Logical Truth

First published Tue May 30, 2006; substantive revision Mon Jun 7, 2010

On any view, logic has as one of its goals to characterize (and give us practical means to tell apart) a peculiar set of truths, the logical truths, of which the following English sentences are paradigmatic examples:

(1) If death is bad only if life is good, and death is bad, then life is good.
(2) If no desire is voluntary and some beliefs are desires, then some beliefs are not voluntary.
(3) If Drasha is a cat and all cats are mysterious, then Drasha is mysterious.

As it turns out, it is very hard to think of universally accepted ideas about what the generic properties of logical truths are or should be. A widespread, perhaps universally accepted idea is that part of what distinguishes logical truths from other kinds of truths is that logical truths have a yet to be fully understood modal force. It is typical to hold that, in some sense or senses of “could”, a logical truth could not be false or, alternatively, that in some sense or senses of “must”, a logical truth must be true. But there is little if any agreement about how the relevant modality should be understood.

Another widespread idea is that part of what distinguishes logical truths is that they are in some sense yet to be fully understood “formal”. That a logical truth is formal implies at the very least that all the sentences which are appropriate replacement instances of its logical form are logical truths too. In this context, the logical form of a sentence S is supposed to be a certain schema determined uniquely by S, a schema of which S is a replacement instance, and of which sentences with the same form as S are replacement instances too. A form has at the very least the property that the expressions in it which are not schematic letters (the “logical expressions”) are widely applicable across different areas of discourse. Among people who accept the idea of formality there would be wide agreement that the forms of (1), (2) and (3) would be something like (1′), (2′) and (3′) respectively:

(1′) If a is P only if b is Q, and a is P, then b is Q.
(2′) If no Q is R and some Ps are Qs, then some Ps are not R.
(3′) If a is a P and all Ps are Q, then a is Q.

(1′), (2′) and (3′) do seem to give rise to logical truths for all appropriate replacements of the letters “a”, “b”, “P”, “Q”, and “R”. And expressions such as “if”, “and”, “some”, “all”, etc., which are paradigmatic logical expressions, do seem to be widely applicable across different areas of discourse. But the idea that logical truths are or should be formal is certainly not universally accepted. And even among those who accept it, there is little if any agreement about what generic criteria determine the form of an arbitrary sentence.[1]

A remarkable fact about logical truth is that many have thought it plausible that the set of logical truths of certain rich formalized languages is characterizable in terms of concepts of standard mathematics. In particular, on some views the set of logical truths of a language of that kind is always the set of sentences of the language derivable in a certain calculus. On other, more widespread views, the set of logical truths of a language of that kind can be identified with the set of sentences that are valid across a certain range of mathematical interpretations (where validity is something related to but different from the condition that all the sentences that are replacement instances of its form be true too; see below, section 2.3). One main achievement of early mathematical logic was precisely to show how to characterize notions of derivability and validity in terms of concepts of standard mathematics. (Sections 2.2 and 2.3 give a basic description of the mathematically characterized notions of derivability and validity, with references to other entries.)

In part 1 of this entry we will describe in very broad outline the main existing views about how to understand the ideas of modality and formality relevant to logical truth. (A more detailed treatment of these views is available in other entries mentioned below, and especially in the entries on the analytic/synthetic distinction and logical constants.) In part 2 we will describe, also in outline, a particular set of philosophical issues that arise when one considers the attempted mathematical characterizations of logical truth. The question of whether or in what sense these characterizations are correct is bound with the question of what is or should be our specific understanding of the ideas of modality and formality.[2]

1. The Nature of Logical Truth

1.1 Modality

As we said above, it seems to be universally accepted that, in some sense or other, paradigmatic logical truths could not be false, or that they must be true. This is also seen as a requirement on logical truths quite generally, paradigmatic or not. But as we also said, there is virtually no agreement about the specific character of the pertinent modality.

Except among those who reject the notion of logical form altogether, there is wide agreement that at least part of the modal force of a logical truth is due to its being a particular case of a universal generalization over the possible values of the schematic letters in “formal” schemata like (1′)-(3′). (These values may but need not be expressions.) On what is possibly the oldest way of understanding the logical modality, that modal force is entirely due to this property: thus, for example, on this view to say that (1) must be true can only mean that (1) is a particular case of the true universal generalization “For all suitable P, Q, a and b, if a is a P only if b is a Q, and a is a P, then b is a Q”. On one traditional (but not uncontroversial) interpretation, Aristotle's claim that the conclusion of a syllogismos must be true if the premises are true ought to be understood in this way. In a famous passage of the Prior Analytics, he says: “A syllogismos is speech (logos) in which, certain things being supposed, something other than the things supposed results of necessity (ex anankes) because they are so” (24b18–20). Think of (2) as a syllogismos in which the “things supposed” are (2a) and (2b), and in which the thing that “results of necessity” is (2c):

(2a) No desire is voluntary.
(2b) Some beliefs are desires.
(2c) Some beliefs are not voluntary.

On the interpretation we are describing, Aristotle's view is that to say that (2c) results of necessity from (2a) and (2b) is to say that (2) is a particular case of the true universal generalization “For all suitable P, Q and R, if no Q is R and some Ps are Qs, then some Ps are not R”. For this interpretation see e.g. Alexander of Aphrodisias, 208.16 (quoted by Łukasiewicz 1957, §41), Bolzano (1837, §155) and Łukasiewicz (1957, §5).

In many other ancient and medieval logicians, “must” claims are understood as universal generalizations about actual items (even if they are not always understood as universal generalizations on “formal” schemata). Especially prominent is Diodorus' view that a proposition is necessary just in case it is true at all times (see Mates 1961, III, §3). Note that this makes sense of the idea that (2) must be true but, say, “People watch TV” could be false, for surely this sentence was not true in Diodorus' time. Diodorus' view appears to have been very common in the Middle Ages, when authors like William of Sherwood and Walter Burley seem to have understood the perceived necessity of conditionals like (2) as truth at all times (see Knuuttila 1982, pp. 348–9). An understanding of necessity as eternity is frequent also in later authors; see e.g., Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, B 184. In favor of the mentioned interpretation of Aristotle and of the Diodorean view it might be pointed out that we often use modal locutions to stress the consequents of conditionals that follow from mere universal generalizations about the actual world, as in “If gas prices go up, necessarily the economy slows down”.

Many authors have thought that views of this sort do not account for the full strength of the modal import of logical truths. A nowadays very common, but (apparently) late view in the history of philosophy, is that the necessity of a logical truth does not merely imply that some generalization about actual items holds, but also implies that the truth would have been true at a whole range of counterfactual circumstances. Leibniz assigned this property to necessary truths such as those of logic and geometry, and seems to have been one of the first to speak of the counterfactual circumstances as “possible universes” or worlds (see the letter to Bourguet, pp. 572–3, for a crisp statement of his views that contrasts them with the views in the preceding paragraph; Knuuttila 1982, pp. 353 ff. detects the earliest transparent talk of counterfactual circumstances and of necessity understood as at least implying truth in all of these in Duns Scotus and Buridan; see also the entry on medieval theories of modality). In contemporary writings the understanding of necessity as truth in all counterfactual circumstances, and the view that logical truths are necessary in this sense, are widespread—although many, perhaps most, authors adopt “reductivist” views of modality that see talk of counterfactual circumstances as no more than disguised talk about certain actualized (possibly abstract) items, such as linguistic descriptions. Even Leibniz seems to have thought of his “possible universes” as ideas in the mind of God. (See Lewis 1986 for an introduction to the contemporary polemics in this area.)

However, even after Leibniz and up to the present, many logicians seem to have avoided a commitment to a strong notion of necessity as truth in all (actual and) counterfactual circumstances. Thus Bolzano, in line with his interpretation of Aristotle mentioned above, characterizes necessary propositions as those whose negation is incompatible with purely general truths (see Bolzano 1837, §119). Frege says that “the apodictic judgment [i.e., roughly, the judgment whose content begins with a ”necessarily“ governing the rest of the content] is distinguished from the assertory in that it suggests the existence of universal judgments from which the proposition can be inferred, while in the case of the assertory one such a suggestion is lacking” (Frege 1879, §4). Tarski is even closer to the view traditionally attributed to Aristotle, for it is pretty clear that for him to say that e.g. (2c) “must” be true if (2a) and (2b) are true is to say that (2) is a particular case of the “formal” generalization “For all suitable P, Q and R, if no Q is R and some Ps are Qs, then some Ps are not R” (see Tarski 1936a, pp. 411, 415, 417, or the corresponding passages in Tarski 1936b; see also Ray 1996). Quine is known for his explicit rejection of any modality that cannot be understood in terms of universal generalizations about the actual world (see especially Quine 1963). In some of these cases, this attitude is explained by a distrust of notions that have not reached a fully respectable scientific status, like the strong modal notions; it is frequently accompanied in such authors, who are often practicing logicians, by the proposal to characterize logical truth as a species of validity (in the sense of 2.3 below).

On a recent view developed by Beall and Restall (2000, 2006), called by them “logical pluralism”, the concept of logical truth carries a commitment to the idea that a logical truth is true in all of a range of items or “cases” (and its necessity consists in the truth of such a general claim; see Beall and Restall 2006, p. 24). However, the concept of logical truth does not single out a unique range of “cases” as privileged in determining an extension for the concept; instead, there are many such equally acceptable ranges and corresponding extensions, which may be chosen as a function of contextual interests.

Yet another sense in which it has been thought that truths like (1)-(3), and logical truths quite generally, “could” not be false or “must” be true is epistemic. It is an old observation, going at least as far back as Plato, that some truths count as intuitively known by us even in cases where we don't seem to have any empirical grounds for them. Truths that are knowable on non-empirical grounds are called a priori (an expression that begins to be used with this meaning around the time of Leibniz; see e.g. his “Primæ Veritates”, p. 518). The axioms and theorems of mathematics, the lexicographic and stipulative definitions, and also the paradigmatic logical truths, have been given as examples. If it is accepted that logical truths are a priori, it is natural to think that they must be true or could not be false at least partly in the strong sense that their negations are incompatible with what we are able to know non-empirically.

Assuming that such a priori knowledge exists in some way or other, much recent philosophy has occupied itself with the issue of how it is possible. One traditional (“rationalist”) view is that the mind is equipped with a special capacity to perceive truths through the examination of the relations between pure ideas or concepts, and that the truths reached through the correct operation of this capacity count as known a priori. (See, e.g., Leibniz's “Discours de Métaphysique”, §§23 ff.; Russell 1912, p. 105; BonJour 1998 is a very recent example of a view of this sort.) An opposing traditional (“empiricist”) view is that there is no reason to postulate that capacity, or even that there are reasons not to postulate it, such as that it is “mysterious”. (See the entry on rationalism vs. empiricism.) Some philosophers, empiricists and otherwise, have attempted to explain a priori knowledge as arising from some sort of convention or tacit agreement to assent to certain sentences (such as (1)) and use certain rules. Hobbes in his objections to Descartes' Meditations (“Third Objections”, IV, p. 608) proposes a wide-ranging conventionalist view. The later Wittgenstein (on one interpretation) and Carnap are distinguished proponents of “tacit agreement” and conventionalist views (see e.g. Wittgenstein 1978, I.9, I.142; Carnap 1939, §12, and 1963, p. 916, for informal exposition of Carnap's views; see also Coffa 1991, chs. 14 and 17). Strictly speaking, Wittgenstein and Carnap think that logical truths do not express propositions at all, and are just vacuous sentences that for some reason or other we find useful to manipulate; thus it is only in a somewhat diminished sense that we can speak of (a priori) knowledge of them. However, in typical recent exponents of “tacit agreement” and conventionalist views, such as Boghossian (1997), the claim that logical truths do not express propositions is rejected, and it is accepted that the existence of the agreement provides full-blown a priori knowledge of those propositions.

The “rational capacity” view and the “conventionalist” view agree that, in a broad sense, the epistemic ground of logical truths resides in our ability to analyze the meanings of their expressions, be these understood as conventions or as objective ideas. For this reason it can be said that they explain apriority by means of analyticity. (See the entry on the analytic/synthetic distinction.) Kant's view in the Critique of Pure Reason, on what seems the most reasonable interpretation, differs from those views. For Kant, the logical expressions do not express meanings in the way that non-logical expressions express meanings or concepts (see Critique of Pure Reason, B 186; several of the Kantian categories correspond approximately to the “significations” of some paradigmatic logical expressions). In particular they do not express anything susceptible of analysis, and hence analysis cannot provide the grounds for thinking of a logical truth as true. (Leibniz's explicit view, on the other hand, was that the meanings of all expressions, including particles of all kinds, were susceptible of analysis, and that all such analyses constitute grounds for a priori demonstrations; see e.g. his “Analysis Linguarum”, pp. 351–2.) For Kant, syllogisms such as (2) are a priori but synthetic. Their apriority is explained by the fact that they are required by the cognitive structure of the transcendental subject, and specifically by the forms of judgment and the pure categories of the understanding. (See a similar interpretation in Maddy 1999, who nevertheless emphasizes the fact that logical truths are for Kant independent of the forms of intuition, and hence are not synthetic in the strongest possible sense; this leads her to attribute to Kant the view that they are analytic in Maddy 2007, p. 221. On this set of issues and for contrasting views see also Hintikka 1965, Parsons 1969 and MacFarlane 2002.)

The early Wittgenstein shares with Kant the idea that the logical expressions do not express meanings in the way that non-logical expressions do (see 1921, 4.0312). Consistently with this view, he claims that logical truths do not “say” anything (1921, 6.11). But he seems to reject conventionalist and “tacit agreement” views (1921, 6.124, 6.1223). It is not that logical truths do not say anything because they are mere instruments for some sort of extrinsically useful manipulation; rather, they “show” the “logical properties” that the world has independently of our decisions (1921, 6.12, 6.13). It is unclear how apriority is explainable in this framework. Wittgenstein calls the logical truths analytic (1921, 6.11), and says that “one can recognize in the symbol alone that they are true” (1921, 6.113). He seems to have in mind the fact that one can “see” that a logical truth of truth-functional logic must be valid by inspection of a suitable representation of its truth-functional content (1921, 6.1203, 6.122). But the extension of the idea to quantificational logic is problematic, despite Wittgenstein's efforts to reduce quantificational logic to truth-functional logic; as we now know, there is no algorithm for deciding if a quantificational sentence is valid. What is perhaps more important, Wittgenstein gives no discernible explanation of why in principle all the “logical properties” of the world should be susceptible of being reflected in an adequate notation.

Against the “rational capacity”, “conventionalist”, Kantian and early Wittgensteinian views, other philosophers, especially radical empiricists and naturalists (not to speak of epistemological skeptics), have rejected the claim that a priori knowledge exists (hence by implication also the claim that analytic propositions exist), and they have proposed instead that there is only an illusion of apriority. Often this rejection has been accompanied by criticism of the other views. J.S. Mill thought that propositions like (2) seem a priori merely because they are particular cases of early and very familiar generalizations that we derive from experience, like “For all suitable P, Q and R, if no Q is R and some Ps are Qs, then some Ps are not R” (see Mill 1843, bk. II, ch. viii). Bolzano held a similar view (see Bolzano 1837, §315). Quine (1936, §III) famously criticized the Hobbesian view noting that since the logical truths are potentially infinite, our ground for them must not lie just in a finite number of explicit conventions, for logical rules are presumably needed to derive an infinite number of logical truths from a finite number of conventions (a point derived from Carroll 1895). Later Quine (especially 1954) criticized Carnap's conventionalist view, largely on the grounds that there seems to be no non-vague distinction between conventional truths and truths that are tacitly left open for refutation, and that to the extent that some truths are the product of convention or “tacit agreement”, such agreement is characteristic of many scientific hypotheses and other postulations that seem paradigmatically non-analytic. (See the entry on Grice, and Strawson 1956 and Carnap 1963 for reactions to these criticisms.) Quine (especially 1951) also argued that accepted sentences in general, including paradigmatic logical truths, can be best seen as something like hypotheses that are used to deal with experience, any of which can be rejected if this helps make sense of the empirical world (see Putnam 1968 for a similar view and a purported example). On this view there cannot be strictly a priori grounds for any truth. Two recent subtle anti-aprioristic positions are Maddy's (2002, 2007) and Azzouni's (2006, 2008). For Maddy, logical truths are a posteriori, but they cannot be disconfirmed merely by observation and experiment, since they form part of very basic ways of thinking of ours, deeply embedded in our conceptual machinery (a conceptual machinery that is structurally similar to Kant's postulated transcendental organization of the understanding). Similarly, for Azzouni logical truths are equally a posteriori, though our sense that they must be true comes from their being psychologically deeply ingrained; unlke Maddy, however, Azzouni thinks that the logical rules by which we reason are opaque to introspection.

1.2 Formality

On most views, even if it were true that logical truths are true in all counterfactual circumstances, a priori, and analytic, this would not give sufficient conditions for a truth to be a logical truth. On most views, a logical truth also has to be in some sense “formal”, and this implies at least that all truths that are replacement instances of its form are logical truths too (and hence, on the assumption of the preceding sentence, true in all counterfactual circumstances, a priori, and analytic). To use a slight modification of an example of Albert of Saxony (quoted by Bocheński 1956, §30.07), “If a widow runs, then a female runs” should be true in all counterfactual circumstances, a priori, and analytic if any truth is. However, “If a widow runs, then a log runs” is a replacement instance of its form, and in fact it even has the same form on any view of logical form (something like “If a P Qs, then an R Qs”), but it is not even true simpliciter. So on most views, “If a widow runs, then a female runs” is not a logical truth.

For philosophers who accept the idea of formality, as we said above, the logical form of a sentence is a certain schema in which the expressions that are not schematic letters are widely applicable across different areas of discourse.[3] If the schema is the form of a logical truth, all of its replacement instances are logical truths. The idea that logic is especially concerned with (replacement instances of) schemata is of course evident beginning with Aristotle and the Stoics, in all of whom the word usually translated by “figure” is precisely schema. In Aristotle a figure is actually an even more abstract form of a group of what we would now call “schemata”, such as (2′). Our schemata are closer to what in the Aristotelian syllogistic are the moods; but there seems to be no word for “mood” in Aristotle (except possibly ptoseon in 42b30 or tropon in 43a10; see Smith 1989, pp. 148–9), and thus no general reflection on the notion of formal schemata. There is explicit reflection on the contrast between the formal schemata or moods and the matter (hyle) of syllogismoi in Alexander of Aphrodisias (53.28ff., quoted by Bocheński 1956, §24.06), and there has been ever since. The matter are the values of the schematic letters.

The idea that the non-schematic expressions in logical forms, i.e. the logical expressions, are widely applicable across different areas of discourse is also present from the beginning of logic, and recurs in all the great logicians. It appears indirectly in many passages from Aristotle, such as the following: “All the sciences are related through the common things (I call common those which they use in order to demonstrate from them, but not those that are demonstrated in them or those about which something is demonstrated); and logic is related to them all, as it is a science that attempts to demonstrate universally the common things” (Posterior Analytics, 77a26–9); “we don't need to take hold of the things of all refutations, but only of those that are characteristic of logic; for these are common to every technique and ability” (Sophistical Refutations, 170a34–5). (In these texts “logic” is an appropriate translation of dialektike; see Kneale and Kneale 1962, I, §3, who inform us that logike is used for the first time with its current meaning in Alexander of Aphrodisias.) Frege says that “the firmest proof is obviously the purely logical, which, prescinding from the particularity of things, is based solely on the laws on which all knowledge rests” (1879, p. 48; see also 1885, where the universal applicability of the arithmetical concepts is taken as a sign of their logicality). The same idea is conspicuous as well in Tarski (1941, ch. II, §6).

That logical expressions include paradigmatic cases like “if”, “and”, “some”, “all”, etc., and that they must be widely applicable across different areas of discourse is what we might call “the minimal thesis” about logical expressions. But beyond this there is little if any agreement about what generic feature makes an expression logical, and hence about what determines the logical form of a sentence. Most authors sympathetic to the idea that logic is formal have tried to go beyond the minimal thesis. It would be generally agreed that being widely applicable across different areas of discourse is only a necessary, not sufficient property of logical expressions; for example, presumably most prepositions are widely applicable, but they are not logical expressions on any implicit generic notion of a logical expression. Attempts to enrich the notion of a logical expression have typically sought to provide further properties that collectively amount to necessary and sufficient conditions for an expression to be logical.

One idea that has been used in such characterizations, and that is also present in Aristotle, is that logical expressions do not, strictly speaking, signify anything; or, that they do not signify anything in the way that substantives, adjectives and verbs signify something. “Logic [dialektike] is not a science of determined things, or of any one genus” (Posterior Analytics, 77a32–3). We saw that the idea was still present in Kant and the early Wittgenstein. It reemerged in the Middle Ages. The main sense of the word syncategorematic as applied to expressions was roughly this semantic sense (see Kretzmann 1982, pp. 212 ff.). Buridan and other late medieval logicians proposed that categorematic expressions constitute the “matter” of sentences while the syncategorematic expressions constitute their “form” (see the text quoted by Bocheński 1956, §26.11). (In a somewhat different, earlier, grammatical sense of the word, syncategorematic expressions were said to be those that cannot be used as subjects or predicates in categorical propositions; see Kretzmann 1982, pp. 211–2.) The idea of syncategorematicity is somewhat imprecise, but there are serious doubts that it can serve to characterize the idea of a logical expression, whatever this may be. Most prepositions and adverbs are presumably syncategorematic, but they are also presumably non-logical expressions. Conversely, predicates such as “are identical”, “is identical with itself”, “is both identical and not identical with itself”, etc., which are resolutely treated as logical in recent logic, are presumably categorematic. (They are of course categorematic in the grammatical sense, in which prepositions and adverbs are equally clearly syncategorematic.)

Most other proposals have tried to delineate in some other way the Aristotelian idea that the logical expressions have some kind of “insubstantial” meaning, so as to use it as a necessary and sufficient condition for logicality. One recent suggestion is that logical expressions are those that do not allow us to distinguish different individuals. One way in which this has been made precise is through the characterization of logical expressions as those whose extension or denotation over any particular domain of individuals is invariant under permutations of that domain. (See Tarski and Givant 1987, p. 57, and Tarski 1966; for related proposals see also McCarthy 1981, Sher 1991, ch. 3, McGee 1996, Feferman 1999 and Bonnay 2008, among others.) A permutation of a domain is a one-to-one correspondence between the domain and itself. For example, if D is the domain {Aristotle, Caesar, Napoleon, Kripke}, one permutation is the correspondence that assigns each man to himself; another is the correspondence P that assigns Caesar to Aristotle (in mathematical notation, P(Aristotle)=Caesar), Napoleon to Caesar, Kripke to Napoleon, and Aristotle to Kripke. That the extension of an expression over a domain is invariant under a permutation of that domain means that the induced image of that extension under the permutation is the extension itself (the “induced image” of an extension under a permutation Q is what the extension becomes when in place of each object o one puts the object Q(o)). The extension of “philosopher” over D is not invariant under the permutation P above, for that extension is {Aristotle, Kripke}, whose induced image under P is {Caesar, Aristotle}. This is favorable to the proposal, for “philosopher” is certainly not widely applicable, and so non-logical on most views. On the other hand, the predicate “are identical” has as its extension over D the set of pairs {<Aristotle, Aristotle>, <Caesar, Caesar>, <Napoleon, Napoleon>, <Kripke, Kripke>}; its induced image under P, and under any other permutation of D, is that very same set of pairs (as the reader may check); so again this is favorable to the proposal. (Other paradigmatic logical expressions receive more complicated extensions over domains, but the extensions they receive are invariant under permutations. For example, on one usual way of understanding the extension of “and” over a domain, this is the function that assigns, to each pair <S1, S2>, where S1 and S2 are sets of infinite sequences of objects drawn from D, the intersection of S1 and S2; and this function is permutation invariant.) One problem with the proposal is that many expressions that seem clearly non-logical, because they are not widely applicable, are nevertheless invariant under permutations, and thus unable to distinguish different individuals. The simplest examples are perhaps non-logical predicates that have an empty extension over any domain, and hence have empty induced images as well. “Male widow” is one example; versions of it can be used as counterexamples to the different versions of the idea of logicality as permutation invariance (see Gómez-Torrente 2002), and it's unclear that the proponent of the idea can avoid the problem in any non ad hoc way.

Another popular recent way of delineating the Aristotelian intuition of the semantic “insubstantiality” of logical expressions appeals to the concept of “pure inferentiality”. The idea is that logical expressions are those whose meaning, in some sense, is given by “purely inferential” rules. (See Kneale 1956, Hacking 1979, Peacocke 1987, Hodes 2004, among others.) A necessary property of purely inferential rules is that they regulate only inferential transitions between verbal items, not between extra-verbal assertibility conditions and verbal items, or between verbal items and actions licensed by those items. A certain inferential rule licenses you to say “It rains” when it rains, but it's not “purely inferential”. A rule that licenses you to say “A is a female whose husband died before her” when someone says “A is a widow”, however, is not immediately disqualified as purely inferential. Now, presumably in some sense the meaning of “widow” is given by this last rule together perhaps with the converse rule, that licenses you to say “A is a widow” when someone says “A is a female whose husband died before her”. But “widow” is not a logical expression, since it's not widely applicable; so one needs to postulate more necessary properties that “purely inferential” rules ought to satisfy. A number of such conditions are postulated in the relevant literature (see e.g. Belnap 1962 (a reply to Prior 1960), Hacking 1979 and Hodes 2004). However, even when the notion of pure inferentiality is strengthened in these ways, problems remain. Most often the proposal is that an expression is logical just in case certain purely inferential rules give its whole meaning, including its sense, or the set of aspects of its use that need to be mastered in order to understand it (as in Kneale 1956, Peacocke 1987 and Hodes 2004). However, it seems clear that some paradigmatic logical expressions have extra sense attached to them that is not codifiable purely inferentially. For example, inductive reasoning involving “all” seems to be part of the sense of this expression, but it's hard to see how it could be codified by purely inferential rules (as noted by Sainsbury 1991, pp. 316–7; see also Dummett 1991, ch. 12). A different version of the proposal consists in saying that an expression is logical just in case certain purely inferential rules that are part of its sense suffice to determine its extension (as in Hacking 1979). But it seems clear that if the extension of, say, “are identical” is determined by a certain set of purely inferential rules that are part of its sense, then the extension of “are identical and are not male widows” is equally determined by the same rules, which arguably form part of its sense; yet “are identical and are not male widows” is not a logical expression (see Gómez-Torrente 2002).

In view of problems of these and other sorts, some philosophers have proposed that the concept of a logical expression is not associated with necessary and sufficient conditions, but only with some necessary condition related to the condition of wide applicability, such as the condition of “being very relevant for the systematization of scientific reasoning” (see Warmbrōd 1999 for a position of this type). Others (Gómez-Torrente 2002) have proposed that there may be a set of necessary and sufficient conditions, if these are not much related to the idea of semantic “insubstantiality” and are instead pragmatic and suitably vague; for example, many expressions are excluded directly by the condition of wide applicability; and prepositions are presumably excluded by some such implicit condition as “a logical expression must be one whose study is useful for the resolution of significant problems and fallacies in reasoning”. To be sure, these proposals give up on the extended intuition of semantic “insubstantiality”, and may be somewhat unsatisfactory for that reason.

Some philosophers have reacted even more radically to the problems of usual characterizations, claiming that the distinction between logical and non-logical expressions must be vacuous, and thus rejecting the notion of logical form altogether. (See e.g. Orayen 1989, ch. 4, §2.2; Etchemendy 1990, ch. 9; Read 1994; Priest 2001.) These philosophers typically think of logical truth as a notion roughly equivalent to that of analytic truth simpliciter. But they are even more liable to the charge of giving up on extended intuitions than the proposals of the previous paragraph.

For more thorough treatments of the ideas of formality and of a logical expression see the entry logical constants, and MacFarlane 2000.

2. The Mathematical Characterization of Logical Truth

2.1 Formalization

One important reason for the successes of modern logic is its use of what has been called “formalization”. This term is usually employed to cover several distinct (though related) phenomena, all of them present in Frege (1879). One of these is the use of a completely specified set of artificial symbols to which the logician unambiguously assigns meanings, related to the meanings of corresponding natural language expressions, but much more clearly delimited and stripped from the notes that in those natural language expressions seem irrelevant to truth-conditional content; this is especially true of symbols meant to represent the logical expressions of natural language. Another phenomenon is the stipulation of a completely precise grammar for the formulae construed out of the artificial symbols, formulae that will be “stripped” versions of correlate sentences in natural language; this grammar amounts to an algorithm for producing formulae starting from the basic symbols. A third phenomenon is the postulation of a deductive calculus with a very clear specification of axioms and rules of inference for the artificial formulae (see the next section); such a calculus is intended to represent in some way deductive reasoning with the correlates of the formulae, but unlike ordinary deductions, derivations in the calculus contain no steps that are not definite applications of the specified rules of inference.

Instead of attempting to characterize the logical truths of a natural language like English, the Fregean logician attempts to characterize the artificial formulae that are “stripped” correlates of those logical truths in a Fregean formalized language. In first-order Fregean formalized languages, among these formulae one finds artificial correlates of (1), (2) and (3), things like

((Bad(death) → Good(life)) & Bad(death)) → Good(life).
(∀x(Desire(x) → ¬Voluntary(x)) & ∃x(Belief(x) & Desire(x))) → ∃x(Belief(x) & ¬Voluntary(x)).
(Cat(drasha) & ∀x(Cat(x) → Mysterious(x))) → Mysterious(drasha).

(See the entry on logic, classical.) Fregean formalized languages include also classical higher-order languages. (See the entry on logic, second-order and higher-order.) The logical expressions in these languages are standardly taken to be the symbols for the truth-functions, the quantifiers, identity and other symbols definable in terms of those (but there are dissenting views on the status of the higher-order quantifiers; see 2.4.3 below).

The restriction to artificial formulae raises a number of questions about the exact value of the Fregean enterprise for the demarcation of logical truths in natural language; much of this value depends on how many and how important are perceived to be the notes stripped from the natural language expressions that are correlates of the standard logical expressions of formalized languages. But whatever one's view of the exact value of formalization, there is little doubt that it has been very illuminating for logical purposes. One reason is that it's often clear that the stripped notes are really irrelevant to truth-conditional content (this is especially true of the use of natural language logical expressions for doing mathematics). Another of the reasons is that the fact that the grammar and meaning of the artificial formulae is so well delimited has permitted the development of proposed characterizations of logical truth that use only concepts of standard mathematics. This in turn has allowed the study of the characterized notions by means of standard mathematical techniques. The next two sections describe the two main approaches to characterization in broad outline.

2.2 Derivability

We just noted that the Fregean logician's formalized grammar amounts to an algorithm for producing formulae from the basic artificial symbols. This is meant very literally. As was clear to mathematical logicians from very early on, the basic symbols can be seen as (or codified by) natural numbers, and the formation rules in the artificial grammar can be seen as (or codified by) simple computable arithmetical operations. The grammatical formulae can then be seen as (or codified by) the numbers obtainable from the basic numbers after some finite series of applications of the operations, and thus their set is characterizable in terms of concepts of arithmetic and set theory (in fact arithmetic suffices, with the help of some tricks).

Exactly the same is true of the set of formulae that are derivable in a formalized deductive calculus. A formula F is derivable in a Fregean calculus C just in case F is obtainable from the axioms of C after some finite series of applications of the rules of inference of C. But the axioms are certain formulae built by the process of grammatical formation, so they can be seen as (or codified by) certain numbers; and the rules of inference can again be seen as (or codified by) certain computable arithmetical operations. So the derivable formulae can be seen as (or codified by) the numbers obtainable from the axiom numbers after some finite series of applications of the inference operations, and thus their set is again characterizable in terms of concepts of standard mathematics (again arithmetic suffices).

In the time following Frege's revolution, there appears to have been a widespread belief that the set of logical truths of any Fregean language could be characterized as the set of formulae derivable in some suitably chosen calculus (hence, essentially, as the set of numbers obtainable by certain arithmetical operations). Frege himself says, speaking of the higher-order language in his “Begriffsschrift”, that through formalization (in the third sense above) “we arrive at a small number of laws in which, if we add those contained in the rules, the content of all the laws is included, albeit in an undeveloped state” (Frege 1879, §13). The idea follows straightforwardly from Russell's conception of mathematics and logic as identical (see Russell 1903, ch. I, §10; Russell 1920, pp. 194–5) and his thesis that “by the help of ten principles of deduction and ten other premises of a general logical nature (…), all mathematics can be strictly and formally deduced” (Russell 1903, ch. I, §4). See also Bernays (1930, p. 239): “[through formalization] it becomes evident that all logical inference (…) can be reduced to a limited number of logical elementary processes that can be exactly and completely enumerated”. In the opening paragraphs of his paper on logical consequence, Tarski (1936a, 1936b) says that the belief was prevalent before the appearance of Gödel's incompleteness theorems (see subsection 2.4.3 below for the bearing of these theorems on this issue). In recent times, apparently due to the influence of Tarskian arguments such as the one mentioned towards the end of subsection 2.4.3, the belief in the adequacy of derivability characterizations seems to have waned (see e.g. Prawitz 1985 for a similar appraisal).

2.3 Model-theoretic Validity

Even on the most cautious way of understanding the modality present in logical truths, a sentence is a logical truth only if no sentence which is a replacement instance of its logical form is false. (This idea is only rejected by those who reject the notion of logical form.) It is a common observation that this property, even if it is necessary, is not clearly sufficient for a sentence to be a logical truth. Perhaps there is a sentence that has this property but is not really logically true, because one could assign some unexpressed meanings to the variables and the schematic letters in its logical form, and under those meanings the form would be a false sentence.[4] On the other hand, it is not clearly incorrect to think that a sentence is a logical truth if no collective assignment of meanings to the variables and the schematic letters in its logical form would turn this form into a false sentence. Say that a sentence is universally valid when it has this property. A standard approach to the mathematical characterization of logical truth, alternative to the derivability approach, uses always some version of the property of universal validity, proposing it in each case as both necessary and sufficient for logical truth. Note that if a sentence is universally valid then, even if it's not logically true, it will be true. So all universally valid sentences are correct at least in this sense.

Apparently, the first to use a version of universal validity and explicitly propose it as both necessary and sufficient for logical truth was Bolzano (see Bolzano 1837, §148; and Coffa 1991, pp. 33–4 for the claim of priority). The idea is also present in other mathematicians of the nineteenth century (see e.g. Jané 2006), and was common in Hilbert's school. Tarski (1936a, 1936b) was the first to indicate in a fully explicit way how the version of universal validity used by the mathematicians could itself be given a characterization in terms of concepts of standard mathematics, in the case of Fregean formalized languages with an algorithmic grammar. Essentially Tarski's characterization is widely used today in the form of what is known as the model-theoretic notion of validity, and it seems fair to say that it is usually accepted that this notion gives a reasonably good delineation of the set of logical truths for Fregean languages.

The notion of model-theoretic validity mimics the notion of universal validity, but is defined just with the help of the set-theoretic apparatus developed by Tarski (1935) for the characterization of semantic concepts such as satisfaction, definability, and truth. (See the entry on Tarski's truth definitions.) Given a Fregean language, a structure for the language is a set-theoretical object composed of a set-domain taken together with an assignment of extensions drawn from that domain to its non-logical constants. A structure is meant by most logicians to represent an assignment of meanings: its domain gives the range or “meaning” of the first-order variables (and induces ranges of the higher-order variables), and the extensions that the structure assigns to the non-logical constants are “meanings” that these expressions could take. Using the Tarskian apparatus, one defines for the formulae of the Fregean language the notion of truth in (or satisfaction by) a set-theoretic structure (with respect to an infinite sequence assigning an object of the domain to each variable). And finally, one defines a formula to be model-theoretically valid just in case it is true in all structures for its language (with respect to all infinite sequences). Let's abbreviate “F is true in all structures” as “MTValid(F)”. The model-theoretic characterization makes it clear that “MTValid(F)” is definable purely in terms of concepts of set theory. (The notion of model-theoretic validity for Fregean languages is explained in thorough detail in the entries on classical logic and second-order and higher-order logic; see also the entry on model theory.)[5]

(If F is a formula of a first-order language without identity, then if no replacement instance of the form of F is false, this is a sufficient condition for F's being model-theoretically valid. As it turns out, if F is not model-theoretically valid, then some replacement instance of its form whose variables range over the natural numbers and whose non-logical constants are arithmetical expressions will be false. This can be justified by means of a refinement of the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem. See the entry on logic, classical, and Quine 1970, ch. 4, for discussion and references. No similar results hold for higher-order languages.)

The “MT” in “MTValid(F)” stresses the fact that model-theoretic validity is different from universal validity. The notion of a meaning assignment which appears in the description of universal validity is a very imprecise and intuitive notion, while the notion of a structure appearing in a characterization of model-theoretic validity is a fairly precise and technical one. It seems clear that the notion of a structure for Fregean formalized languages is minimally reasonable, in the sense that a structure models the power of one or several meaning assignments to make false (the logical form of) some sentence. As we will mention later, the converse property, that each meaning assignment's validity-refuting power is modeled by some structure, is also a natural but more demanding requirement on a notion of structure.

2.4 The Problem of Adequacy

The fact that the notions of derivability and model-theoretic validity are definable in standard mathematics seems to have been a very attractive feature of them among practicing logicians. But this attractive feature of course does not justify by itself taking either notion as an adequate characterization of logical truth. On most views, with a mathematical characterization of logical truth we attempt to delineate a set of formulae possessing a number of non-mathematical properties. Which properties these are varies depending on our pretheoretic conception of, for example, the features of modality and formality. (By “pretheoretic” it's not meant “previous to any theoretical activity”; there could hardly be a “pretheoretic” conception of logical truth in this sense. In this context what's meant is “previous to the theoretical activity of mathematical characterization”.) But on any such conception there will be external, non-mathematical criteria that can be applied to evaluate the question whether a mathematical characterization is adequate. In this last section we will outline some of the basic issues and results on the question whether derivability and model-theoretic validity are adequate in this sense.

2.4.1 Analysis and Modality

One frequent objection to the adequacy of model-theoretic validity is that it does not provide a conceptual analysis of the notion of logical truth, even for sentences of Fregean formalized languages (see e.g. Pap 1958, p. 159; Kneale and Kneale 1962, p. 642; Field 1989, pp. 33–4; Etchemendy 1990, ch. 7). This complaint is especially common among authors who feel inclined to identify logical truth and analyticity simpliciter (see e.g. Kneale and Kneale, ibid., Etchemendy 1990, p. 126). If one thinks of the concept of logical truth simply as the concept of analytic truth, it is especially reasonable to accept that the concept of logical truth does not have much to do with the concept of model-theoretic validity, for presumably this concept does not have much to do with the concept of analyticity. To say that a formula is model-theoretically valid means that there are no set-theoretic structures in which it is false; hence, to say that a formula is not model-theoretically valid means that there are set-theoretic structures in which it is false. But to say that a sentence is or is not analytic presumably does not mean anything about the existence or non-existence of set-theoretic structures. Note that we could object to derivability on the same grounds, for to say that a sentence is or is not analytic presumably does not mean anything about its being or not being the product of a certain algorithm (compare Etchemendy 1990, p. 3). (One further peculiar, much debated claim in Etchemendy 1990 is that true claims of the form “F is logically true” or “F is not logically true” should themselves be logical truths (while the corresponding claims “MTValid(F)” and “Not MTValid(F)” are not logical truths). Etchemendy's claim is perhaps defensible under a conception of logical truth as analyticity simpliciter, but certainly doubtful on more traditional conceptions of logical truth, on which the predicate “is a logical truth” is not even a logical expression. See Gómez-Torrente 1998/9 and Soames 1999, ch. 4 for discussion.)

Analogous “no conceptual analysis” objections can be made if we accept that the concept of logical truth has some other strong modal notes unrelated to analyticity; for example, if we accept that it is part of the concept of logical truth that logical truths are true in all counterfactual circumstances, or necessary in some other strong sense. Sher (1996) accepts something like the requirement that a good characterization of logical truth should be given in terms of a modally rich concept. However, she argues that the notion of model-theoretic validity is strongly modal, and so the “no conceptual analysis” objection is actually wrong: to say that a formula is or is not model-theoretically valid is to make a mathematical existence or non-existence claim, and according to Sher these claims are best read as claims about the possibility and necessity of structures. (Shalkowski 2004 argues that Sher's defense of model-theoretic validity is insufficient, on the basis of a certain metaphysical conception of logical necessity. Etchemendy 2008 relatedly argues that Sher's defense is based on inadequate restrictions on the modality relevant to logical truth. See also the critical discussion of Sher in Hanson 1997.) García-Carpintero (1993) offers a view related to Sher's: model-theoretic validity provides a (correct) conceptual analysis of logical truth for Fregean languages, because the notion of a set-theoretical structure is in fact a subtle refinement of the modal notion of a possible meaning assignment. Azzouni (2006), ch. 9, also defends the view that model-theoretic validity provides a correct conceptual analysis of logical truth (though restricted to first-order languages), on the basis of a cetain deflationist conception of the (strong) modality involved in logical truth.

The standard view of set-theoretic claims, however, does not see them as strong modal claims—at best, some of them are modal in the minimal sense that they are universal generalizations or particular cases of these. But it is at any rate unclear that this is the basis for a powerful objection to model-theoretic validity or to derivability, for, even if we accept that the concept of logical truth is strongly modal, it is unclear that a good characterization of logical truth ought to be a conceptual analysis. An analogy might help. It is widely agreed that the characterizations of the notion of computability in standard mathematics, e.g. as recursiveness, are in some sense good characterizations. Note that the concept of computability is modal, in a moderately strong sense; it seems to be about what a being like us could do with certain symbols if he were free from certain limitations—not about, say, what existing beings have done or will do. However, to say that a certain function is recursive is not to make a modal claim about it, but a certain purely arithmetical claim. So recursiveness is widely agreed to provide a good characterization of computability, but it clearly does not provide a conceptual analysis. Perhaps it could be argued that the situation with model-theoretic validity, or derivability, or both, is the same.

A number of philosophers explicitly reject the requirement that a good characterization of logical truth should provide a conceptual analysis, and (at least for the sake of argument) do not question the usual view of set-theoretic claims as non-modal, but have argued that the universe of set-theoretic structures somehow models the universe of possible structures (or at least the universe of possible set-theoretic structures; see McGee 1992, Shapiro 1998). In this indirect sense, the characterization in terms of model-theoretic validity would grasp part of the strong modal force that logical truths are often perceived to possess. McGee (1992) gives an elegant argument for this idea: it is reasonable to think that given any set-theoretic structure, even one construed out of non-mathematical individuals, actualized or not, there is a set-theoretic structure isomorphic to it but construed exclusively out of pure sets; but any such pure set-theoretic structure is, on the usual view, an actualized existent; so every possible set-theoretic structure is modeled by a set-theoretic structure, as desired. (The significance of this relies on the fact that in Fregean languages a formula is true in a structure if and only if it is true in all the structures isomorphic to it.)

But model-theoretic validity (or derivability) might be theoretically adequate in some way even if some possible meaning-assignments are not modeled straightforwardly by (actual) set-theoretic structures. For model-theoretic validity to be theoretically adequate, it might be held, it is enough if we have other reasons to think that it is extensionally adequate, i.e. that it coincides in extension with our preferred pretheoretic notion of logical truth. In subsections 2.4.2 and 2.4.3 we will examine some existing arguments for and against the plain extensional adequacy of derivability and model-theoretic validity for Fregean languages.

2.4.2 Extensional Adequacy: A General Argument

If one builds one's deductive calculus with care, one will be able to convince oneself that all the formulae derivable in the calculus are logical truths. The reason is that one can have used one's intuition very systematically to obtain that conviction: one can have included in one's calculus only axioms of which one is convinced that they are logical truths; and one can have included as rules of inference rules of which one is convinced that they produce logical truths when applied to logical truths. Using another terminology, this means that, if one builds one's calculus with care, one will be convinced that the derivability characterization of logical truth for formulae of the formalized language will be sound with respect to logical truth.

It is equally obvious that if one has at hand a notion of model-theoretic validity for a formalized language which is based on a minimally reasonable notion of structure, then all logical truths (of that language) will be model-theoretically valid. The reason is simple: if a formula is not model-theoretically valid then there is a structure in which it is false; but this structure must then model a meaning assignment (or assignments) on which the formula (or its logical form) is false; so it will be possible to construct a formula with the same logical form, whose non-logical expressions have, by stipulation, the particular meanings drawn from that collective meaning assignment, and which is therefore false. But then the idea of formality and the weakest conception of the modal force of logical truths uncontroversially imply that the original formula is not logically true. Using another terminology, we can conclude that model-theoretic validity is complete with respect to logical truth.

Let's abbreviate “F is derivable in calculus C” by “DC(F)” and “F is a logical truth (in our preferred pretheoretical sense)” by “LT(F)”. Then, if C is a calculus built to suit our pretheoretic conception of logical truth, the situation can be summarized thus:

(4) DC(F) ⇒ LT(F) ⇒ MTValid(F).

The first implication is the soundness of derivability; the second is the completeness of model-theoretic validity.

In order to convince ourselves that the characterizations of logical truth in terms of DC(F) and MTValid(F) are extensionally adequate we should convince ourselves that the converse implications hold too:

(5) MTValid(F) ⇒ LT(F) ⇒ DC(F).

Obtaining this conviction, or the conviction that these implications don't in fact hold, turns out to be difficult in general. But a remark of Kreisel (1967) establishes that a conviction that they hold can be obtained sometimes. In some cases it is possible to give a mathematical proof that derivability (in some specified calculus C) is complete with respect to model-theoretic validity, i.e. a proof of

(6) MTValid(F) ⇒ DC(F).

Kreisel called attention to the fact that (6) together with (4) implies that model-theoretic validity is sound with respect to logical truth, i.e., that the first implication of (5) holds. (Strictly speaking, this is a strong generalization of Kreisel's remark, which in place of “LT(F)” had something like “F is true in all class structures” (structures with a class, possibly proper, as domain of the individual variables).) This means that when (6) holds the notion of model-theoretic validity offers an extensionally correct characterization of logical truth. (See Etchemendy 1990, ch. 11, Hanson 1997, Gómez-Torrente 1998/9). Also, (6), together with (4), implies that the notion of derivability is complete with respect to logical truth (the second implication in (5)) and hence offers an extensionally correct characterization of this notion. Note that this reasoning is very general and independent of what our particular pretheoretic conception of logical truth is.

An especially significant case in which this reasoning can be applied is the case of first-order quantificational languages, under a wide array of pretheoretic conceptions of logical truth. It is typical to accept that all formulae derivable in a typical first-order calculus are universally valid, true in all counterfactual circumstances, a priori and analytic if any formula is.[6] So (4) holds under a wide array of pretheoretic conceptions in this case. (6) holds too for the typical calculi in question, in virtue of Gödel's completeness theorem, so (5) holds. This means that one can convince oneself that both derivability and model-theoretic validity are extensionally correct characterizations of our favorite pretheoretic notion of logical truth for first-order languages, if our pretheoretic conception is not too eccentric. The situation is not so clear in other languages of special importance for the Fregean tradition, the higher-order quantificational languages.

2.4.3 Extensional Adequacy: Higher-order Languages

It follows from Gödel's first incompleteness theorem that already for a second-order language there is no calculus C where derivability is sound with respect to model-theoretic validity and which makes true (6) (for the notion of model-theoretic validity as usually defined for such a language). We may call this result the incompleteness of second-order calculi with respect to model-theoretic validity. Said another way: for every second-order calculus C sound with respect to model-theoretic validity there will be a formula F such that MTValid(F) but it is not the case that DC(F).

In this situation it's not possible to apply Kreisel's argument for (5). In fact, the incompleteness of second-order calculi shows that, given any calculus C satisfying (4), one of the implications of (5) is false (or both are): either derivability in C is incomplete with respect to logical truth or model-theoretic validity is unsound with respect to logical truth.

Different authors have extracted opposed lessons from incompleteness. A common reaction is to think that model-theoretic validity must be unsound with respect to logical truth. This is especially frequent in philosophers on whose conception logical truths must be a priori or analytic. One idea is that the results of a priori reasoning or of analytic thinking ought to be codifiable in a calculus. (See e.g. Wagner 1987, p. 8.) But even if we grant this idea, it's doubtful that the desired conclusion follows. Suppose that (i) every a priori or analytic reasoning must be reproducible in a calculus. We accept also, of course, that (ii) for every calculus C sound with respect to model-theoretic validity there is a model-theoretically valid formula that is not derivable in C. From all this it doesn't follow that (iii) there is a model-theoretically valid formula F such that for every calculus C sound for model-theoretic validity F is not derivable in C. From (iii) and (i) it follows of course that there are model-theoretically valid formulae that are not obtainable by a priori or analytic reasoning. But the step from (ii) to (iii) is a typical quantificational fallacy. From (i) and (ii) it doesn't follow that there is any model-theoretically valid formula which is not obtainable by a priori or analytic reasoning. The only thing that follows (from (ii) alone under the assumptions that model-theoretic validity is sound with respect to logical truth and that logical truths are a priori and analytic) is that no calculus sound with respect to model-theoretic validity can by itself model all the a priori or analytic reasonings that people are able to make. But it's not sufficiently clear that this should be intrinsically problematic. After all, a priori and analytic reasonings must start from basic axioms and rules, and for all we know a reflective mind may have an inexhaustible ability to find new truths and truth-preserving rules by a priori or analytic consideration of even a meager stock of concepts. The claim that all analytic truths ought to be derivable in one single calculus is perhaps plausible on the view that analyticity is to be explained by conventions or “tacit agreements”, for these agreements are presumably finite in number, and their implications are presumably at most effectively enumerable. But this view is just one problematic idea about how apriority and analyticity should be explicated. (See also Etchemendy (1990), chs. 8, 9, for an argument for the unsoundness of higher-order model-theoretic validity based on the conception of logical truth as analyticity simpliciter, and Gómez-Torrente (1998/9) and Soames (1999), ch. 4, for critical reactions.)

Another type of unsoundness arguments attempt to show that there is some higher-order formula that is model-theoretically valid but is intuitively false in a structure whose domain is a proper class. (The “intended interpretation” of set theory, if it exists at all, might be one such structure, for it is certainly not a set; see the entry on set theory.) These arguments thus question the claim that each meaning assignment's validity-refuting power is modeled by some set-theoretic structure, a claim which is surely a corollary of the first implication in (5). (In McGee 1992 there is a good example; there is critical discussion in Gómez-Torrente 1998/9.) The most widespread view among set theorists seems to be that there are no formulae with that property in Fregean languages, but it's certainly not an absolutely firm belief of theirs. Note that these arguments offer a challenge only to the idea that universal validity (as defined in section 2.3) is adequately modeled by set-theoretic validity, not to the soundness of a characterization of logical truth in terms of universal validity itself, or in terms of a species of validity based on some notion of “meaning assignment” different from the usual notion of a set-theoretic structure. (The arguments we mentioned in the preceding paragraph and in 2.4.1 would have deeper implications if correct, for they easily imply challenges to all characterizations in terms of species of validity as well). In fact, worries of this kind have prompted the proposal of a different kind of notions of validity (for Fregean languages), in which set-theoretic structures are replaced with suitable values of higher-order variables in a higher-order language for set theory, e.g. with “plural interpretations” (see Boolos 1985, Rayo and Uzquiano 1999, Williamson 2003; see also the entry on plural quantification). Both set-theoretic and proper class structures are modeled by such values, so these particular worries of unsoundness do not affect this kind of proposals.

In general, there are no fully satisfactory philosophical arguments for the thesis that model-theoretic validity is unsound with respect to logical truth in higher-order languages. Are there then any good reasons to think that derivability (in any calculus sound for model-theoretic validity) must be incomplete with respect to logical truth? There don't seem to be any absolutely convincing reasons for this view either. The main argument (the first version of which was perhaps first made explicit in Tarski 1936a, 1936b) seems to be this. As noted above, Gödel's first incompleteness theorem implies that for any calculus for a higher-order language there will be a model-theoretically valid formula that will not be derivable in the calculus. As it turns out, the formula obtained by the Gödel construction is also always intuitively true in all domains (set-theoretical or not), and it's reasonable to think of it as universally valid. (It's certainly not a formula false in a proper class structure.) The argument concludes that for any calculus there are logically true formulae that are not derivable in it.

From this it has been concluded that derivability (in any calculus) must be incomplete with respect to logical truth. But a fundamental problem is that this conclusion is based on two assumptions that will not necessarily be granted by the champion of derivability: first, the assumption that the expressions typically cataloged as logical in higher-order languages, and in particular the quantifiers in quantifications of the form ∀X (where X is a higher-order variable), are in fact logical expressions; and second, the assumption that being universally valid is a sufficient condition for logical truth. On these assumptions it is certainly very reasonable to think that derivability, in any calculus satisfying (4), must be incomplete with respect to logical truth. But in the absence of additional considerations, a critic may question the assumptions, and deny relevance to the argument. The second assumption would probably be questioned e.g. from the point of view that logical truths must be analytic, for there is no conclusive reason to think that universally valid formulae must be analytic. The first assumption actually underlies any conviction one may have that (4) holds for any one particular higher-order calculus. (Note that if we denied that the higher-order quantifiers are logical expressions we could equally deny that the arguments presented above against the soundness of model-theoretic validity with respect to logical truth are relevant at all.) That the higher-order quantifiers are logical has often been denied on the grounds that they are semantically too “substantive”. It is often pointed out in this connection that higher-order quantifications can be used to define sophisticated set-theoretic properties that one cannot define just with the help of first-order quantifiers. (Defenders of the logical status of higher-order quantifications, on the other hand, point to the wide applicability of the higher-order quantifiers, to the fact that they are analogous to the first-order quantifiers, to the fact that they are typically needed to provide categorical axiomatizations of mathematical structures, etc. See Quine (1970), ch. 5, for the standard exponent of the restrictive view, and Boolos (1975) and Shapiro (1991) for standard exponents of the liberal view.)


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analytic/synthetic distinction | a priori justification and knowledge | Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Frege, Gottlob: theorem and foundations for arithmetic | Lewis, David: metaphysics | logic: ancient | logic: classical | logic: modal | logic: second-order and higher-order | logical consequence | logical constants | model theory | set theory | Tarski, Alfred: truth definitions


I thank Axel Barceló, Bill Hanson, Ignacio Jané, John MacFarlane and Edward N. Zalta for very helpful comments on an earlier version of this entry.

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