Supplement to Inductive Logic

Tighter Bounds on the Margin of Error

If we want strong support for hypotheses claiming more than 99.9% of all ravens are black, the following extension of Table 1 applies.

Table 1.2: Values of lower bound p on the posterior probability
m/n = 1
F[A,B] > .999
Sample-Size = n
(number of As in Sample of Bs =  m = n)
Prior Ratio: K
  400 800 1600 3200 6400 12800 25600
1 0.3305 0.5513 0.7985 0.9593 0.9983 1.0000 1.0000
2 0.1980 0.3805 0.6645 0.9219 0.9967 1.0000 1.0000
5 0.0899 0.1973 0.4421 0.8252 0.9918 1.0000 1.0000
10 0.0470 0.1094 0.2838 0.7023 0.9837 1.0000 1.0000
100 0.0049 0.0121 0.0381 0.1909 0.8578 0.9997 1.0000
1,000 0.0005 0.0012 0.0039 0.0231 0.3763 0.9973 1.0000
10,000 0.0000 0.0001 0.0004 0.0024 0.0569 0.9733 1.0000
100,000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0002 0.0060 0.7849 1.0000
1,000,000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0006 0.2674 1.0000
10,000,000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0000 0.0001 0.0352 0.9999
Pα[F[A,B] > .999  | b · F[A,S]=1 · Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=n]   ≥   p, for a range of Sample-Sizes n (from 400 to 25600), when the prior probability of any specific frequency hypothesis outside the region between .999 and 1 is no more than K times more than the lowest prior probability for any specific frequency hypothesis inside of the region between .999 and 1.

The lower right corner of the table shows that even when the vagueness or diversity sets include support functions with prior plausibilities up to ten million times higher for hypotheses asserting frequency values below .999 than for hypotheses making frequency claims between .999 and 1, a sample of 25600 black ravens will, nevertheless, pull the posterior plausibility above .9999 that “the true frequency is over .999” for every support function in the set.

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Copyright © 2012 by
James Hawthorne <hawthorne@ou.edu>

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