986 which develops a deontic logic in the context of paraconsistent logic.

2. For first suppose OBp & OB~p holds. Then one instance of K is OB(~p → ⊥) → (OB~pOB⊥). But by OB-RE, OB(~p → ⊥) is equivalent to just OBp, so we get OBp → (OB~pOB⊥) by PC. So given OBp & OB~p, we then get OB⊥ by PC. Second assume OB⊥. By PC, ⊢ ⊥ → p. So by RM, we get OB⊥ → OBp, and then OBp. We can then generate OB~p the same way.

3. Normal modal logics won't do since K and RE hold in all such logics. Chellas uses minimal models and Schotch and Jennings generalize Kripke models.

The Paradox of Derived Obligation/Commitment (Prior 1954)

1. In the 1st edition of Prior 1962 [1955].

2. In von Wright 1951.

3. In the case of symbolization 1′′), since (rs) is logically equivalent to (~rs), and the two troublesome formulas associated with this symbolization reduce to OB~rOB(~rs) and OBsOB(~rs), these are also instances of Ross' Paradox given this SDL interpretation of the sentences.

A Bit More of Chisholm's Paradox

1. We continue to ignore the differences between “obligation” and “ought” for simplicity.

2. Alchourron 1993 is a salient exception.

3. Greenspan 1975.

4. As already noted, some reject both analyses and think deontic conditionals are sui generis. Note also that 2) above has the conditional explicitly in the scope of the English “ought to be” operator, and this is not explicitly a deontic conditional as just characterized unless we add that it should be read as at least necessarily equivalent to “if Jones does go, then he ought to tell them he is coming.” There is no uniform agreement about this, although often the Chisholm Paradox is characterized so that both 2) and 3) above would have the same superficial form (“if …, then it ought to be that…”), with the deontic term appearing in the second clause. We have instead followed Chisholm's original formulation. In either event, the inference from 1) and 2) to “it ought to be that Jones tells” is also called “deontic detachment” as is that from their formal analogues in SDL, where OB-K validates the inference from 1′) and 2′) to OBt.

5. Smith 1994 notes that adding factual detachment to SDL with OB(q/p) interpreted as OB(pq), yields Mally's problem: ⊢ OBpp. That SDL yields the first half, pOBp, given factual detachment, is easily seen. Just substitute p for q in FD to yield ⊢ p & OB(pp) .→ OBp. Then, since ⊢ OB(pp) by OB-N, it can fall out and we get ⊢ pOBp. Note that the proof depends crucially on the highly controversial rule of necessitation. However, Smith, crediting Andrew Jones, pointed out that even a very minimal deontic logic entails the second half of the equivalence in question, OBpp, which is still enough to make Voltaire grin.

Thm: For any system with PL, OB-D & OB-RE, FD yields ⊢ OBpp.

Proof: Assume PL, OB-D, OB-RE and FD. By substitution of ⊥ for q in FD, we get ⊢ p & OB(p → ⊥) → OB⊥. So from that and OB-D, we get ⊢ ~(p & OB(p → ⊥)), that is ⊢ ~p ∨ ~OB(p → ⊥). From the latter by OB-RE we get ⊢ ~p ∨ ~OB~p, that is ⊢ OB~p → ~p, which by substitution of ~p for p, along with OB-RE, yields ⊢ OBpp.

Given how minimal OB-RE and OB-D are, the friend of factual detachment with conditionals so interpreted cannot shrug this off. Clearly a non-material conditional is essential here.

6. See Mott 1973, Chellas 1974, 1980 for examples, and DeCew 1981 for an influential critical evaluation, arguing that although such conditionals are indeed important, there is still a special conditional they overlook at the heart of the Chisholm puzzle.

7. van Eck 1982.

8. In Chisholm's example it is easier to accept that telling is merely ideal, but not required, since it is easy to interpret Chisholm's example as one where giving advanced notice is what the agent perhaps ought to do, but not something the agent must do (even assuming the neighborly help is itself a must).

9. As Makinson 1993 notes, it was also a forerunner of semantics for defeasible conditionals generally (cf. “if p, normally q”).

10. The idea is perhaps implicit in Hansson 1969; it is argued for explicitly in Greenspan 1975, and adopted by many since.

11. Thomason 1981b, 1981a are classics arguing for the general importance of layering deontic logic on top of temporal logic. Åqvist and Hoepelman 1981; Thomason 1981b; van Eck 1982; Loewer and Belzer 1983; Feldman 1986 argue that attention to time is crucial (or at least helpful) in handling the Chisholm puzzle, among other puzzles.

12. DeCew 1981. Smith 1994 contains an illuminating informal discussion of the three different versions (backward, parallel, and forward) in evaluating different approaches to solving the Chisholm paradox.

13. Castañeda 1981; Meyer 1988.

14. Cf. p is permissible given pq, where PE(p/q) =df ~OB(~p/q).

Inaction versus Refraining/Forebearing

1. It has been most utilized by Belnap and coworkers. See Belnap 2001, and its references to prior papers.

2. Suppose S is any consistent system with BA-NO, BA-RE and PC: For reductio assume ⊢ ~BAp → RFp. By BA-NO, ⊢ ~BA⊤. So by our assumption, ⊢ RF⊤. Now by PC, ⊢ ~BA⊤ ↔ ⊤. So by BA-RE, ⊢ ~BA~BA⊤. So by definition of RF, we have ⊢ ~RF⊤, and hence an inconsistent set of theorems.

3. But not so for the “achievement” agency operator in Belnap 2001.

The Leakage Problem (Krogh and Herrestad 1996)

1. Krogh and Herrestad 1996 attributes the identification of this problem to Jose Carmo. They offer a solution there by distinguishing between personal and agential obligations.

Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <paulmunh@gmail.com>

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