Supplement to Deontic Logic

SDL Containment Proof

Recall SDL:

A1: All tautologous wffs of the language (TAUT)
A2: OB(pq) → (OBpOBq) (OB-K)
A3: OBp → ~OB~p (OB-NC)
R1: If ⊢ p and ⊢ pq then ⊢ q (MP)
R2: If ⊢ p then ⊢ OBp (OB-NEC)

We have already shown OB-NC is derivable in Kd above, and TAUT and MP are given, since they hold for all formulas of Kd. So we need only derive OB-K and OB-NEC of SDL, which we will do in reverse order. Note that RM, if ⊢ rs, then ⊢ □r → □s), is derivable in Kd, and so we rely on it in the second proof.[1]

Show: If ⊢ p then ⊢ OBp. (OB-NEC)
Proof: Assume ⊢ p. It follows by PC that ⊢ dp. So by NEC for □, we get ⊢ □(dp), that is, OBp.

Show: ⊢ OB(pq) → (OBpOBq). (K of SDL)
Proof: Assume OB(pq) and OBp. From PC alone, ⊢ (d → (pq)) → [(dp) → (dq)]. So by RM for □, we have ⊢ □(d → (pq)) → □[(dp) → (dq)]. But the antecedent of this is just, OB(pq) in disguise, which is our first assumption. So we have □[(dp) → (dq)] by MP. Applying K for □ to this, we get □(dp) → □(dq). But the antecedent to this is just our second assumption, OBp. So by MP, we get □(dq), that is, OBq.

Metatheorem: SDL is derivable in Kd.

Note that showing that the pure deontic fragment of Kd contains no more than SDL is a more complex matter. The proof relies on already having semantic metatheorems available. An excellent source for this is Åqvist 2002 [1984].[2]

Return to Deontic Logic.

Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <>

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