Supplement to Deontic Logic

The Leakage Problem (Krogh and Herrestad 1996)[1]

As noted previously, when discussing two or more agents, subscripts are usually introduced to identify and distinguish the agents, for example BAip & BAjq would indicate that i brings it about that p and j brings it about that q. Now let's assume that one agent can sometimes bring it about by what she does that another agent brings some thing about. For example, let's suppose that a parent can sometimes bring it about that a child brings it about that the child's room is cleaned (however rare this may in fact be). Carmo notes the following problem for the Meinong Chisholm analysis. Consider:

(1) BAiBAjp → BAjp

(1) follows from BA-T, the virtually universally endorsed “success” condition for the intended agency operator. (1) is a logical truth. But then, in any system containing OB-RM, (2) will be derivable from (1), and so if (1) is a theorem in that system, (2) will be as well. But given the Meinong-Chisholm analysis, this will imply that if I am obligated to bring it about that some else does some thing, then she is obligated to do that thing as well. However, this is surely false. If I am obligated to get my very young child to feed herself, it does not follow that she is herself, at her young age, obligated to feed herself, even if she is just becoming capable of doing so. So it appears that the natural augmentation of SDL with an agency operator allows my obligation to implausibly “leak” beyond its proper domain and generate an obligation for her.

Return to Deontic Logic.

Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to