#### Supplement to Inductive Logic

## Some Prominent Approaches to the Representation of Uncertain Inferences

The following figure indicates some relationships among six of the
most prominent approaches. The arrows point from more general to less
general representation schemes. For example, the
*Dempster-Shafer* represention contains the *probability
functions* as a special case.

Representations of Uncertainty

These representations are often described as measures on events, or states, or propositions, or sets of possibilities. But deductive logics are usually described in terms of statements or sentences of a language. So let's follow suit.

*Plausibility relations* (Friedman and Halpern, 1995)
constitute the most general of these representations. They satisfy the
weakest axioms, the weakest constraints on the logic of uncertainty. For a
*plausibility relation* ⊆ between sentences, an expression
‘*A* ⊆ *B*’,
says that *A* is no more plausible than *B*
(i.e., *B* is at least as plausible as *A*, maybe more
plausible). The axioms for plausibility relations say that tautologies
are more plausible than contradictions, any two logically equivalent
sentences are plausibility-related to other sentence in precisely the
same way, a sentence is no more plausible than the sentences it
logically entails, and the *no more plausible than* relation is
transitive. These axioms make plausibility relations *weak partial
orderings* on the relative plausibility of sentences. They permit
some sentences to be incomparable—neither more plausible, nor
less plausible, nor equally plausible to one another.

*Qualitative probability relations* are *plausibility
relations* for which the ordering is *total*—i.e.
any two sentences are either equally plausible, or one is more
plausible than the other. This *total ordering* is established
by one additional axiom. *Qualitative probability relations*
also satisfy a second additional axiom that says that when a sentence
*S* is logically incompatible with *A* and with
*B*, then
*A* ⊆ *B*
holds *just in case*
(*A* or *S*) ⊆ (*B* or *S*)
holds as well. When *qualitative probability relations* are
defined on a language with a rich enough vocabulary and satisfy one
additional axiom, they can be shown to be *representable* by
*probability functions*—i.e., given any *qualitative
probability relation* ⊆, there is a unique probability
function *P* such that
*A* ⊆ *B*
just in case
*P*[*A*]
≤
*P*[*B*].
So quantitative *probability* may be viewed as essentially
just a way of placing a numerical measure on sentences that uniquely
emulates the *is no more plausible than* relation specfied by
*qualitative probability*. (See (Koopman, 1940), (Savage,
1954), (Hawthorne and Bovens, 1999), (Hawthorne, 2009).)

*Probability* (i.e., *quantitative probability*) is a
measure of *plausibility* that assigns a number between 0 and 1
to each sentence. Intuitively, the *probability* of a sentence
*S*,
*P*[*S*]
= *r*, says that *S* *is plausible to degree r*,
or that *the rational degree of confidence (or belief) that*
*S* *is true is* *r*. The axioms for
*probabilities* basically require two things. First,
tautologies get probability 1. Second, when *A* and *B*
contradict each other, the probability of the disjunction (*A*
or *B*) must be the sum of the probabilities of *A* and
of *B* individually. It is primarily in regard to this second
axiom that *probability* differs from each of the other
quantitative measures of uncertainty.

Like *probability*, *Dempster-Shafer belief functions*
(Shafer, 1976, 1990) measure *appropriate belief strengths* on
a scale between 0 and 1, with contradictions and tautologies at the
respective extremes. But whereas the *probability* of a
disjunction of incompatible claims must equal the sum of the parts,
*Dempster-Shafer belief functions* only require such
disjunctions be *believed* *at least as strongly as* the
sum of the *belief strengths* of the parts. So these functions
are a generalization of *probability*. By simply tightening up
the *Dempster-Shafer* axiom about how disjunctions are related
to their parts we get back a restricted class of
*Dempster-Shafer* *functions* that just is the class of
*probability* *functions*. *Dempster-Shafer*
functions are primarily employed as a logic of the evidential support
for hypotheses. In that realm they are a generalization of the idea of
evidential support embodied by *probabilistic inductive logic*.
There is some controversy as to whether such a generalization is
useful or desirable, or whether simple *probability* is too
narrow to represent important evidential relationships captured by
some *Dempster-Shafer functions*.

There is a sense in which the other two quantitative measures of
uncertainty, *possibility functions* and *ranking
functions*, are definable in terms of formulas employing the
*Dempster-Shafer* *functions*. But this is not the best
way to understand them. *Possibility functions* (Zadeh, 1965,
1978), (Dubois and Prade, 1980, 1990) are generally read as
representing *the degree of uncertainty* in a claim, where such
uncertainty is often attributed to vagueness or fuzziness. These
functions are formally like *probability functions* and
*Dempster-Shafer functions*, but they subscribe to a simpler
addition rule: the *degree of uncertainty* of a disjunction is
the greater of the *degrees of uncertainty* of the
parts. Similarly, the *degree of uncertainty* of a conjunction
is the smaller of the *uncertainties* of the parts.

*Ranking functions* (Spohn, 1988) supply a measure of how
surprising it would be if a claim turned out to be true, rated on a
scale from 0 (not at all surprizing) to infinity. Tautologies have
*rank* 0 and contradictions are infinitely surprizing.
Logically equivalent claims have the same *rank*. The
*rank* of a disjunction is equal to the *rank* of the
lower ranking disjunct. These functions may be used to represent a
kind of *order-of-magnitude* reasoning about the plausibility
of various claims.

See (Halpern, 2003) for a good comparative treatment of all of these approaches.

Here are the axioms for the *Plausibility Relations* and the
*Qualitative Probability Relations*.

Axioms for thePlausibility Relations

Eachplausibility relation⊆ satisfies the following axioms:

- if
Tis a tautology andKis a contradiction, it is not the case thatT⊆K;- if
Ais logically equivalent toBandCis logically equivalent toD, andA⊆C, thenB⊆D;- if
Alogically entailsB, thenA⊆B;- if
A⊆BandB⊆C, thenA⊆C.

Two sentences are defined as *equally plausible*, *A* =
*B*, just when
*A* ⊆ *B*
and
*B* ⊆ *A*.
One sentence is defined as *less plausible* than another,
*A* ⊂ *B*,
just when
*A* ⊆ *B* but not *B* ⊆ *A*.

Axioms for theQualitative Probability Relations

To get thequalitative probability relationswe add the axioms

A⊆BorB⊆ A;- if ‘(
SandA)’ and ‘(SandB)’ are both logical contradictions, thenA⊆Bjust in case (AorS) ⊆ (BorS).The typical axioms for

quantitative probabilityare as follows:

- for all sentences
S, 0 ≤P[S] ≤ 1;- if
Sis a tautology, thenP[S] = 1;- if ‘(
AandB)’ is a logical contradiction, thenP[AorB] =P[A] +P[B].

Axioms 1-6 for the *qualitative probability relations* are
probabilistically sound with respect to the quantitative probability
functions. That is, for each given probability function
*P*, define a relation ⊆ such that
*A* ⊆ *B*
*just in case*
*P*[*A*] ≤ *P*[*B*].
Then ⊆ must satisfy axioms 1-6. However, not every qualitative
probability relation that satisfies axioms 1-6 may be represented by a
probability function. To get that we must add one further axiom.

Let's say that a qualitative probability relation ⊆ is
*fine-grained* just in case it satisfies the following
axiom:

(7) if *A* ⊂ *B*, then there is some tautology
consisting of *n* sentences, (*S*_{1} or
*S*_{2} or … or *S*_{n}),
where each distinct *S*_{i} and
*S*_{j} are inconsistent with one another,
such that for each of the *S*_{i},
(*A* or *S*_{i}) ⊂ *B*.

For each *fine-grained* qualitative probability relation ⊆
there is a unique probability function *P* such that
*A* ⊆ *B*
*just in case*
*P*[*A*] ≤ *P*[*B*].

Now call a qualitative probability relation ⊆
*properly extendable* just in case it can be extended to a *fine-grained*
qualitative probability relation defined on a larger language (i.e., a language
containing additional sentences).
Then for every *properly extendable* qualitative probability relation
⊆ there is a probability function *P* such that
*A* ⊆ *B*
*just in case*
*P*[*A*] ≤ *P*[*B*]. In general a given *properly extendable* qualitative probability relation may have many such representing probability functions, corresponding to different ways of extending it to *fine-grained* qualitative probability relations.

Thus, the quantitative probability functions may be viewed as just useful
ways of representing *properly extendable* qualitiative probability
relations on a convenient numerical scale.