Supplement to Deontic Logic

von Wright's 1951 System and SDL

It is fair to say that von Wright 1951 launched deontic logic as an area of active research. There was a flurry of responses, and not a year has gone by since without published work in this area. von Wright's 1951 system is an important predecessor of SDL, but the variables there ranged over act types not propositions. As a result, the deontic operator symbols (e.g., OB) were interpreted as applying not to sentences, but to names of act types (cf. “to attend” or “attending”) to yield a sentence (e.g., “it is obligatory to attend” or “attending is obligatory”). So iterated deontic sequences (e.g., OBOBA) were not well-formed formulas and shouldn't have been on his intended interpretation, since OBA (unlike A) is a sentence, not an act description, so not suitable for having OB as a preface to it (cf. “it is obligatory it is obligatory to run” or “running is obligatory is obligatory”). However, von Wright did think that there can be negations, disjunctions and conjunctions of act types, and so he used standard connectives to generate not only complex normative sentences (e.g., OBA & PEA), but complex act descriptions (e.g., A & ~B), and thus complex normative sentences involving them (e.g., OB(A & ~B) → PE(A & ~B)). The standard connectives of PC are thus used in a systematically ambiguous way in von Wright's initial system with the hope of no confusion, but a more refined approach (as he recognized) would call for the usual truth-functional operators and a second set of act-type-compounding analogues to these.[1] Mixed formulas (e.g., A → OBA) were not well-formed in his 1951 system and shouldn't have been on his intended interpretation, since if OBA is well-formed, then A must be a name of an act type not a sentence, but then it can't suitably be a preface to →, when the latter is followed by an item of the sentence category (e.g., OBA). (Cf. “If to run then it is obligatory to run.”) However, this also means that the standard violation condition for an obligation (e.g., OBp & ~p) is not expressible in his system. von Wright also rejected NEC, but otherwise accepts analogues to the basic principles of SDL.

Researchers quickly opted for a syntactic approach where the variables and operators are interpreted propositionally as they are in PC (Prior 1962 [1955], Anderson 1956, Kanger 1971 [1957], and Hintikka 1957), and von Wright soon adopted this course himself in his key early revisions of his “old system” (e.g., von Wright 1968, 1971 (originally published in 1964 and 1965, respectively). Note that this is essentially a return to the approach in Mally's Deontic Logic of a few decades before.

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Paul McNamara <>

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