## Notes to Logical Constants

1. They are called
“constants” not (as Kuhn 1981 supposes) because their
interpretations do not vary across models—after all, the
“nonlogical constants” are called “constants”
too—but because they are not *variables*.

2. A *first-level
function* is a function whose arguments are objects. A
*second-level function* is a function whose arguments are
first-level functions.

3. Wittgenstein strenuously
rejects the Fregean view that the quantifiers and logical connectives
represent relations (1922, §5.42, §5.44):
“My fundamental thought
is that the ‘logical constants’ do not represent”
(§4.0312). But this cannot be the basis for a Wittgensteinian
demarcation of the logical constants, because on Wittgenstein’s
view, predicate signs do not represent either. On his view, the sign
\(\dq{R}\) in \(\dq{aRb}\) does not stand for a relation; rather, the
*fact* that \(\dq{R}\) stands between \(\dq{a}\) and \(\dq{b}\)
represents that the object represented by \(\dq{a}\) stands in a certain
relation to the object represented by \(\dq{b}\)
(cf. §3.1432). One
might say that on Wittgenstein’s theory, all signs except names
are syncategorematic.

4. Strictly speaking, it is
the grammatical constructions themselves, not the expressions involved
in them, that should be called logical or nonlogical: not the sign
\(\dq{\and}\), but the placing of a token of \(\dq{\and}\) between two
sentences. That is one lesson of Wilfrid Sellars’s (1962)
language Jumblese, which contains nonlogical predicate
*constructions* but no nonlogical predicate
*expressions*. To say \(\dq{a~\text{is green}}\) in Jumblese, one
writes the letter \(\dq{a}\) in boldface, and to say \(\dq{a~\text{is
redder than}~b}\), one writes the letter \(\dq{a}\) above the letter
\(\dq{b}\). A similar trick could be used to devise a language with no
logical expressions: for example, the disjunction of \(A\) and \(B\) might
be written as \(\dq{A^B}\), and the conjunction as \(\dq{AB}\). Although
this language would not contain specifically logical
*expressions*, it would have logical modes of construction. In
the main text we abstract from this complexity and assume that aside
from predication or functional application, each logical mode of
construction is associated with a specific expression, as is the case
in most commonly used logical calculi.

5. Quine solves the problem
of the sign for identity (“=”) by denying that it is a
logical constant (1980, 28) and showing how it can be defined or
“simulated” in a language with a finite stock of
predicates (1986, 63–64), whereas Dummett qualifies the
grammatical criterion and allows “=” to count as a logical
constant in virtue of its *semantic* features (1981, 22
n.). More precisely, he proposes that identity should count as logical
because it allows us to express “quantifier conditions”
(properties of predicates that are invariant under permutations of
elements of the domain) that we could not express otherwise.

6. “Satisfaction” is Tarski’s name for truth on an assignment of values to the variables. To specify a satisfaction condition for a sentence is to say on which assignments of values to its variables it comes out true.

7. For simplicity, I assume that all complex terms, e.g. “the mother of Abraham” or “the square of 4”, can be treated as definite descriptions, and hence as quantifiers (see Neale 1990). Otherwise recursive axioms will be needed for reference-on-an-assignment as well as for satisfaction (truth-on-an-assignment).

8. This criterion judges
*sets* of expressions together, leaving open the possibility
that (say) \(\{\textrm{A}, \textrm{B}, \textrm{C}\}\) and
\(\{\textrm{A}, \textrm{B}, \textrm{D}\}\) will both satisfy the
criterion, while \(\{\textrm{A}, \textrm{B}, \textrm{C},
\textrm{D}\}\) won’t. However, a criterion that works this way
may still be of some use in constraining the choice of logical
constants, even if it does not determine it.

9. Note that this third clause is redundant if \(\langle x, y \rangle\) is defined in the usual way as \(\{\{x\}, \{x, y\}\}\).

10. Note that if we follow
Frege and take the two truth values to be objects, then the truth
functional connectives *do* have extensions in the usual sense,
but they are not permutation invariant, because they treat the True
and the False differently from other objects.

11. \(p \circ a\) is the composition of \(a\) and \(p\): (\(p \circ a)(x) = p(a(x))\). An assignment is just a function from variables to values, so if \(a\) is an assignment, so is \(p \circ a\).

12. As McGee acknowledges,
the revised criterion still allows logical constants to behave very
differently on domains of different *cardinalities*. For
example, “it would permit a logical connective which acts like
disjunction when the size of the domain is an even successor cardinal,
like conjunction when the size of the domain is an odd successor
cardinal, and like a biconditional at limits” (577). Feferman
1999 takes this to be a strong reason for preferring a more stringent
criterion for logicality: one on which the behavior of a logical
connective on one domain connects naturally with its behavior on other
domains.

13. For a different way of motivating the permutation invariance criterion for logical constancy, starting from the “pretheoretical intuition that logical consequences are distinguished from material consequences in being necessary and formal,” see Sher 1991, ch. 3.

14. In this respect it
seems superior to Peacocke’s epistemic gloss on topic neutrality
(Peacocke 1976). Peacocke’s idea is that “\(\alpha\) is a
logical constant if \(\alpha\) is noncomplex and, for any expressions
\(\beta_1 \dots \beta_n\) on which \(\alpha\) operates to form expression
\(\alpha(\beta_1, \dots, \beta_n)\), given knowledge of which sequences
satisfy each of \(\beta_1 \dots \beta_n\) and of the satisfaction
condition of expressions of the form \(\alpha(\beta_1, \dots,
\beta_n)\), one can know a priori which sequences satisfy
\(\alpha(\beta_1, \dots, \beta_n)\), in particular without knowing the
properties and relations of the objects in the sequences” (223;
for a more carefully qualified statement, see 225–6, and for the
connection with topic neutrality, see 229). As it stands, this
criterion is too demanding, as Peacocke himself points out. One might
know which sequences satisfy \(\dq{F(x)}\) without knowing that they are
*all* the sequences, and hence without being able to determine
which sequences satisfy \(\dq{\forall x F(x)}\). Yet \(\dq{\forall}\) is
presumably a logical constant. Similarly, one might know of a sequence
\(s\) that it satisfies \(\dq{F(x)}\) and also that it satisfies
\(\dq{G(x)}\) without knowing that it satisfies \(\dq{F(x) \and G(x)}\).
For example, one might know of Venus that it satisfies “is the
morning star” and know of Venus that it satisfies “is the
evening star” without knowing of Venus that it satisfies
“is the morning star and is the evening star.” Peacocke
deals with these problems by further specifying the kind of knowledge
his imaginary knowers have (227), but his additional conditions seem
*ad hoc* (McCarthy 1981, 503–4; Sainsbury 2001,
378). Moreover, given some natural theses about what is required to
“know which object” a number, set, or syntactic string is,
Peacocke’s criterion will count “is the successor of
...”, “is the pair set formed from ... and ...”,
“is the concatenation of ... and ...”, and other
intuitively non-logical expressions as logical constants (McCarthy
1981, 506–7). McCarthy suggests that the notion of topic
neutrality Peacocke is trying to capture can be better captured by a
non-epistemic invariance criterion like the one we are here
considering.

15. The criterion would also appear to rule out operators like “Now it is the case that” and “It is actually the case that”, which pay special attention to the world or time of utterance. However, settling this question would require stating the invariance criterion in a semantic framework suitable for a logic of indexicals: one that relativizes truth to contexts as well as circumstances of evaluation (see Kaplan 1989). Such a framework would also be needed to decide whether the invariance criterion rules out counterfactual conditionals, which (on many popular accounts) are sensitive to a contextually determined similarity metric on worlds.

16. Assuming the standard definition of a logical truth as a sentence that is true in all domains and on all reinterpretations of its nonlogical constants. A modal definition of logical truth would give different results here.

17. A similar argument in (McCarthy 1981, 515) rests explicitly on the premise that logical truths should be true necessarily.

18. McGee backs up this intuitive claim with the following argument:

- If \(\dq{\#}\) is a logical constant, then \(\dq{\#\neg (0=0) \vee \neg (0=0)}\) is a logical truth (that is, it is true in every domain on every interpretation of its nonlogical constants).
- But \(\dq{\#\neg (0=0) \vee \neg (0=0)}\) entails
“water is H
_{2}O”, which is not a logical truth. - And logical truths entail only logical truths. Thus,
- \(\dq{\#}\) is not a logical constant.

The argument is problematic, because it is not clear what McGee means
by “entails” in (2) and (3). If he has in mind the
standard notion of logical implication (truth preservation on every
domain and interpretation of the nonlogical constants), then (2) is
false: \(\dq{\#\neg(0=0) \vee \neg(0=0)}\) is true on every
interpretation, but “water =
H_{2}O” is false on many
interpretations (those that assign distinct referents to the
nonlogical constants “water” and
“H_{2}O”). If he has in mind
the standard modal notion of entailment (\(A\) entails \(B\) just in
case it is impossible for \(A\) to be true and \(B\) false), then (3)
is false, for in that sense of entailment, logical truths entail all
necessary truths, not just other logical truths. Perhaps McGee has in
mind some other notion of entailment that makes both premises true,
but pending clarification on this point, the force of his argument
remains unclear.

19. An expression is a rigid designator if its denotation is constant across possible worlds. (See the entry on rigid designators.)

20. For versions of this idea, see Popper 1946–7, 1947; Kneale 1956; Prawitz 1978; Zucker 1978; Zucker and Tragesser 1978; Hacking 1979; Peacocke 1987; Kremer 1988; Dummett 1991; Koslow 1992, 1999; Došen 1994; Hodes 2004; and Feferman 2015.

21. The premise of this argument is far from obvious. The notion of a valid inference (and hence of an inference rule) is a pretty sophisticated one, and its connection to norms for reasoning is not as straightforward as is sometimes assumed. For example, knowledge that \(Y\) can be validly inferred from \(X\) does not license one to believe \(Y\) if one believes \(X\); it may be more rational to abandon one’s belief in \(X\), or to take up a sceptical position towards both \(X\) and \(Y\) (see Harman 1984). The technical practice of “inference” that the introduction and elimination rules govern is not to be confused with “inference” in its more generic sense—the formation of beliefs on the basis of other beliefs. But unless these two senses of “inference” are conflated, it is not clear why we should assume that a capacity for articulate thought and reasoning implies an understanding of the former as well as the latter.

22. Gentzen (1935, §5.13; 1969, 80) holds that a constant is defined by its introduction rules, and that the elimination rules are just consequences of these. This idea is developed further in Prawitz 1978 and Dummett 1991. Koslow (1992, 1999) takes the elimination rules as fundamental, defining each logical operation as the weakest object in an implication structure that satisfies the elimination rule. Kneale (1956, 257) uses two-way (reversible) sequent rules, both left and right. Hodes (2004, 143) takes the introduction rules to be fundamental for some constants, the elimination rules for others (and in some cases, he holds, neither is fundamental).

23.
Popper (1947)
and Koslow (1992, 1999) give genuine explicit definitions, not of the
constants themselves, but of metalinguistic predicates like “is a
negation of \(A\)” and “is a disjunction of \(A\) and
\(B\).” For example, an item \(A\) in an implicational
structure counts as a “disjunction” of two other items \(B\) and
\(C\) iff it is the weakest item in that structure that is implied
by both \(B\) and \(C\). This definition does not guarantee
that in a given implicational structure there will *be* a
disjunction of any two arbitrary items. For an excellent critical
discussion of Popper’s project, see Schroeder-Heister 1984.
On Došen’s (1994) view, “[a] constant is logical if, and only if, it can
be ultimately analysed in structural terms” (281). An *analysis*
of a constant α of a language *L* in a conceptually more
“basic” language *M* is an equivalence between a sentence of
*M* + {α} containing a single occurrence of α and a
sentence of *M* not containing α, such that “[f]rom the
equivalence …and from the understanding of *M* and *L*
minus α, we can infer every sentence of *L* analytically
true in *L* and no sentence of *L* not analytically true
in *L*” (1994, 282; for a related idea see Kremer 1988, 65).

24. Warmbrod’s approach is to paraphrase modal claims into first-order claims about relations between possible worlds, while Harman’s is to introduce a non-logical predicate “is necessary” and a logical operator that forms names of propositions. It is also possible to treat the sentential operators “necessarily” and “possibly” as non-logical operators in an intensional language (Kuhn 1981).

25. I focus on arguments for the sake of brevity. Logic is of course also concerned with properties of sentences (logical truth and falsity, provability), sets of sentences (consistency), and sequences of sentences (proof); and with relations between sentences (logical equivalence and implication) and between sets of sentences and sentences (logical consequence and independence).

26. Frege seems to have been sceptical about the possibility of proving logical invalidity and independence precisely because he saw that such proofs would not be possible without a principled demarcation of logical constants, which he did not see how to provide (Frege 1906, 429; and for discussion, Ricketts 1997).

27.
An
alternative response to the Demarcater’s challenge, one that does not
rely on the analytic-synthetic distinction, goes like this. Although
logic is the study of validity *as such*, it should not be
expected to pronounce on every question about the validity of
particular arguments. After all, physics can justly be described as the
study of space, time, matter, and energy, even though there are many
questions concerning the distribution of matter and energy in spacetime
that physics cannot answer. (For example: was there an olive on this
marble slab two thousand years ago this day?) Logicians answer
*general* questions about validity, and although often the
answers to these general questions settle questions about the validity
of particular arguments, there is no reason to think they should settle
all such questions (Read 1994). Alternatively, the Debunker might argue
that what is distinctive of logic is its use of certain
*methods* (formalization, proof, counterexample) to investigate
validity.