Supplement to Inductive Logic

Some Prominent Approaches to the Representation of Uncertain Inferences

The following figure indicates some relationships among six of the most prominent approaches. The arrows point from more general to less general representation schemes. For example, the Dempster-Shafer represention contains the probability functions as a special case.

Figure 1
Representations of Uncertainty

These representations are often described as measures on events, or states, or propositions, or sets of possibilities. But deductive logics are usually described in terms of statements or sentences of a language. So let's follow suit.

Plausibility relations (Friedman and Halpern, 1995) constitute the most general of these representations. They satisfy the weakest axioms, the weakest constraints on the logic of uncertainty. For a plausibility relation ⊆ between sentences, an expression AB’, says that A is no more plausible than B (i.e., B is at least as plausible as A, maybe more plausible). The axioms for plausibility relations say that tautologies are more plausible than contradictions, any two logically equivalent sentences are plausibility-related to other sentence in precisely the same way, a sentence is no more plausible than the sentences it logically entails, and the no more plausible than relation is transitive. These axioms make plausibility relations weak partial orderings on the relative plausibility of sentences. They permit some sentences to be incomparable—neither more plausible, nor less plausible, nor equally plausible to one another.

Qualitative probability relations are plausibility relations for which the ordering is total—i.e. any two sentences are either equally plausible, or one is more plausible than the other. This total ordering is established by one additional axiom. Qualitative probability relations also satisfy a second additional axiom that says that when a sentence S is logically incompatible with A and with B, then AB holds just in case (A or S) ⊆ (B or S) holds as well. When qualitative probability relations are defined on a language with a rich enough vocabulary and satisfy one additional axiom, they can be shown to be representable by probability functions—i.e., given any qualitative probability relation ⊆, there is a unique probability function P such that AB just in case P[A]P[B]. So quantitative probability may be viewed as essentially just a way of placing a numerical measure on sentences that uniquely emulates the is no more plausible than relation specfied by qualitative probability. (See (Koopman, 1940), (Savage, 1954), (Hawthorne and Bovens, 1999), (Hawthorne, 2009).)

Probability (i.e., quantitative probability) is a measure of plausibility that assigns a number between 0 and 1 to each sentence. Intuitively, the probability of a sentence S, P[S] = r, says that S is plausible to degree r, or that the rational degree of confidence (or belief) that S is true is r. The axioms for probabilities basically require two things. First, tautologies get probability 1. Second, when A and B contradict each other, the probability of the disjunction (A or B) must be the sum of the probabilities of A and of B individually. It is primarily in regard to this second axiom that probability differs from each of the other quantitative measures of uncertainty.

Like probability, Dempster-Shafer belief functions (Shafer, 1976, 1990) measure appropriate belief strengths on a scale between 0 and 1, with contradictions and tautologies at the respective extremes. But whereas the probability of a disjunction of incompatible claims must equal the sum of the parts, Dempster-Shafer belief functions only require such disjunctions be believed at least as strongly as the sum of the belief strengths of the parts. So these functions are a generalization of probability. By simply tightening up the Dempster-Shafer axiom about how disjunctions are related to their parts we get back a restricted class of Dempster-Shafer functions that just is the class of probability functions. Dempster-Shafer functions are primarily employed as a logic of the evidential support for hypotheses. In that realm they are a generalization of the idea of evidential support embodied by probabilistic inductive logic. There is some controversy as to whether such a generalization is useful or desirable, or whether simple probability is too narrow to represent important evidential relationships captured by some Dempster-Shafer functions.

There is a sense in which the other two quantitative measures of uncertainty, possibility functions and ranking functions, are definable in terms of formulas employing the Dempster-Shafer functions. But this is not the best way to understand them. Possibility functions (Zadeh, 1965, 1978), (Dubois and Prade, 1980, 1990) are generally read as representing the degree of uncertainty in a claim, where such uncertainty is often attributed to vagueness or fuzziness. These functions are formally like probability functions and Dempster-Shafer functions, but they subscribe to a simpler addition rule: the degree of uncertainty of a disjunction is the greater of the degrees of uncertainty of the parts. Similarly, the degree of uncertainty of a conjunction is the smaller of the uncertainties of the parts.

Ranking functions (Spohn, 1988) supply a measure of how surprising it would be if a claim turned out to be true, rated on a scale from 0 (not at all surprizing) to infinity. Tautologies have rank 0 and contradictions are infinitely surprizing. Logically equivalent claims have the same rank. The rank of a disjunction is equal to the rank of the lower ranking disjunct. These functions may be used to represent a kind of order-of-magnitude reasoning about the plausibility of various claims.

See (Halpern, 2003) for a good comparative treatment of all of these approaches.

Here are the axioms for the Plausibility Relations and the Qualitative Probability Relations.

Axioms for the Plausibility Relations
Each plausibility relation ⊆ satisfies the following axioms:
  1. if T is a tautology and K is a contradiction, it is not the case that TK;
  2. if A is logically equivalent to B and C is logically equivalent to D, and AC, then BD;
  3. if A logically entails B, then AB;
  4. if AB and BC, then AC.

Two sentences are defined as equally plausible, A = B, just when AB and BA. One sentence is defined as less plausible than another, AB, just when AB but not BA.

Axioms for the Qualitative Probability Relations
To get the qualitative probability relations we add the axioms
  1. AB or B ⊆ A;
  2. if ‘(S and A)’ and ‘(S and B)’ are both logical contradictions, then AB just in case (A or S) ⊆ (B or S).

The typical axioms for quantitative probability are as follows:

  1. for all sentences S, 0 ≤ P[S] ≤ 1;
  2. if S is a tautology, then P[S] = 1;
  3. if ‘(A and B)’ is a logical contradiction, then P[A or B] = P[A] + P[B].

Axioms 1-6 for the qualitative probability relations are probabilistically sound with respect to the quantitative probability functions. That is, for each given probability function P, define a relation ⊆ such that AB just in case P[A] ≤ P[B]. Then ⊆ must satisfy axioms 1-6. However, not every qualitative probability relation that satisfies axioms 1-6 may be represented by a probability function. To get that we must add one further axiom.

Let's say that a qualitative probability relation ⊆ is fine-grained just in case it satisfies the following axiom:

(7) if AB, then there is some tautology consisting of n sentences, (S1 or S2 or … or Sn), where each distinct Si and Sj are inconsistent with one another, such that for each of the Si,   (A or Si) ⊂ B.

For each fine-grained qualitative probability relation ⊆ there is a unique probability function P such that AB just in case P[A] ≤ P[B].

Now call a qualitative probability relation ⊆ properly extendable just in case it can be extended to a fine-grained qualitative probability relation defined on a larger language (i.e., a language containing additional sentences). Then for every properly extendable qualitative probability relation ⊆ there is a probability function P such that AB just in case P[A] ≤ P[B]. In general a given properly extendable qualitative probability relation may have many such representing probability functions, corresponding to different ways of extending it to fine-grained qualitative probability relations.

Thus, the quantitative probability functions may be viewed as just useful ways of representing properly extendable qualitiative probability relations on a convenient numerical scale.

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Copyright © 2012 by
James Hawthorne <>

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