Supplement to Deontic Logic

The Violability Puzzle[1]

It would seem that it is of the nature of obligations that they are violable in principle, unlike simple assertions, so that the following seems to be a conceptual truth:

(1) If it is logically impossible that p is false, then it is logically impossible that p is obligatory.

But in SDL, this would naturally be expressed as a rule of inference:

If ⊢ p then ⊢ ~OBp (Violability)

But since ⊤ is a logical truth, Violability would yield ~OB⊤, which directly contradicts theorem OB-N. Thus, SDL seems to make it a logical truth that there are inviolable obligations. But the idea that it is obligatory that it is either raining or not raining, something that couldn't be otherwise on logical grounds, seems counterintuitive. Furthermore, even in a system that lacked the force of OB-NEC and OB-N, if it has the force of just the rule RM (if ⊢ pq then ⊢ OBpOBq), then were we to also countenance the Violability rule in such a system, we would be immediately forced to conclude that nothing is obligatory, ⊢ ~OBp, thus rendering the system inapplicable.[2] von Wright 1963 comes close to endorsing Violability (p. 154), but the context there is more complex and less straightforward than that above. Jones and Porn 1985 provides a system designed explicitly to accommodate violability (among other things) for their analysis of “ought.”

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Copyright © 2010 by
Paul McNamara <>

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