Lvov-Warsaw School

First published Thu May 29, 2003; substantive revision Wed Aug 28, 2013

The Lvov-Warsaw School (LWS) was the most important movement in the history of Polish philosophy. It was established by Kazimierz Twardowski at the end of the 19th century in Lvov, a city at that time belonged to the Austro-Hungarian Empire. The LWS flourished in the years 1918–1939. Kazimierz Ajdukiewicz, Tadeusz Kotarbiński, Stanisław Leśniewski, Jan Łukasiewicz and Alfred Tarski are its most famous members. It was an analytical school similar to the Vienna Circle in many respects. On the other hand, the attitude of the LWS toward traditional philosophy was much more positive than that of logical empiricism. Although logic became the most important field in the activities of the LWS, its members were active in all spheres of philosophy. World War II and political changes in Poland after 1945 caused the end of the LWS as an organized philosophical enterprise. One can consider it to have later been continued individually by its representatives.


1. The Origin and Development of the Lvov-Warsaw School

Kazimierz Twardowski (1866–1938) began his post as professor of philosophy at Lvov University in 1895. He came to Lvov from Vienna, where he had studied philosophy under Franz Brentano and Robert Zimmermann. Twardowski belonged to the last group of Brentano's students. His Habilitationschrift (1894) concerned the concepts of the content and the object of presentations; it  clarified and sharpened this important distinction. This work strongly influenced Meinong and Husserl.

Twardowski appeared in Lvov with the ambitious plan of creating a scientific philosophy (in Brentano's spirit) in Poland (at that time, Poland was partitioned between Austro-Hungary, Germany and Russia; Lvov belonged to the Austro-Hungarian Empire.) In fact, he subordinated all his activities to achieving this task and considerably limited his own scientific work. Twardowski was an extraordinary and charismatic teacher. He very soon attracted many young people to philosophy. After ten years of teaching he sometimes had about 200 candidates for seminars and 2000 attendants of his lectures. He propagated a clear style of writing and speaking about philosophical matters, insisted upon justification of philosophical theses and sharply distinguished philosophy as a science from world-views. Following Brentano, he favoured problems on the borderline of descriptive psychology, grammar and logic (he supplemented his object/content distinction by that of actions/products). A photo of Twardowski's last seminar participants taken during the 1936–1937 academic year is available (see the supplement), with most of the participants identified.

Although Twardowski was not a logician and did not consider himself as such, his program formed a friendly environment for logic in all its subdomains: formal logic, semantics and methodology of science. Jan Łukasiewicz (1878–1956) was the first of Twardowski's students to be interested in logic. He began his lectures in logic in Lvov in 1906. Kazimierz Ajdukiewicz (1890–1963), Tadeusz Czeżowski (1889–1981), Tadeusz Kotarbiński (1886–1981) and Zygmunt Zawirski (1882–1948) studied mainly under Twardowski, but they also attended courses conducted by Łukasiewicz. Stanisław Leśniewski (1886–1939) joined this circle in 1910. Warsaw appeared on the stage exactly in 1915, when the University of Warsaw was reopened. The academic staff was mainly imported from Lvov; Łukasiewicz was appointed professor of philosophy.

Poland recovered its independence in 1918 and Polish scholars began to build national academic life. The program for the development of mathematics elaborated by a mathematician Zygmunt Janiszewski (the Janiszewski program) had a great importance for the subsequent development of the LWS. According the Janiszewski program, Polish mathematicians should concentrate on set theory, topology and their applications to other branches of mathematics. In particular, the Janiszewski program attached great importance to mathematical logic and the foundations of mathematics. Two philosophers, namely Leśniewski and Łukasiewicz, became professors of the University of Warsaw at the Faculty of Mathematical and Natural Sciences. Both began intensive teaching of mathematical logic, mostly among mathematicians but also among philosophers. Thus, logic in the LWS had two parents: mathematics and philosophy.

Alfred Tarski (1901–1983) opened the list of young mathematicians and philosophers attracted by logic in Warsaw. The logical community in this city included (in alphabetical order and covering the whole period 1918–1939: Stanisław Jaśkowski (1906–1965), Adolf Lindenbaum (1904–1941?), Andrzej Mostowski (1913–1975), Moses Presburger (1904?-1943), Jerzy Słupecki (1904-1987), Bolesław Sobociński (1904–1980; a philosopher by training)) and Mordechaj Wajsberg (1902–1942?). The names of three other logicians who graduated shortly before 1939 or studied during War World II and began their academic work after 1945 should be added, namely Jan Kalicki (1922–1953; a mathematician), Czesław Lejewski (1913–2001; a classicist and philosopher) and Henryk Hiż (1917; a philosopher).

The development of logic in Warsaw had two subperiods in 1918–1939, namely 1918–1929 and 1929–1939. The first decade consisted in intensive teaching and scientific work at the seminars of Leśniewski and Łukasiewicz. Not many results were published at that time. The explosion of publications took place in 1929 and later. There are several factors which caused the development of mathematical logic in Poland. The Warsaw school of logic appears to be model case, but the power of this circle influenced other places where the general environment was not so favourable to logic. The fruitful co-operation of mathematicians and philosophers in Warszawa had the utmost significance. The founders of the Polish mathematical school made a brave experiment consisting in inviting two philosophers with a modest mathematical background as professors at the Faculty of Mathematics and Natural Sciences; this did not happen in any other country. The gifts of Leśniewski and Łukasiewicz as teachers and the abilities of the latter as an organizer attracted young mathematicians. In Poland mathematical logic was considered to be an autonomous science, not a part of mathematics or philosophy. From the present-day point of view this might seem as an exaggeration, but this ideology contributed essentially to the strength of Polish logic. Their representatives were fairly conscious of the fact that the propagation and defence of the autonomy of this field had to be confirmed by important scientific results and international recognition. Moreover, this view about logic motivated various purely theoretical investigations on formal systems. On the other hand, Polish logicians strongly insisted that logic should not be restricted only to mathematics and required the co-operation of representatives of all field in which logic might be used. Still another factor played an important role, namely the conviction about the social significance of logic as a weapon against all kinds of irrationalism. Tarski once said “Religion [you can also say “ideology” — JW] divides people, logic brings them together.” According to Łukasiewicz, “Logic is morality of thought and speech”. Thus, Polish logicians doing logic and teaching it were convinced that they were performing an important social service.

Kotarbiński was appointed professor of philosophy in Warsaw in 1919. His teaching activity resulted in a group of scholars working mainly in the philosophy of science, including Janina Hosiasson (later Mrs. Lindenbaum; 1899–1942), Edward Poznański (1901–1976), Dina Sztejnbarg (later Mrs. Kotarbiński) (1901–1997) and Aleksander Wundheiler (1902–1957).

Twardowski and Ajdukiewicz (appointed professor in 1928) remained in Lvov. They trained a group that included Izydora Dąmbska (1904–1983), Maria Kokoszyńska (1905–1981), Henryk Mehlberg (1904–1978) and Zygmunt Schmierer (?–1943). Although Twardowski's students also taught at other Polish universities (Czeżowski in Vilna, Zawirski in Poznań and Kraków), Lvov and Warsawa were the main centres of the LWS. The school was also joined by a group of catholic philosophers, including Father Innocenty (Józef) M. Bocheński (1902–1995) and Father Jan Salamucha (1904–1944).

World War II had disastrous consequences for the LWS. Twardowski and Leśniewski died before September 1, 1939. Of the people mentioned above who lost their lives (mostly Jews murdered by the Nazis): the Lindenbaums, Presburger, Salamucha, Schmierer and Wajsberg. Zawirski died in 1947. Many emigrated from Poland during World War II or shortly after it: Łukasiewicz (Dublin), Tarski (Berkeley), Hiż (Philadelphia), Kalicki (Berkeley), Lejewski (Manchester), Mehlberg (Toronto, Chicago), Sobociński (Notre Dame) and Wundheiler (New York); Bocheński (Fribourge) and Poznański (Jerusalem, before 1939).

The situation in Poland in 1945–1948 was similar as before 1939. The Marxist ideological offensive against bourgeois philosophy started in 1949. The policy became more liberal after 1956. Although many scholars of the LWS actively taught and worked in the new political reality, it would be difficult to say that the school continued its former manner of existence. The tradition of the LWS was rather preserved in individual hands, but not as an organized enterprise.

Note: the present essay focuses on the logical wing of the LWS. In 1939, the entire school comprised about 80 scholars actively working in all branches of philosophy as well as in other academic fields, like psychology, sociology, theoretical linguistics, history of art and literary studies.

2. Metaphilosophy

Most philosophers of the LWS understood philosophy as a collection of disciplines, including logic, ethics, aesthetics, metaphysics, and epistemology. Philosophy is a science, like any other. All members of the LWS inherited from Twardowski his main metaphilosophical claims concerning clarity, justification and the separation of philosophy from world-views. It also meant a radical rejection of all kinds of irrationalism. A view, called anti-irrationalism by Ajdukiewicz, demanded that every rationally accepted proposition be intersubjectively communicable and testable. Although there was no a priori list of meaningful questions subjected to philosophical work, one should be sceptical about so-called great metaphysical problems and their scientific status. Philosophical activity must begin with a very careful linguistic analysis of investigated problems and their meaning.

Twardowski himself favoured descriptive psychology as basic, but many of his students found logic to be the most important source of methodological criteria for philosophy. Perhaps Łukasiewicz was the most radical in this respect. According to him, a reform of philosophy was needed in order to avoid errors of the past. Philosophy should proceed as logic does, axiomatically starting from clear concepts and evident principles. Other philosophers of the LWS were more modest and did not demand that philosophy should be axiomatized. However, logical analysis of philosophical discourse became the standard method of analysis. Yet the task of philosophy is not limited to the analysis of language. Thus, philosophy, according to methodological claims of the LWS, was analytic but not purely linguistic. Philosophy is concerned with the world but it mainly (though not “only”) performs its task also by the analysis of language, which is used in speaking about reality. This view about philosophy is to be contrasted with that of the Vienna Circle. In particular, the LWS was not interested in a general metaphilosophical scheme that sharply divided philosophy into good and bad, but rather with an analysis of concrete problems. Thus, the LWS was united more by a common methodological attitude and very general claims concerning rationality than by a commonly accepted philosophical theory.

However, some general views were shared by most (“most” is very important here) members of the LWS. These include: anti-scepticism, anti-naturalism in humanities and axiology, realism in epistemology and philosophy of science, absolutism in epistemology and axiology, and empiricism. These views were characteristic for Brentano and became implemented in Polish philosophy by Twardowski.

3. Logic

3.1 Polish notation, the requirements for logical systems and metalogical concepts

Łukasiewicz invented a parenthesis-free logical notation. The idea consisted in writing logical constants before their arguments. Łukasiewicz replaced the usual signs for logical operations by letters: N (negation), K (conjunction), A (disjunction), C (implication) and E (equivalence). Any well-formed formula (the present explanations are restricted to propositional calculus) must begin with a capital letter (propositional variables are symbolized by lower-case Latin letters) which is the main functor of the entire formula. The main connective has as its arguments variables or formulas consisting of variables and constants. The following are examples: Cpp for (pp), CCppNq for ((pp) → ¬q). The structure of a formula (and hence also its meaning) in Polish notation is uniquely determined by the position of the letters. The parenthesis-free notation is unambiguous in the sense that any finite sequence of symbols for connectives and variables is interpretable in a unique way. This implies that any wff coded in Polish notation has only one translation into the standard symbolism. The main advantage of Polish notation is its economy, because it avoids special punctuation devices such as brackets or dots. When Łukasiewicz met Turing in 1949, the latter remarked that Polish notation was much better for computers, because formulas with function-symbols in front could be better elaborated by mechanical devices.

The parenthesis-free symbolism was closely associated with some ideas of Polish logicians concerning the good properties of formal systems. Of course, any correct logical system should be consistent and, if possible, syntactically and semantically complete. It should also be based on independent sets of primitive terms and axioms. The Warsaw School of Logic strongly emphasized the last property, often considered secondary. Thus, the dependence of primitive terms or axioms was regarded as an essential defect. Moreover, some additional structural properties of logical systems were recommended: (a) a system with fewer primitive concepts is better; (b) a system with fewer axioms is better; (c) if we define the length of an axiom system as the number of symbols occurring in all of its axioms, the shortest axiom system is the best; (d) a system with fewer different symbols is better; (e) if we define an organic theorem as one which has no other theorem inside it (for example, the formula CpCqq is not an organic theorem), organic axioms are better than non-organic ones. Thus, the ideal axiom system consists of a sole organic axiom of the shortest possible length, provided that it is consistent. Requirements (a)-(f) apply particularly well to propositional calculus. They became the guiding principles of many logical investigations in the Warsaw School of Logic. Logicians of this school also made precise many important metalogical concepts, including those of the logical matrix, consequence operation, deductive system and model.

3.2 Investigations of classical propositional calculus

Łukasiewicz formulated several axiomatic bases for the functionally complete propositional calculus, that is PC in which all 16 binary connectives can be defined. The most popular is the N-C system, having as axioms the formulas: CCpqCCqrCpr, CCNppp, CpCNpq, and the usual rules of inference (substitution, detachment). This system is consistent, independent, Post-complete (= semantically complete): Łukasiewicz and his collaborators invented new methods for proving these properties. According to the criteria mentioned in the preceding section, one should look for the simplest axiom bases.

3.3 Many-valued, modal and intuitionistic logic

The discovery of many-valued logic is commonly considered to be one of the major achievements of Łukasiewicz. He did it in 1918, a little earlier than Post. However, although Post's remarks were parenthetical and extremely condensed, Łukasiewicz explained his intuitions and motivations carefully and at length. He was guided by considerations about future contingents and the concept of possibility.

Łukasiewicz observed that no functor of classical propositional calculus could be read as “it is possible that” and provided that the formula Mp (it is possible that p) is extensional (i.e., that its value depends solely on the value of p). The difficulty can be solved if we admit a third value. Sentences about future contingent states of affairs are natural candidates for having the third value (½). For example, the sentence “I will visit Warszawa next year”, is neither true nor false, it is merely possible and has the value ½. Its negation has the same value. This idea led to three-valued logic. The usual equalities for N, A, Kand C are supplemented by (I list only some cases) p = ½ = Np, K ½½ = ½, A½½ = ½. Easy calculations shows that ApNp and NKpNp have the value ½ for p = ½. This means that the laws of contradiction and excluded middle do not hold in three-valued logic. Later, Łukasiewicz generalized it to logics with an arbitrary finite number of values and finally to an countably infinite number of values. The sense of implication is given by the equations:

Cpq = 1, for pq
Cpq = 1−(p + q), for p>q,

and the sense of negation by the equation:

Np = 1−p, where 0≤p1.

If we have only two values, these equations determine the usual truth-tables for C and N.

Three problems arose after discovering many-valued logic. The first concerned its axiomatization and metalogical properties, the second its philosophical foundations and intuitive interpretation, and the third its applications. Due to the work of Łukasiewicz himself, Wajsberg and Słupecki, the first group of questions was largely solved. Wajsberg showed that the formulas: CpCqp, CCpqCCqrCpr, CCNpNqCqp, CCCpNppp axiomatize Ł3 (three-valued propositional calculus). The same author proved that a finite Łn is axiomatizable if it includes the theorems: CCpqCCqrCpr, CCCqrCCpqCpr, CCqqCpp, CCpqCNqNp, CNqCCpqNq. If n = ℵ0, Łn can be axiomatized by (Łukasiewicz's conjecture, proved by Wajsberg): CpCqp, CCpqCCqrCpr, CCCpqqqCCqpp, CCCpqCqpCqp, CCNpNqCqp. However, all of the above axiom-sets are functionally incomplete. The problem was solved by Słupecki for Ł3. He introduced the new functor T defined by T1 = T½ = T0 = ½ and added the formulas CTpNTp, CNTpTp to Wajsberg's axioms. All Łukasiewicz's many-valued logics are consistent. Słupecki proved that Ł3 is Post-complete. Every Łn (n>2) is contained in two-valued logic, although the converse does not hold; for example, the formulas CCNpNp, CCNppp, CCpqCCpNqNp, CCpKNqNp, CcpEqNqNq are theorems in the two-valued system only. If n = ℵ0, Łn is contained in every finite Łn.

At first, Łukasiewicz called his three-valued logic “Non-Aristotelian”, but later he preferred the qualification “Non-Chrysippean”. According to Łukasiewicz, the Stagirite himself doubted the validity of the principle of excluded middle in the domain of future contingents. On the other hand, the Stoics believed that every proposition is true or false, independently of its temporal reference. Thus, the Stoics accepted the principle of bivalence in its unrestricted form. Now, the foundation of two or many-valued logic lies not in this or that logical theorem, but in metalogic; in particular, it is determined by accepting or rejecting the principle of bivalence. Whoever, as Chrisippus did, accepts the validity of the principle of bivalence, opts for two-valued logic; whoever even partially rejects this principle, as Aristotle did, thereby opens the door to many-valued logic. Łukasiewicz took the side of Aristotle. However, this did not close the problem of the interpretation of other logical values. Łukasiewicz tried to go though indeterminism and causality. A typical difficulty is the following. Take p as valued by ½. Its negation also has the value ½. The same holds for KpNp, contrary to the firm intuition that any pair of contradictory sentences is false. Difficulties with interpretation changed Łukasiewicz's primary view concerning the relation of many-valued logic to reality. At first, guided by a realistic epistemology of logic, he maintained that one of the rival logics could be proved to be the correct description of the physical world. Later, he was rather inclined to look at logical systems as formalisms having their own problems deserving research and as useful devices for solving various questions but not as something leading to the only “true” ontological scheme. Yet he believed that many-valued logic would play a considerable role in the foundations of mathematics.

3.3.1 Leśniewski's systems

Leśniewski intended to a formulate the full logical system that would serve as the basis for the whole of science, and in particular for mathematics. This system consists of three parts (a) protothetic (a generalized propositional calculus); (b) ontology (a logic of terms); (c) mereology (a theory of parts and wholes). Protothetic is a calculus in which quantifiers bind propositional variables and variables referr to arbitrary functors constructible over the usual functors: that is, functors of propositional variables, functors of functors, etc. In general, if we start with the category of sentences alone, protothetical quantifiers bind variables of all further definable categories. The shortest axiom of protothetic (written in the Russell-like symbolism) is the formula

[pq] :: p ↔ . q ↔ :.[f]:. f (pf (p [u]. u)). ↔ : [r]: f (qr). ↔ . qp

(Sobociński). Protothetic is an absolute propositional calculus in the sense that the principle of bivalence is its theorem. In fact, protothetic inspired Łukasiewicz's system with variable functors, another absolute propositional logic.

If we add the functor ε (read as “is”) forming sentences from two names, we obtain Leśniewski's ontology (LO). The meaning of the constant ε is perhaps the most important matter for a proper understanding of LO. The epsilon corresponds well to the sense of the copula “est” in Latin sentences of the type “Socrates est homo”. The epsilon has no spatio-temporal connotations and does not indicate the membership relation or identity. The rendering of the epsilon by the English “is” may be misleading, because the latter is modified by articles. The axiomatic characterization of the meaning of the epsilon is given by

(O)   [Aa]:: (A ε a) ↔ :.[ΣB]. (B ε a):. [BC]: (B ε A). (C ε A). →
(B ε C):. [B]: (B ε A) →. B ε a.

Its simplified form (discovered by Sobociński) is:

(O′) [Aa] A εa: ↔.[ΣB]. (A εB). (B εa).

The right sides of (O) and (O′) are conjunctions. The intuitive content of (O) is simple in spite of its formal complexity. It establishes that the sentence “A is a” is equivalent to the following conditions (a) A is not an empty term; (b) there is only one A; (c) whatever is A, is also a. Thus, “A is a” is a singular sentence which is true if and only if (a)-(c) hold. In particular, such a sentence is false if A is a general or an empty term. On the other hand, (O) (or O′) is valid for all terms, even general or empty ones. Thus, LO is valid in all domains, including the empty one and can be regarded as the first system of free logic. In LO we can define two important concepts, namely that of existence and that of being an object. This is done by (I use non-symbolic forms): (1) for any A, A exists = for some x, x is A; (2) for any A, A is an object = for some x, A is x. LO performs functions usually provided by predicate logic. The meaning of the constant ε is sufficiently general to define identity and the inclusion of classes. Since these concepts are definable in elementary ontology, it is stronger than first-order logic.

Mereology, assumes protothetic and ontology as logically prior theories, and has the term “part of” as its sole primitive concept. Being a part is a non-reflexive and transitive relation. There are no empty classes. Moreover, the class consisting of a single element is identical with it. In general, mereology is a theory of sets in the collective (mereological) sense, contrary to ordinary set theory, which describes sets in the distributive sense. The main difference between the two interpretations of the term “set” consists in the fact that the membership relation is transitive under the mereological reading, but non-transitive under the distributive one. Leśniewski believed that his theory classes would perform all the tasks of ordinary set theory without generating paradoxes. In fact, he invented mereology when he tried to solved the Russell paradox. Since there are no mereological classes which are not their own elements, the question which led to the Russell paradox simply makes no sense in Leśniewski's systems. On the other hand, mereology is weaker than set theory.

Leśniewski's systems have some formal features, even very peculiar ones in some respects. All are axiomatic. According to his nominalistic preferences, they are concrete physical objects. Expressions are always understood as sequences of concrete inscriptions. There are as many expressions as have been written; no expression exists merely potentially. This view is called constructive nominalism. According to it, two intuitively equivalent systems, for example, protothetic based on equivalence and protothetic based on implication, are different systems. Every logical system, on Leśniewski's view, is not finished at any time because there is always the possibility of adding new elements to it. Hence, the rules for constructing and developing formal systems are of crucial importance for Leśniewski's logics. He understood this very well and devoted much attention to explaining the details of his formalization. Leśniewski formulated his procedural directives purely syntactically and completely. Due to the role of equivalence, he was able to treat definitions as theorems. In general, Leśniewski's systems are commonly considered to be perfect from the point of view of the requirements of correct formalization. The Leśniewski project is a version of logicism. Leśniewski's three systems form a grand logic and provide a universal language to capture the whole of knowledge. It is certainly not an orthodox system and lies on the margin of contemporary research in logic. Yet it continues to attract many logicians and philosophers. In spite of their marginality, Leśniewski's systems are investigated in all parts of the world.

Leśniewski suggested the theory of syntactic categories, later developed by Ajdukiewicz in the early 1930s. This theory takes the categories of sentences and names (for Ajdukiewicz, following Leśniewski, there is no syntactic difference between proper names and common nouns) as fundamental and assigns the pointer s to sentences and n to names. Now functors have fractions as pointers. For example, “is” has s/nn as its categorial index; it says that ”is“ is a two-placed functor of two nominal arguments which forms a sentence. The conjunction as a propositional connective forming sentences from two other sentences has s/ss as its index. Consider now the expression “p and q”. Write the categorial indexes of its parts. We thus obtain the sequence: s s/ss s. Perform simplifications by divisions similar to dividing algebraic fractions. The letter s is the result. A simple algorithm says that an expression is syntactically coherent if and only if s or n is its index after performing all simplifications. Ajdukiewicz's quasi-arithmetical notation was the first system of categorial grammar.

3.4 Semantics and truth

Due to semantic paradoxes, Hilbert's formalistic metamathematics and the syntacticism of the Vienna Circle, the concept of truth was expelled from the domain of logic. It was Tarski who changed this attitude. He was inspired by the Aristotelian tradition in philosophy, as well as the non-constructive style of working on the foundations of mathematics that was prevailed in Poland. In 1933, he published a book on the concept of truth (in Polish), translated into German in 1936 and English in 1956.

Tarski's theory of truth (the semantic conception of truth) has two aspects: philosophical and formal. Philosophically, it is a version of Aristotle's idea that truth consists in saying that what is, is and what is not, is not (it is related to the idea of correspondence). However, the main problem was formal. Tarski had to offer a construction free of semantic paradoxes, in particular the Liar. He achieved this goal by postulating that the concept of truth must be defined for a definite, well-constructed formalized language L. However, the definition itself should be formulated in the metalanguage ML. The definition is to be formally correct, that is, it cannot lead to contradictions and has to satisfy the usual conditions of correctness (non-circularity, etc.). It should also be materially adequate. According to Tarski, the basic intuition is captured by the T-scheme: s is true if and only if P, where the letter s represents the name of a sentence and P is a translation of this sentence into the metalanguage ML. Now the condition of material adequacy (the Convention T) says that a truth definition TD is materially adequate if and only if all equivalences (that is, for all sentences in L) stemming from the T-scheme by appropriate replacements are provable from the definition. The conditions are satisfied by the following definition:

A sentence A of a language L is true if and only if it is satisfied by all infinite sequences of objects taken from the universe of discourse.

A more refined version is model-theoretical:

A sentence A is true in a model M if and only if A is satisfied by all infinite sequences of objects taken from the carrier of M.

This definition implies the metalogical principles of excluded middle and contradiction, which both are equivalent to the principle of bivalence.

Tarski's truth-definition is one of the most debated contemporary philosophical and logical ideas. It strongly influenced semantics, philosophy of language, philosophy of science and epistemology. In particular, it became the first step toward model-theory, a central branch of mathematical logic. Two applications of this definition are worth mentioning. Firstly, Tarski succeeded in formulating an exact definition of “logical consequence” (“following from” or “logical entailment”):

A sentence A logically follows from the set X of sentences if and only if every model of X is a model of A.

Secondly, Tarski proved the following limitative theorem:

If a formal system S captures Peano arithmetic, the truth-predicate (or: the set of S-truth) is not definable in it.

3.5 The history of logic

Łukasiewicz revolutionized the history of logic. He proposed to look at the history of logical ideas through the glasses of mathematical logic. The reason was that he was convinced about the continuity of formal logic from Aristotle to modern mathematical logic, perhaps with a break from the 16th century to Boole and Frege (of course, with the exception of Leibniz). Thus, old sound logical theories should be considered as anticipations of ideas advanced in the 19th and the 20th centuries. Guided by this assumption, Łukasiewicz showed that the Stoics invented propositional calculus, contrary to the prevailing view that Stoic logic was a part of Aristotle's logic. In particular, Łukasiewicz demonstrated that the Stoic logic of propositions was a system of rules, not theorems. Another of Łukasiewicz's historical discoveries consisted in the rehabilitation of medieval logic, commonly neglected as fruitless scholasticism. He was joined in these investigations by Bocheński and Salamucha.

Historical work inspired logicians of the LWS toward modern interpretations of traditional logical doctrines. The most famous is Łukasiewicz's formalization of the Aristotelian logic of categorical sentences (the syllogistic plus conversion and other rules of so-called direct inference). Łukasiewicz interpreted this logic as a specific formal theory, not as a fragment of predicate logic, as it was usually done (for example by Frege or Russell). Yet the logic of categorical sentences assumes propositional logic as prior. The logic of assertoric sentences (Łukasiewicz also considered its modal extension) has the following form. Let the formulas (lower-case letters are term variables) Uab, Iab, Yab, Oab stand for the sentences “every a is b”, “some a are b”, “no a is b” and “some a are not b”. We can define Yab as NIab and Oab as NUab. The axioms are as follows: (a) Uaa; (b) Iaa; (c) CKUmbUamUab (the Barbara modus); (d) CKUmbImaIab (the Datisi mode); the rules are: all the rules of propositional calculus, substitution for term variables, the definitional replacement according to the definitions of Yab and Oab.

3.6 The philosophy of logic and mathematics

There was no official philosophy of logic and mathematics in the LWS. Most Polish logicians treated logical studies as independent of philosophical commitments. Only Leśniewski had explicit philosophical views which influenced the form of his systems. This does not mean that concrete works were not influenced by philosophical ideas. Łukasiewicz's many-valued logic and Tarski's theory of truth are perhaps model cases. The former had the problem of determinism as its background and the second was strongly inspired by the Aristotelian tradition in thinking about truth. It was also the case that Polish logicians had inclinations to empiricism as a general epistemological attitude and this philosophy often resulted in sympathies to nominalism (Tarski), constructivism (Mostowski) and scepticism concerning the sharp distinction between logical and extralogical truth (Tarski). However, the technical side of logical problems decided about investigations and sometimes forced changes in philosophical standpoints. The example of Łukasiewicz is instructive once again. Although he at first thought of logic as a true or false description of reality, he later adopted a more conventionalist and instrumentalistic standpoint. This attitude allowed him to accommodate various ideas coming from rival foundational directions, that is, logicism, formalism and intuitionism. In fact, Leśniewski and Tarski contributed to the theory of logical types and combined it with the theory of syntactic categories; Tarski's version in his work on truth is particularly important. Tarski also showed new perspectives for logicism by defining logical concepts as invariants under one-to-one transformations. He also contributed to general metamathematics (the theory of consequence operation) and intuitionistic logic. However, a very special feature of logical investigations performed in the LWS consisted in the free admission of all fruitful mathematical methods, including non-constructive ones. This was the main point of the set theoretical approach to the foundations of mathematics which replaced logicism.

3.7 Supplementary and concluding remarks

The above survey does not do justice to many of the logical studies carried out in the LWS. Let me only mention some of them: particular historical studies of Bocheński and Salamucha, several interpretations of traditional logic (Ajdukiewicz, Czeżowski), partial propositional calculi (all Warsaw logicians), propositional calculus with variable functors (Łukasiewicz), paraconsistency (Jaśkowski), Ł-modal systems (Łukasiewicz), rejection rules, natural deduction (Jaśkowski), intuitionistic logic (Jaśkowski, Tarski, Wajsberg), free logic (Jaśkowski, Mostowski), the elimination of quantifiers (Tarski, Presburger), undecidability (Tarski, Mostowski), the foundations of geometry (Tarski), the elementary theory of real numbers, the calculus of systems (Tarski), the Kleene-Mostowski hierarchy, generalized quantifiers (Mostowski), as well as several particular results: the deduction theorem (Tarski), the upward Löwenheim-Skolem theorem (Tarski), the separation theorem for intuitionistic logic (Wajsberg) or the Lindenbaum maximalization lemma.

4. Philosophy of Science

The philosophy of science was a favourite field of the LWS. Since science is the most rational human activity, it was important to explain its rationality and unity. Since most philosophers of the LWS rejected naturalism in the humanities and social sciences, the way through the unity of language (as in the case of the Vienna Circle) was excluded. The answer was simple: science qua science is rational and is unified by its logical structure and by definite logical tools used in scientific justifications. Thus, the analysis of the inferential machinery of science is the most fundamental task of philosophers science. Inductivism was a prevailing view about justification in empirical science. Hosiasson formulated an axiomatic system of inductive logic, anticipating Carnap's later work. Other attempts to establish the foundations of inductive inference were undertaken by Ajdukiewicz (via statistics, decision theory and game theory (he mainly investigated the problem of the rationality of modes of fallible inference), Czeżowski (via probability logic in the sense of Reichenbach) and Zawirski (via a combination of many-valued logic and probability theory).

Łukasiewicz worked on problems of the methodology of the empirical sciences in 1902–1910. At first, he tried to develop the inverse theory of induction (induction as inversed deduction) proposed by Jevons and Sigwart. However, he abandoned this project very soon and adopted a radical deductionist standpoint. For him, induction plays no significant role in science. Deduction remains the only credible mode of reasoning in all spheres of science. As applied in empirical science, it leads to negative results; that is, it can show that some hypotheses are false in the face of empirical data. Łukasiewicz also offered a formal argument against induction derived from probability theory. Assume that H is a universal hypothesis. Its a priori probability is equal (or close) to zero and no further empirical data can increase it. These ideas contain the main points of Popper's philosophy of empirical science.

Tarski's semantic ideas converted most members of the LWS to scientific realism. Formerly, under the influence of conventionalism, instrumentalism concerning scientific theories had adherents (Ajdukiewicz, Łukasiewicz). A radical form of anti-realism was developed by Poznański and Wundheiler in the 1930s. They pointed out that verification in empirical science is cyclic and principally anti-fundamentalistic. In particular, it is not possible to identify any data without a reference to theories. Hence, truth in science cannot consist in a correspondence with facts.

Of many investigations concerning special problems, let me only mention Mehlberg's version of the causal theory of time and some works on the causality problem in quantum mechanics. He admitted a universal time as a synthesis of physical (intersubjective) and psychical (subjective) time. The causal theory does not lead to the anisotropy of time. It can be that universal time is symmetric, but locally asymmetry is possible. Mehlberg and Zawirski defended a moderate causalism in quantum mechanics. In particular, Zawirski argued that the unpredictability of the future (Heisenberg) does not entail that the principle of causality fails.

5. Ontology and Epistemology Inspired by Logic

5.1 Reism

Kotarbiński developed a general doctrine, called reism. It has two aspects, ontological and semantic. Hence, we can speak about semantic reism and ontological reism, although this distinction was clarified by Kotarbiński later. In general, reism goes against the acceptance of the existence of general (abstract) objects, that is, facts, properties, states of affairs, relations, etc. The main ontological thesis of reism is as follows (it is subdivided into two subtheses): (R1) any object is a material, spatio-temporal, concrete thing; (R2) no object is a state of affairs, property of relation (according to Kotarbiński, these three categories exhaust the domain of alleged abstract objects). Now (R1), that is, the positive thesis of reism has a rich content. Firstly, it marks a formal feature of existing objects, namely their concrete character.

Secondly, it characterizes things as material and spatio-temporal entities, that is, as physical objects. Leibniz conceived monads as spiritual concreta. For the later Brentano, every object is concrete, but there are souls and bodies. Thus, Leibniz's reism was monistic and spiritualistic, Brentano's was dualistic, and Kotarbiński's monistic and materialistic. Although the terminology varies (one can equivalently speak about reism, concretism or nominalism), two claims of any theory going against general (abstract) objects should be very sharply distinguished. The first is formal-ontological and points out the formal feature of existents, namely that they are individuals; but the second is material-ontological or metaphysical and focuses on their nature as physical or psychical entities.

Semantic reism is parallel to the ontological aspect of this doctrine. The key idea consists in the distinction of genuine names and apparent names (onomatoids). A name is genuine if and only if refers to things, that is, to concrete physical things. By contrast, onomatoids are words that allegedly refer to abstract entities, “allegedly” because their referents do not exist. At first glance, apparent names are similar to empty terms. However, this resemblance is merely apparent, because empty nouns are genuine names and can always be decomposed into non-empty genuine names (e.g., "round square"). This becomes evident when we try to formulate the conditions of meaningfulness for sentences. In general, a sentence is meaningful if and only if it consists (except for logical constants) only of genuine names or is reducible to such sentences. For example, the sentence “all cats are animals” is reistically meaningful, but “properties are abstract objects” is not. Furthermore, “a square triangle is rectangular” is good, but “sets exist outside of time and space” is not. The sentence “whiteness is a property of snow” can be reduced to “snow is white”. This example shows how to translate some sentences with apparent names into purely reistic statements.

Matters become clearer if one remembers that Leśniewski's calculus of names is the underlying logic of reism. The copula “is” in “snow is white” functions with its meaning defined by the axiom of LO (see above). Thus, this sentence is true if its subject refers to an individual object. The traditional interpretation of common nouns and adjectives, consistent with LO, as general terms referring to many objects, saves their reistic character. Thus, one can say that the formal-ontological aspect of reism is adequately displayed by LO. Of course, reism as a metaphysical doctrine is an addition to LO.

Kotarbiński recommended reism as a sound view. In particular, it defends philosophy and ordinary thinking before hypostases, that is, accepting the existence of abstract objects on the basis of using apparent names. Thus, reism defends us against idola fori in Bacon's sense. Kotarbiński's reism is perhaps the most radical materialistic nominalism in the history of philosophy. Reism is exceptional to the main tendency in the LWS in that it proposes a uniform language, proper everywhere, including the humanities, sociology and psychology (Kotarbiński supplemented reism by radical realism, that is, the view that there are no mental contents). In this respect, reism resembles physicalism. The troubles of reism are typical those which are in the case of any reductive materialism and nominalism, and concern the interpretation of mathematics, semantics, psychology, the humanities and social sciences.

5.2 Radical conventionalism and semantic epistemology

Radical conventionalism is an epistemological theory developed by Ajdukiewicz in the early 1930s. It is based on a conception of language and meaning. The concept of meaning is taken as a primitive. Now, the meaning of expressions in a language L induces the rules for accepting its sentences. Ajdukiewicz lists three kinds of meaning-rules (or sense-rules): (a) axiomatic (they demand the unconditional acceptance of sentences, for example, “A is A”; (b) deductive (they demand the acceptance of a sentence relatively to the prior acceptance of other sentences, for example, ¬A follows from AB and ¬B), (c) empirical (they demand the acceptance of a sentence in a definite empirical situation, for example “it is raining” when it rains).

The special significance of meaning-rules and their relation to the meanings of expressions appears when special languages are taken into account, namely closed and connected. A language L is open if it can be extended to a new language L′ without changes in the meanings of other expressions; otherwise L is closed. A language is disconnected if there is a non-empty subset X of L such that no element of X is linked by the meaning-rules to other elements of L; otherwise, L is connected. It follows from the above definitions that if L is closed and connected, it cannot be enriched without changing the meanings of the original expressions.

According to Ajdukiewicz, natural languages are open and disconnected. By contrast, scientific languages are closed and disconnected. Let L be closed and connected. The set of meanings of L is its conceptual apparatus. If A and A′ are two conceptual apparatuses, they are either identical or mutually non-translatable. Since the acceptance and rejection of sentences is always related to a language L, empirical data do no force us to accept or reject any sentences, because there always remains the possibility of changing a given conceptual apparatus. This is a considerable radicalization of the conventionalism of Poincaré. The difference is the following. For Poincaré, since theoretical principles are conventions, we are free to modify them, but experiential reports are perfectly stable. Ajdukiewicz extended conventionalism to all sentences, because any sentence, no matter whether experiential or theoretical, depends on a conceptual apparatus. It is why Ajdukiewicz called this conventionalism radical.

In the middle of the 1930s Ajdukiewicz changed his view. He came to the conclusion that closed and connected languages are fictions. He was influenced by the semantic ideas of Tarski. Tarski also argued that, contrary to Ajdukiewicz's hopes, the invariance of meaning-rules over permutations of expressions influences their meaning-relations. Gradually, Ajdukiewicz developed the program of semantic epistemology, mainly directed toward the defence of realism against various forms of idealism. In particular, he criticized Rickert's transcendental idealism and Berkeley's subjectivism. For Rickert, reality is only a correlate of the Transcendental Subject. Now the Transcendental Subject can be identified with the set T of true propositions obtainable on the basis of axiomatic and deductive rules. However, due to incompleteness phenomena, T cannot be generated in this way. For Ajdukiewicz, that was a justification that transcendental idealism fails. Ajdukiewicz compared the language used by Berkeley to the language of syntax, because the former reduces relations of the mind to its objects to relations between thoughts. On the other hand, the ordinary way of speaking about objects employs semantic relations. Berkeley's claim esse = percipi is similar to an attempt to define semantics in a purely syntactic language. However, due to Tarski's results about the relation between syntax and semantics, this is impossible. Finally, Ajdukiewicz argued that any idealistic language is understandable only if it is associated with a realistic language. Hence, any attempt to consider idealistic language as self-sufficient cannot be successful.

6. The Significance of the Lvov-Warsaw School

The LWS acted in a country which never belonged to the philosophical superpowers. This circumstance is important for any assessment of the significance of the LWS. One can measure it on a national or an international scale. The importance of the LWS for Polish philosophical culture was enormous. Twardowski fully realized his task. He introduced scientific philosophy in his sense into Poland and created a powerful philosophical school. It did very much for the subsequent development of philosophy in the country. In particular, it popularized very high standards of doing philosophy. This was important in the difficult times after 1945, when Marxism started an ideological and political offensive against bourgeois philosophy. In fact, due to the strong methodological tradition related to the LWS, Polish philosophy did not lose its academic quality in 1945–1989.

As far as the matter concerns international importance, one thing is clear. The logical achievements of the LWS became the most famous. Doubtless, the Warsaw school of logic contributed very much to the development of logic in the 20th century. Other contributions are known but rather marginally. This is partially due to the fact that most philosophical writings of the LWS appeared in Polish. However, this factor does not explain everything. Many writings of the LWS were originally published in English, French or German. However, their influence was very moderate, considerably lesser than that of similar writings of philosophers from the leading countries. This is a pity, because radical conventionalism, reism or semantic epistemology are the real philosophical pearls. But perhaps this is the fate of results achieved in cultural provinces.

Bibliography

The bibliography is divided into two sections. The first contains writings of the LWS in Western languages, the second writings on the LWS and its particular representatives.

Works of the LWS

A. Anthologies

  • McCall, S. (ed.), 1967, Polish Logic 1920–1939, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Pearce, D. and Woleński, J. (eds.), 1988, Logischer Rationalismus. Philosophische Schriften der Lemberg-Warschauer Schule, Frankfurt am Main: Athenäum.

B. Books by Particular Philosophers

  • Ajdukiewicz, K., 1958, Abriss der Logic, Berlin: Aufbau-Verlag.
  • Ajdukiewicz, K., 1973, Problems and Theories of Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ajdukiewicz, K., 1974, Pragmatic Logic, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Ajdukiewicz, K., 1978. The Scientific World-Perspective and Other essays, 1931–1963, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Bocheński, I. M., 1961, A History of Formal Logic. Notre Dame: The University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Czeżowski, T., 2000, Knowledge, Science and Values. A Program for Scientific Philosophy, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Kotarbiński, T., 1965, Leons sur l'histoire de la logique, Warszawa: Państwowe Wydawnictwo Naukowe.
  • Kotarbiński, T., 1966, Gnosiology. The Scientific Approach to the Theory of Knowledge, Wrocław: Ossolineum.
  • Leśniewski, S., 1988, Lecture Notes in Logic, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Leśniewski, S., 1992, Collected Works, Dodrecht: Kluwer.
  • Łukasiewicz, J., 1957, Aristotle's Syllogistic from the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2nd edition.
  • Łukasiewicz, J., 1963, Elements of Mathematical Logic, Warszawa: Państwowe Wydawnictwo Naukowe.
  • Łukasiewicz, J., 1970, Selected Works, Amsterdam: North-Holland.
  • Łukasiewicz, J., 1993, Über den Satz des Widerspruchs bei Aristoteles, Hildesheim: Olms.
  • Mehlberg, H., 1956, The Reach of Science, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Mehlberg, H., 1980, Time, Causality, and the Quantum Theory, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Mostowski, A., 1979, Foundational Studies, 2 vols., Amsterdam: North-Holland.
  • Tarski, A., 1941, Introduction to Logic and to the Methodology of Deductive Sciences, Oxford: Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Tarski, A., 1956, Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics Papers from 1923–1939, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Tarski, A., 1986, Collected Papers, 4 vols., Basel: Birkhäuser.
  • Twardowski, K., 1999, On Actions, Products and Other Topics in Philosophy, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Wajsberg, M., 1977, Logical Works, Wrocław: Ossolineum.
  • Zawirski, Z., 1994, Selected Writings on Time, Logic & Methodology of Science, Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Works on the LWS and its Particular Members

A. About the LWS

  • Coniglione, F. Poli, R. and Woleński, J. (eds.), 1993, Polish Scientific Philosophy. The Lvov-Warsaw School, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Jadacki, J. J., 2009, Polish Analytical Philosophy, Semper: Warszawa.
  • Jadacki, J. J., Paśniczek, J. (eds.), 2006, The Lvov-Warsaw School — the New Generation, Rodopi: Amsterdam.
  • Jordan, Z., 1945, The Development of Mathematical Logic and of Logical Positivism in Poland between Two Wars, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kijania-Placek, K. and Woleński, J. (eds.), 1996, The Lvov-Warsaw School and Contemporary Philosophy, Part II, Axiomathes, 7(3): 293–415.
  • Kijania-Placek, K. and Woleński, J., 1998, The Lvov-Warsaw School and Contemporary Philosophy, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Krajewski, W. (ed.), 2001, Polish Philosophers of Science and Nature in the 20th Century, Rodopi: Amsterdam.
  • Lapointe, S., Woleński, J., Mathieu, M., Miśkiewicz, W., 2009, The Golden Age of Polish Philosophy. Kazimierz Twardowski's Philosophical Legacy, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Skolimowski, H., 1967, Polish Analytical Philosophy, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Szaniawski, K. (ed.), 1989, The Vienna Circle and the Lvov-Warsaw School, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Woleński, J., 1989, Logic and Philosophy in the Lvov-Warsaw School, Dordrecht: Kluwer.

B. Works on Particular Members

Ajdukiewicz
  • Sinisi, V. and Woleński, J. (eds.), 1995, The Heritage of Kazimierz Ajdukiewicz, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
Kotarbiński
  • Gasparski, W., 1993, A Philosophy of Practicality: A Treatise on the Philosophy of Tadeusz Kotarbiński, Helsinki: Societas Philosophica Fennica.
  • Woleński, J. (ed.), 1990, Kotarbiński: Logic, Semantics and Ontology, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
Leśniewski
  • Luschei, E., 1963, The Logical Systems of Leśniewski, Amsterdam: North-Holland.
  • Miéville, D., 1984, Un développement des systmes logiques de Stanisław Leśniewski. Prototétique — Ontologie — Méreologie, Bern: Peter Lang.
  • Miéville, D., 2001, Introduction à l’œvre de S. Leśniewski, F. I: La protothétique, Neuchâtel: Université de Neuchâtel.
  • Srzednicki, J. (ed.), 1984, Leśniewski's Systems. Ontology and Mereology, The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Srzednicki, J. (ed.), 1998, Leśniewski's Systems. Prothotetic, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Vernant, D. and Miéville, D. (eds.), 1995, Stanisław Leśniewski aujourd'hui, Groupe de Recherches sur la philosophie et le langage/Centre de Recherches Sémiologiques, Grenoble/Neuchâtel.
Mostowski
  • Ehrenfeucht, A., Marek, V. W., Srebrny, M. (eds.), 2008, Andrzej Mostowski and Foundational Studies, Amsterdam: IOS Press.
Tarski
  • Feferman, A., and Feferman, S., 2004, Alfred Tarski. Life and Logic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Moreno, L. F., 1992, Wahrheit und Korrepondenz bei Tarski. Eine Untersuchung der Wahrheitstheorie Tarskis als Korrespondenztheorie der Wahrheit, Würzburg: Königshausen&Neumann.
  • Patterson, D. (ed.), 2008, New Essays on Tarski and Philosophy., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Stegmüller, W., 1957, Das Wahrheitsproblem und die Idee der Semantik. Eine Einführung in die Theorien von A. Tarski und R. Carnap, Wien: Springer.
  • Woleński, J. and Köhler, E. (eds.), 1999, Alfred Tarski and the Vienna Circle, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
Twardowski
  • Cavallin, J., 1997, Content and Object. Husserl, Twardowski and Psychologism, Dordrecht: Kluwer.

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Related Entries

logic: many-valued | mereology | Tarski, Alfred | Tarski, Alfred: truth definitions

Acknowledgments

The author and editors would like to thank Branden Fitelson for supplying a correction to this entry after publication.

Copyright © 2013 by
Jan Woleński <wolenski@if.uj.edu.pl>

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