Supplement to Inductive Logic

The Effect on EQI of Partitioning the Outcome Space More Finely—Including Proof of the Nonnegativity of EQI

Given some experiment or observation (or series of them) c, is there any special advantage to parsing the space of possible outcomes O into more alternatives rather than fewer alternatives? Couldn't we do as well at evidentially evaluating hypotheses by parsing the space of outcomes into just a few alternatives—e.g., one possible outcome that hi says is very likely and hj says is rather unlikely, one that hi says is rather unlikely and hj says is very likely, and perhaps a third outcome on which hi and hj pretty much agree? The answer is “No !”. Parsing the space of outcomes into a larger number of empirically distinct possible outcomes always provides a better measure of evidential support.

To see this intuitively, suppose some outcome description o can be parsed into two distinct outcome descriptions, o1 and o2, where o is equivalent to (o1o2), and suppose that hi differs from hj much more on the likelihood of o1 than on the likelihood of o2. Then, intuitively, when o is found to be true, whichever of the more precise descriptions, o1 or o2, is true should make a difference as to how strong the comparative support for the two hypotheses turns out to be. Reporting whichever of o1 or o2 occurs will be more informative than simply reporting o. That is, if the outcome of the experiment is only described as o, relevant information is lost.

It turns out that EQI measures how well possible outcomes can distinguish between hypotheses in a way that reflects the intuition that a finer partition of the possible outcomes is more informative. The numerical value of EQI is always made larger by parsing the outcome space more finely, provided that the likelihoods for outcomes in the finer parsing differ at least a bit from some of the likelihoods for outcomes of the less refined parsing. This is important for our main convergence result because in that theorem we want the average value of EQI for the whole sequence of experiments and observations to be positive, and the larger the better.

The following Partition Theorem implies the Nonnegativity of EQI result as well. It show that each EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] must be non-negative; and it will be positive just in case for at least one possible outcome oku, P[oku | hj·b·ck]  ≠  P[oku | hi·b·ck]. This theorem will also show that EQI[ck | hi/hj |b] generally becomes larger whenever the outcome space is partitioned more finely. It follows immediately that the average value of EQI for a sequence of experiments or observations, EQI[cn | hi/hj | b], averaged over the sequence of observations cn, is non-negative, and must be positive if for even one of the ck that contribute to it, at least one possible outcome oku distinguishes between the two hypotheses by making P[oku | hj·b·ck]  ≠  P[oku | hi·b·ck].

Partition Theorem:
For any positive real numbers r1, r2, s1, s2:

(1) if r1/s1 > (r1+r2)/(s1+s2), then
  (r1+r2)×log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)] < r1×log[r1/s1] + r2×log[r2/s2];


(2) if r1/s1 = (r1+r2)/(s1+s2), then
  r1×log[r1/s1] + r2×log[r2/s2] = (r1+r2)×log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)].

To prove this theorem first notice that

r1/s1 = (r1+r2)/(s1+s2) iff r1s1 + r1s2 = s1r1 + s1r2
iff r1/s1 = r2/s2.

We'll draw on this little result immediately below. It is clearly relevant to the antecedent of case (2) of the theorem we want to prove.

We establish case (2) first. Suppose the antecedent of case (2) holds. Then, from the little result just proved, we have

r1 log[r1/s1] + r2 log[r2/s2]
= r1 log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)] + r2 log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)]
= (r1 + r2) log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)].

That establishes case (2).

To get case (1), consider the following function of p:

f(p) = p log[p/u] + (1−p) log[(1−p)/v],
where we only assume that u > 0, v > 0, and 0 < p < 1.

This function has its minimum value when p = u/(u+v). (This is easily verified by setting the derivative of f(p) with respect to p equal to 0 to find the minimum value of f(p); and it is easy to verified that this is a minimum rather than a maximum value.) At this minimum, where p = u/(u+v), we have

f(p) = u/(u+v) log[u+v] − v/(u+v) log[u+v]
= −log[u+v].

Thus, for all values of p other than u/(u+v),

−log[u+v] < f(p)
= p log[p/u] + (1−p) log[(1−p)/v].

That is, if pu/(u+v), −log[u+v] < p log[p/u] + (1−p) log[(1−p)/v].

Now, let p = r1/(r1+r2), let u = s1/(r1+r2), and let v = s2/(r1+r2). Plugging into the previous formula, and multiplying both sides by (r1+r2), we get:

  r1/(r1+r2) ≠ s1/(s1+s2) (i.e., equivalently, if r1/s1 ≠ (r1+r2)/(s1+s2)),
  log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)] < [r1/(r1+r2)] log[r1/s1] + (1−[r1/(r1+r2)]) log[r2/s2]
  (i.e. equivalently, (r1+r2) log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)] < r1 log[r1/s1] + r2 log[r2/s2]).

Thus, from the two equivalents, we've proved case 2:
  r1/s1 ≠ (r1+r2)/(s1+s2)),
  (r1+r2) log[(r1+r2)/(s1+s2)] < r1 log[r1/s1] + r2 log[r2/s2]).

This completes the proof of the theorem.

To apply this result to EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] recall that

EQI[ck | hi/hj | b]
= {u: P[oku | hj·b·ck] > 0} log[P[oku | hi·b·ck]/P[oku | hj·b·ck]]
             ×P[oku | hi·b·ck].

Suppose ck has m alternative outcomes oku on which both

P[oku | hj·b·ck] > 0  and  P[oku | hi·b·ck] > 0.

Let's label their likelihoods relative to hi (i.e., their likelihoods P[oku | hi·b·ck]) as r1, r2, …, rm. And let's label their likelihoods relative to hj as s1, s2, …, sm. In terms of this notation,

EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] = m

u = 1

Notice also that (r1+r2+r3+…+rm) = 1 and (s1+s2+s3+…+sm) = 1.

Now, think of EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] as generated by applying the theorem in successive steps:

0 = 1× log[1/1]
= (r1+r2+r3+…+rm)×log[(r 1+r2+r3+…+rm)/(s1+s 2+s3+…+sm)]
r1×log[r1/s1] + (r2+r3+…+rm)× log[(r2+r3+…+rm)/(s2+s 3+…+sm)]
r1×log[r1/s1] + r2×log[r2/s2] + (r3+…+rm)×log[(r3+…+rm)/(s 3+…+sm)]

u = 1
= EQI[ck | hi/hj | b].

The theorem also says that at each step equality holds just in case

ru/su = (ru+ru+1+…+rm)/(su+su+1+…+s m),

which itself holds just in case

ru/su = (ru+1+…+rm)/(su+1+…+sm).


EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] = 0

just in case

1 = (r1+r2+r3+…+rm)/(s1+s 2+s3+…+sm)
= r1/s1
= (r2+r3+…+rm)/(s2+s3+…+s m)
= r2/s2
= (r3+…+rm)/(s3+…+sm)
= r3/s3
= rm/sm.

That is,

EQI[ck | hi/hj  | b] = 0

just in case for all oku such that P[oku | hj·b] > 0 and P[oku | hi·b] > 0,

P[oku | hi·b·ck]/P[oku | hj·b·c k] = 1.


EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] > 0;

and for each successive step in partitioning the outcome space to generate EQI[ck | hi/hj | b], if

ru/su  ≠   (ru+ru+1+…+rm)/(su+su+1+…+sm),

we have the strict inequality:

(ru+ru+1+…+rm) × log[(ru+ru+1+…+rm)/(su+s u+1+…+sm)] <
  ru×log[ru/su] + (ru+1+…+rm)×log[(ru+1+…+rm)/(su+1+…+sm)].

So each such division of (oku∨oku+1∨…∨okm) into two separate tatements, oku and (oku+1∨…∨okm), adds a strictly positive contribution to the size of EQI[ck | hi/hj | b]  just when  P[oku | hi·b·ck] / P[oku | hj·b·c k]   ≠   P[(oku+1∨…∨okm) | hi·b·ck] / P[(oku+1∨…∨okm) | hj·b·c k].

[Back to Text]

Copyright © 2012 by
James Hawthorne <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007.