Supplement to Deontic Logic

The Paradox of Epistemic Obligation (Åqvist 1967)

Consider:

(1) The bank is being robbed.
(2) It ought to be the case that Jones (the guard) knows that the bank is being robbed.
(3) It ought to be the case that the bank is being robbed.

Let us symbolize “Jones knows that the bank is being robbed” by “Kjr.” Then it would appear that a correct way to symbolize (1) - (3) in SDLs (augmented with a “K” operator) is:

(1′) r
(2′) OBKjr
(3′) OBr

But it is a logical truth that if one knows that p then p is the case (surely Jones knows that the bank is being robbed only if the bank is in fact being robbed). So ⊢ Kjrr would hold in any system augmented with a faithful logic of knowledge. So in such a system, it would follow by RM that ⊢ OBKjrOBr, but then we can derive (3′) from this conditional and (2′) by MP.[1] But it hardly seems to follow from the fact that it is obligatory that the guard knows that the bank is being robbed, that it is likewise obligatory that the bank is being robbed. It seems that SDL countenances inferences from patently impermissible states of affairs that someone is obliged to know hold when they hold to the conclusion that the same impermissible states of affairs are obligatory.[2]

Return to Deontic Logic.

Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <paulmunh@gmail.com>

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