The Influence of Islamic Thought on Maimonides
A visionary thinker and prolific author, Moses Maimonides (1135/8-1204) writes on topics ranging from physics to Jewish Law, theology to politics, psychology to Biblical exegesis, and from philosophy to medicine. Rich and complex in their own right, Maimonides' writings must, however, be understood within their 12th-13th century Islamicate context, revealing, as they do, the imprint of earlier Greek and Islamic philosophical traditions. In this entry, we will uncover some of the Islamic philosophical and theological underpinnings of Maimonides' work with a focus on the Theology of Aristotle, and the writings of al-Farabi (ca. 870-950), Avicenna (Ibn Sina, 980-1037), al-Ghazali (1058-1111), and Averroes (Ibn Rushd, 1126-1198).
A few preliminary caveats and reminders:
(a) It is not possible to cover every aspect of Maimonides' Islamic philosophical heritage (even if we restrict ourselves to the aforementioned text traditions) in a format of this sort; one might certainly speak of other Islamic writers whose works arguably influenced Maimonides. To best do justice to this topic, I will proceed in what follows by selecting instructive and representative bits of primary text from Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed (henceforth, Guide), and comparing them with ideas from the aforementioned texts. In this way, readers will be helped to see a selection of continuities in philosophical tradition between five important Islamic text traditions and Maimonides. By proceeding in this way, I additionally hope to have supplied readers with appropriate Arabic philosophical resource materials for further study. It might be noted too that given my current goal of facilitating as much active engagement on the part of as wide a range of readers as possible, I have limited the cited Arabic texts in this study to those that are currently available in English translation.
(b) While I end with a selected bibliography of secondary readings, readers ought to be aware in particular of Shlomo Pines' “Translator's Introduction” to his English translation of the Guide, a well-known and commonly cited essay in which he addresses the Greek and Islamic sources at play in Maimonides' thought. While a classic resource, Pines’ essay is subject to scholarly debate (e.g. as we will see below, pace Pines, more scholars are finding the direct influence of Averroes and al-Ghazali in Maimonides’ Guide).
(c) Finally, it ought also be noted in way of introduction that Maimonides' philosophy is, as we will see, deeply imbued with Neoplatonic metaphysical notions such as “emanation” (or “overflow”) and divine transcendence. While I will talk about these notions and their occurrence in Maimonides and in his Islamic philosophical context, and while I will try to give a basic sense of how these ideas work, any attempt to fully explain these Plotinian metaphysical ideas falls outside the scope of the current entry. In this respect, readers are invited to consult primary and secondary sources on Plotinus and Neoplatonic metaphysics in Greek, Jewish, and Islamic sources.
- 1. Methodological Preamble
- 2. Overview of Maimonides’ Islamic Philosophical Backdrop: Theology of Aristotle and Beyond
- 3. God
- 4. Cosmos, Creation, Emanation
- 5. Overflow
- 6. Active Intellect, Human Intellect, Immortality, and Prophecy
- 7. Imagination, Politics, Allegory
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Highlighting the importance of understanding Maimonides within the context of his Islamic intellectual milieu, Kraemer begins his magisterial study of Maimonides’ life and works with the following quote:
We are the children of our landscape. (Lawrence Durrell, Justine)
going on to note that
Only when we read Arabic sources can we have a true picture of this period, identify the actors in this drama, and have reliable knowledge of circumstances and events. (Kraemer 2010, 15).
In this spirit, Kraemer’s study draws strongly on Arabic historical, literary, philosophical, and other sources to situate Maimonides’ thinking. Sensitive to this contextual approach, Pines begins his edition and translation of the Guide with a consideration of myriad Islamic (and Greek) philosophical sources, and while Hyman notes that “it should not…be inferred that medieval Jewish philosophy was a branch of Islamic philosophy,” he goes on to note that “by and large Jewish philosophy was a continuation of the philosophy which flourished in the Islamic world” (Hyman 1996, 678-679). Sensitive to the impact of the Islamic context, Stroumsa reminds us that “…Maimonides was an avid reader, who took pains to remain abreast of contemporary scholarship in general and philosophical scholarship in particular… ” (Stroumsa 2009, 173, n. 69), and “that Maimonides, who only rarely cited his sources, read all he could find, and that he had no qualms about perusing the theological or legal works of non-Jews…” (Stroumsa 2009, xii). Responding to Davidson’s more conservative approach to reading sources into the text, Stroumsa adds, “Maimonides’ philosophical erudition was no doubt far broader than would seem to be the case only on the basis of his explicit references. We must therefore be alert to the possibility that Maimonides’ words reflect, whether by way of acceptance or by way of reaction and criticism, his knowledge of the works of thinkers whose names are not explicitly mentioned” (Stroumsa 2009, 24-5).
One of the most important sources to keep in mind when reading Maimonides and Islamic medieval philosophers is the Theology of Aristotle, a text that, while thought by Jewish and Islamic philosophers to have been a work of Aristotle, was in fact an edited summary of parts of books 4-6 of Plotinus’ Enneads. Likely dated to the 9th century and edited by al-Kindi (and/or members of his circle), this text—as well as the rest of the Plotiniana Arabica and the Kalâm fî mahd al-khair (lit. the Discourse on the Pure Good, known to some in its later Latin translation as the Liber de Causis, or Book of Causes)—should be read in connection with any serious study of Maimonides. In way of summary, we might highlight the following key ideas in the Theology of Aristotle that play important roles for later Jewish and Islamic thinkers:
- God is a pure unity who is pure goodness and pure being
- God is creator, first cause of all beings
- God emanates forth Intellect, then Soul, then Nature
Here, we have a uniquely modified set of Plotinian insights that feature prominently in Maimonidean thought. For Plotinus (following Plato’s own highlighting of a Form of the Good over and above the Form of Being), God is himself a pure One identical to goodness per se, and is as such entirely above and beyond intellect and even entirely above and beyond being. In the Theology of Aristotle tradition God is identified with pure unity and goodness, but is as such also identified with a pure grade of being. And while the Theology of Aristotle itself describes God as the maker of Intellect, as we move into the reception of this tradition into al-Farabi and Avicenna, we find that qua pure being and goodness God is also a pure intellect—a point which adds a decidedly Aristotelian element to the description of God. Thinkers such as Maimonides working within the Theology of Aristotle and Aristotle traditions in this way combine Plotinian and Aristotelian insights about God, mutually highlighting the Plotinian sense of God as pure unity and the Aristotelian sense of God as self-knowing intellect. Working within this set of parameters, Maimonides and others are also helped to a sense of God as the ultimate cause of all being (and not simply a picture of God as a cause of motion, as one finds in Aristotle proper).
The Theology of Aristotle also introduces two critical insights about creation which one finds too in al-Farabi and Avicenna:
- Creation is emanation
- God creates/emanates in virtue of His onwmost essential goodness
In whatever way one winds up interpreting Maimonides’ own view on creation, it is important to bear in mind that he is writing in a philosophical context in which there is plenty of strong precedent for identifying the language of “creation” (and even “creation ex nihilo”) with the idea that God eternally emanates forth in virtue of his ownmost essence as the pure good (a point itself rooted in Plotinus in the idea of an “unjealous” God in Plato’s Timaeus). It might be additionally noted that in the Theology of Aristotle, this bountiful picture of God—linked in a range of medieval Islamic texts to the idea of God’s generosity—is also overtly linked to the idea that God creates without thought or deliberation. While in and of itself (in another theological context) this might sound like an insulting way to describe God (i.e. “thoughtless”), in the context at hand, it is part of the most honored and exalted way of describing God, emphasizing in particular just how essentially creation flows from God’s bountiful goodness. For God to deliberate about creation in this context would be to make of creation an afterthought when, on the contrary, giving life to the world is here highlighted as part and parcel of who God essentially is. We can find this idea of “thoughtlessness” in a sense in even Avicenna’s more Aristotelian description of God as an Intellect: even qua Intellect, Avicenna’s God creates “in virtue of His very essence,” and not by a process of reasoning as we might understand it in human contexts.
Reflecting on our other sources, we ought to keep some starting points in mind:
(a) Regarding al-Farabi: In what follows we will focus more on al-Farabi than on Avicenna and Averroes since al-Farabi is a thinker for whom Maimonides expresses strong respect (citing him in the Guide more than any other Islamic thinker; Rudavsky 2010, 7), but also because al-Farabi, as the earliest of these thinkers, exerted influence on many of the ideas in Avicenna, Averroes, and other Islamic philosophers.
(b) Regarding Avicenna: While Avicennian notions can arguably be found in Maimonides, his view of the thinker is complicated. In a letter to Ibn Tibbon, Maimonides clearly states that Avicenna's philosophy is of lesser value than al-Farabi's. That said, even in that context Maimonides characterizes Avicenna’s ideas as subtle and exacting, and as worthy of study.
(c) Regarding Averroes: While we know that Maimonides held a great respect for the writings of Averroes, Pines and Ivry maintain that these writings were most likely unknown to Maimonides until after the completion of his Guide (Pines 1963, cviii). In contrast, W. Z. Harvey has explored the resonance of Averroes in Guide 2.25 (W. Z. Harvey 1989), and Stroumsa—arguing that Maimonides had access to Averroes’ Decisive Treatise and Exposition—goes so far as to suggest that “…the Guide can in some ways be seen as a reaction and answer to Averroes” (Stroumsa 2009, 73).
(d) Regarding al-Ghazali: While Pines concludes that Maimonides must have been aware of al-Ghazali’s work just in virtue of his intellectual context (e.g. Pines 1963, cxxvi-cxxxi), others go further and highlight particular textual resonances of al-Ghazali in Maimonides. While leaving open how Maimondies might have learned of Ghazali’s ideas, Davidson addresses al-Ghazali in Maimonides’ discussion of creation (Davidson 1979, esp. 28, 30, and 33), and also cites Maimonides’ use of a particular image in al-Ghazali of a youth who prefers toys to sexual pleasures in his attempt to describe our own inability as embodied humans to imagine the delights of the spiritual world, S. Harvey argues for a link between Maimonides and Ghazali’s respective “Book(s) of Knowledge” (Harvey 2005), Eran explores Ghazali and Maimonides on the World to Come (Eran 2001), Gil‘adi considers the possible relation between the title of Maimonides’ magnum opus and al-Ghazali’s description of God as “guide of perplexed” (dalīl al-mutaḥayyirīn) (Gil'adi 1979), and Stroumsa not only identifies a reference to one of al-Ghazali’s works in Maimonides’ “Epistle to Yemen” (Stroumsa 2009, 25-26), but argues more broadly (69-70) for the impact of al-Ghazali on Maimonides through the influence of the Islamic theologian/mystic on the Almohads under whose rulership Maimonides lived, and many of whose theological and legal principles, Stroumsa argues, were influential on Maimonides’ thought. Stroumsa also argues that if Maimonides knew Averroes’ Faṣl al-maqāl (as she thinks he did), then “it is also very likely that he was familiar with Ghazali’s Fayṣal al-tafriqa” (Stroumsa 2009, 124).
Like his Islamic predecessors and contemporaries, Maimonides is keenly interested in understanding the relationship between philosophy and religion. In the context of such an inquiry, the attempt to understand God is doubly important, since the idea of a divine being features prominently not only in religious tradition, but also as a foundational element of both Neoplatonic and Aristotelian philosophical theory.
Following on Biblical, Neoplatonic and Aristotelian insights, Maimonides' God is an absolutely simple, absolutely necessary, and completely uncaused unity who is a pure intellect and first cause. As already noted, Maimonides and many of his Islamic philosophical predecessors reveal a blend of Plotinian with non-Plotinian Aristotelian ideas about God (and the cosmos more generally) under the influence of such texts as the Theology of Aristotle. Reading this text as Aristotle's own, Maimonides and his Islamic predecessors hold a blend of Aristotelian and Neoplatonic views, including Aristotelian views which are themselves often highly Neoplatonized. The blending together of God-as-pure-unity and God-as-intellect is one such example. In these Neoplatonized Aristotelian descriptions of God, we might place Maimonides in clear conversation with his Arabic philosophical predecessors.
Maimonides follows the Islamic Neoplatonic tradition of envisioning God as the purest of unlimited being, a kind of pure being so utterly unified that it transcends any internal divisions. This theme can be clearly found in the Theology of Aristotle and in the Kalâm fî maḥd al-khair in the identification of God as “Pure Being” or “Being Only,” as well as in Almohad (see Stroumsa 2009) and Mu‘tazilite theology of the time. It is this radical sense of unity that accounts for Maimonides' strong negative theology (about which we will say more below): since God is utterly and absolutely unified, He is a subject about whom we can predicate nothing (since, after all, predication implies of a subject that he is one thing or another, thus suggesting some limitation). As such, God, as subject, transcends the normal parameters of language and conceptualization.
On the theme of divine unity, Maimonides stresses:
He, may He be exalted, is one in all respects; no multiplicity should be posited in Him; there is no notion that is superadded to His essence (G 1.52, P 378)
Completely different from all other existents, Maimonides' God is one in all respects, an idea mirroring the God of the Neoplatonic Islamic philosophers before him. Turning to al-Farabi, we find:
…[God's] distinction from all the others is due to a oneness which is its essence (al-dhāt)…Thus the First…deserves more than any other one the name and meaning (of “the one” ) (PS, 68-69)
In this same spirit of emphasizing the divine oneness, and developing too an idea of God as the unique necessary existent, Avicenna explains of God that,
…it is not possible that the true nature which that whose existence is necessary be composed of a multitude at all… (see HM, H 241)
Avicenna concludes further along these lines that God, the being whose existence is necessary, is “a unity, while everything else is a composite duality” (see HM, H 247). To draw out the idea of God's unity, Avicenna emphasizes that God alone is the essence that is one with existence, whereas all other things enjoy an existence that is, on the contrary, separate from their essence. In speaking about this feature of non-God subjects, Avicenna speaks of existence being added to essence, a claim that has often wrongly been interpreted as suggesting that existence is for Avicenna literally an accident (see Rahman 1958; Morewedge 1972). The details of this misreading aside, the echo of this Avicennian insight can certainly be heard in Maimonides' own description of existence as “an accident attaching to what exists,” as well as in his repeatedly claiming (as above) that there is no “superadded notion” to God's purely singular and unchanging essence (G 1.57, P 132). Maimonides further emphasizes along these lines that attributes used to describe God are “remote from the essence of the thing of which it is predicated,” and that such descriptions do not at all signify “differing notions subsisting within the essence of the agent” (G 1.52, P 378). Further mirroring the Avicennian ideas of divine necessity and essential unity, Maimonides adds:
…As for that which has no cause for its existence, there is only God, may He be magnified and glorified, who is like that. For this is the meaning of our saying about Him, may He be exalted, that His existence is necessary. Accordingly, His existence is identical with His essence and His true reality, and His essence is His existence. Thus His essence does not have an accident attaching to it when it exists, in which case its existence would be a notion that is superadded to it…Consequently He exists, but not through an existence other than His essence… (G 1.57, P 132)
Maimonides here and elsewhere echoes Avicenna's idea of God as “necessary being”—literally, “The Necessary of Existence” (wājib al-wujūd)—whose essential nature it is to exist, and who, as such, does not rely on another for His existence. Maimonides' God is, to use the language of Avicenna, the proven existent which “when it is considered in itself, has its existence by necessity” and which, as such, has no cause (HM, H 241).
On the theme of divine simplicity, it is also worth considering the theological context in which Maimonides' denial of divine accidents and attributes takes place. A center-stage issue in Quran exegesis, the theme of divine attributes—or lack thereof—was the subject of much heated debate among Islamic theologians in Maimonides' immediate context. While Maimonides is extremely critical of the dialectical methods of the Kalam theologians (accusing them, for example, of using imagination instead of intellect to come to their conclusions about God), in stressing God's unity through the particular idea that God does not have “differing notions” subsisting in His essence, Maimonides is in step with those Kalam theologians in his Islamic milieu who stress, above all, the absolute unity of God and His lack of attributes. Reflecting on Maimonides’ upholding the joint ideas that God is absolutely one and that God has no body, Stroumsa argues for the influence of Almohadic legal theory and theology on Maimonides—a point seen too in his support for mandating belief in God's unity by law.
Following on the theme of God's unity, Maimonides emerges as a strong proponent of apophatic discourse, sometimes referred to as “negative theology,” which is a mode of talking about God with the sensitivity that, since God admits of no multiplicity, we cannot meaningfully (at least not in any straightforward or literal sense) ascribe any traits to Him. The very act of predication involved in attributions (formulas of the form “God is… ”) are doomed to failure in the light of God's utter unity. To approach God apophatically is, hence, to approach God with a heightened sensitivity to the failures of language to say very much about Him at all. This is called “negative theology” in the sense that claims about God (with the exception of such claims as “that He exists,” and “that He is pure being, pure goodness, and pure wisdom qua pure intellect”) are seen as never actually telling us anything substantive about God. At best we can come to understand what God is not. For example, Maimonides affirms that “anything that entails corporeality ought of necessity to be negated in reference to Him and that all affection likewise should be negated in reference to him” (G 1.55, P 128). For Maimonides, God “cannot have an affirmative attribute in any respect,” and so, affirmative predications about God cannot be taken as informing us about God's essential reality (G 1.58, P 135). As such, positive attributions about God actually bring one further away from—not closer to—an understanding of the divine:
Know that when you make an affirmation ascribing another thing to Him, you become more remote from Him in two respects: one of them is that everything you affirm is a perfection only with reference to us, and the other is that He does not possess a thing other than His essence… (G 1.59, P 139)
For Maimonides, language is limited in its ability to capture God's essence: “when the tongues aspire to magnify Him by means of attributive qualifications, all eloquence turns into weariness and incapacity!” (G 1.58, P 137).
It is in this spirit that Maimonides takes great pains to point out how the Bible itself, in its various detailed positive attributions about God, is not to be taken at face value. Maimonides explains that Biblical descriptions of divine “traits” are not to be seen as telling us anything about God's essential reality, but, rather:
…the numerous attributes possessing diverse notions that figure in the Scripture and that are indicative of Him, may he be exalted, are mentioned in reference to the multiplicity of His actions and not because of a multiplicity subsisting in His essence, and some of them, as we have made clear, also with a view to indicating His perfection according to what we consider as perfection (G 1.52, P 119)
To describe God is, here, to describe the effects God's being has on (or in) the world of humans. If we speak of God's mercy, we are speaking not of God's essential reality, but of the ways in which God's essential reality is manifest in the world—manifest, that is, in the well-ordered design of this world that, to the human mind, appears worthy of, for example, the designation “merciful”. One example Maimonides gives is of the well-ordered design of the embryo which is supplied with all needed protection and nourishment and with all the wonders that one can find in a study of biology, physiology, and embryology. While this kind of ordered design does not suggest for Maimonides that God has the attribute of mercy, it is indeed for him a manifestation of God’s essential wisdom and goodness. When this kind of ordered design leads one to claim that “God is merciful,” what is really being reflected is not that God has the attribute of mercy but that the wise order of the world—stemming from God’s own essential wisdom and goodness—is, qua well-thought through design that accommodates the embryo’s every need ensuring its health and nourishment, something that in the case of humans would well stem from the attribute of mercy. Denying attributes to God follows, for Maimonides, from a proper awareness of the nature of divine unity (as an essential and trait-less being as wisdom as goodness). This together with the idea that scriptural claims about God are not to be taken at face value can be found in earlier Islamic philosophical tradition as well. We will return to this theme below [see Section 7].
It is worth noting a strong affinity between Maimonides’ understanding of God’s manifestness in the order of nature and Averroes’ conception of God and providence which focuses heavily on God’s essential preservation of all species, and his role as the cause of being and unity in all hylomorphic substances. Emphasizing God’s relation in this regard to nature, Averroes speaks of
the divine mind which is like the single form of the single commanding art to which various arts are subordinated. Accordingly, one must understand that nature, when it produces something very highly organized without itself being intelligent, is inspired by active powers which are nobler than it and are called "intellect". (CAM 1502-3, G 111]
Envisioning, with Aristotle, a series of separate intellects moving the various celestial spheres, Averroes, commenting on Aristotle, speaks of sublunar nature being actualized by stars’ heat, the stars’ heat being generated by the separate intellects, and these separate intellects as ultimately being moved by God (through the separate intellects’ desire for God, their final cause). As Averroes notes in the lines leading up to the preceding quote:
As for the heats generated by the heats of the stars, which produce each distinct species of animals and which are potentially that species of animal, the power present in each one of these heats depends on the amount of the motions of the stars and their reciprocal proximity or remoteness; this power originates from the work of the divine mind… [CAM 1502, G 111]
In this way, Averroes can be seen to envision God (the “divine mind,” or we might say, divine wisdom) in the very contours of terrestrial and celestial nature. This Averroean model can in many ways be seen throughout Maimonides’ Guide.
For Maimonides, God is a pure knower described in Aristotelian terms as purely actualized intellect and as the act of knowing that knows itself.
As we have already seen, following a Plotinian notion of divine transcendence alongside an Aristotelian sense of God as a fully actualized Intellect, Maimonides and his Islamic predecessors and contemporaries describe God as an absolutely pure and undivided unity, and as a perfected, fully actualized Intellect (in this latter way prima facie deviating from Plotinus’ own sense of God as “above being” and “beyond intellect”). The notion of God as Intellect, rooted in Aristotle's own works, contrasts intellects which are less perfected with those which are more (or, in the case of God, fully) perfected in terms of lesser and greater degrees of actuality: while a lesser intellect is characterized at any given time by some degree of not-yet-actualized-potentiality (which is to say, it doesn't yet know everything), the intellect of God alone—being in a constant and unchanging state of complete knowledge—is described as being entirely devoid of unactualized potencies, residing always in a state of pure actualization.
We can certainly see this Aristotelian emphasis on the “God as knower” theme in al-Farabi, for whom God is “the first cause, the first intellect, and the first living” (al-sabab al-awwal wal-‘aql al-awwal wal-ḥayy al-awwal) (PS, 81). As “first cause” God is the ontological foundation of all being; as “first intellect” He is the repository of all knowledge and final cause of all knowing; and as “first living” He is the source of life itself. Emphasizing the idea of God's unique ontological status, Al-Farabi elaborates:
The First Existent (al-mawjūd al-awwal) is the First Cause (al-sabab al-awwal) of the existence of all the other existences (PS 56). It is free of every kind of deficiency…Thus its existence is the most excellent and precedes every other existence…It can in no way have existence potentially, and there is no possibility whatever that it should not exist…It is the existent for whose existence there can be no cause… (PS 57)
God is uncaused and admits of no unactualized potency; he is pure act and necessary existent.
Adding to this idea of God, and following further on an Aristotelian theme of God as pure knowing that knows itself, Maimonides adds:
Now when it is demonstrated that God, may He be held precious and magnified, is an intellect in actu (‘aql bil-fi‘l; Munk 1931, 114, line 4) and that there is absolutely no potentiality in Him—as is clear and shall be demonstrated—so that He is not by way of sometimes apprehending and sometimes not apprehending but is always an intellect in actu, it follows necessarily that he and the thing apprehended are one thing, which is His essence (dhāt). Moreover, the act of apprehension owing to which He is said to be an intellectually cognizing subject is in itself the intellect, which is His essence. Accordingly, He is always the intellect (al-‘aql) as well as the intellectually cognizing subject (al-‘āqil) and the intellectually cognized object (al-ma‘aqūl)… (G 1.68, P 165; Arabic at Munk 1931, 114)
In Maimonides' idea of God's pure activity of intellection, we are reminded of Al-Farabi's own Aristotelian account. Not to be confused with “active intellect” (to which we will return below), God (“the First”) is described by Al-Farabi as an “intellect in actu,” or, an “actual intellect” (al-‘aql bil-fi‘l, literally, the intellect “in act,” or “actualized”) (PS 70). Following on this idea, and mirrored most evidently in the quote from Maimonides above, Farabi follows Aristotle in describing God as the thinking subject who thinks himself:
…for the One whose identity (ipseitas; hūwiyya) is intellect is intelligible by the One whose identity is intellect (PS 70). In order to be intelligible the First is in no need of another essence outside itself which would think it but it itself thinks its own essence. As a result of its thinking its own essence, it becomes actually thinking and intellect, and, as a result of its essence thinking (intelligizing) it, it becomes actually intelligized…[It] is intellect and thinking by thinking its own essence…[In the case of God, the First], the intellect (al-‘aql), the thinker (al-‘āqil) and the intelligible (and intelligized) (al-ma‘qūl) (PS 70) have…one meaning and are one essence and one indivisible substance (PS 71-3)
It is precisely this Aristotelian description of God (as subject and object of the pure act of knowing), together with a heightened Neoplatonic sensitivity to God's unity (arguably seen more emphatically in Avicenna than even in al-Farabi) which grounds Maimonides' own understanding of the divine.
This same identification of God as pure act can also be seen in Averroes who shares with his Neoplatonic Islamic philosophers and Maimonides a sense of God’s purity of act, as can be seen in his commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, and the sense there of God as:
the first mover [who] is eternal, substance, pure actuality and free from matter [CAM 1599, G 151].
Alongside his emphasis on God's utter unchanging and utterly transcendent unity, Maimonides also describes God as the creator and cause of all existence, a notion which seems to bring Him into more direct and immanent contact with the universe (as we have seen in Averroes’ account in section 3.1 above). For thinkers like al-Farabi, Avicenna (and arguably, Maimonides) who emphasize a more robust sense of emanation than is found in Averroes and with it a more robust sense of God’s transcendence, there arises a philosophical tension (or perhaps we might say interplay) between God-as-transcendent (as the emanating source of all being) and God-as-immanent (as the power manifest in the workings of the universe). A tension/interplay can also be seen more broadly as a feature of Islamic and Jewish Neoplatonized accounts (including both Avicenna’s more transcendent and Averroes’ less transcendent accounts) in which the more transcendent Greek Plotinian idea of a divine source so unified that He is at once above intellect as well as “beyond being” is brought together with the less transcendent Aristotelian notion of God who is the pure being of perfected intellect.
We might also note that in the tension/interplay of divine immanence and transcendence in Maimonides’ Guide, we might discern affinities for each of the (competing) ideas of Avicenna and Averroes, the former emphasizing God’s transcendence, and the latter identifying God as an immanent first mover. Sometimes Maimonides’ knowing God is emphasized more immanently as “the form of the world” (G 1.69, P 166), and as the mover of the first sphere (G 1.72; G 2.1). Other times, Maimonides’ knowing God is emphasized in His transcendence—as even more transcendent than the rest of the separate cosmic intellects, with the reminder at Guide 2.4 that God is not to be identified as mover of the first sphere.
Commenting on the dual description of God-as-immanent and God-as-transcendent, Maimonides concludes at Guide 1.72,
On the one hand, there is a demonstration of His separateness, may He be exalted, from the world and of His being free from it; and on the other hand, there is a demonstration that the influence of His governance and providence in every part of the world…exists… (G 1.72, P 193)
(Given, though, that the rest of this chapter talks in Avicennian terms about the emanating divine overflow as it is found in active intellect (see sections 5 and 6 below for more on the “divine overflow” and “active intellect”), and given that providence is to be understood in terms of a human being's own relationship—via intellect—to this emanating active intellect (as becomes clear elsewhere in the Guide (e.g. G 3.52, P 624-6), the overall weight of Maimonides' might be seen to lie with Avicenna on the side of a transcendent, emanating God).
Following in the Greek and Islamic traditions before him, Maimonides sets out to carefully investigate the workings of the world—including terrestrial, celestial, and purely metaphysical realities. Based on our consideration of divine “acts” above, we can see how even investigations into the workings of corporeal nature can be seen as having explicitly theological significance in a Maimonidean context. In this spirit, Maimonides can be seen as finding value in the cosmological argument at play in Aristotle and Averroes according to which the workings of the world give rise to a proof for the existence of God as a first mover (though, it might be noted, that Maimonides, along with al-Farabi, Avicenna—and, in a somewhat different sense, Averroes—credits God with being the cause not only of motion, but of existence as well). In this way, even studying the workings of nature can be seen in the service of theology—a point borne out further when we consider our above discussion of Maimonides and Averroes on God’s manifest role in the order of nature. In this regard, we might note that Maimonides goes so far as to describe divine actions at 2.32 as natural actions. Furthermore, in a context where God Himself cannot be known per se and where (as we have seen above) descriptions of God are best understood as describing not God, but the effects of God in the world (that is, the manifestation of God’s wisdom and goodness in the well-ordered design and workings of nature), a study of how the world works can be seen as a study of God's actions (and as such, as an attempt to better get to know God). As Maimonides makes clear, “There is…no way to apprehend Him except…through the things He has made…” (G 1.34, P 74).
In relation to the cosmos, it is clear that Maimonides' God stands as first cause and source for all existence. Far less, clear, however, is Maimonides' precise understanding of what God's role as “first cause and source for all existence”—His role, that is, as Creator—amounts to. (For an overview of key Arabic creation terms at play in Maimonides’ Islamic milieu as well as in his Jewish Neoplatonic context, the reader is well-served to consult the Encyclopaedia of Islam entries on ibdā‘, khalq, ḥudūth al-‘alām; see too Altman and Stern on Neoplatonic creation terms in Israeli’s lexicon (including also al-ikhtirā‘) and their relation to Greek and Islamic text traditions, including al-Kindi (Almann and Stern 1958; see Israeli’s Book of Definitions 66-68, with comments at 68-74).
At Guide 2.13, Maimonides seems, at least prima facie, to embrace a doctrine of creation ex nihilo:
…the opinion of all who believe in the Law of Moses our Master, peace be on him, is that the world as a whole—I mean to say, every existent other than God, may He be exalted—was brought into existence by God after having been purely and absolutely nonexistent, and that God, may He be exalted, had existed alone, and nothing else—neither an angel nor a sphere nor what subsists within the sphere. Afterwards, through His will and His volition, He brought into existence out of nothing all the beings as they are, time itself being one of the created things…
In the context of 2.13, this view is contrasted with two other cosmogonical views: 1) creation ex aliquo (i.e., the Platonic cosmogony on which God invests an eternally existing material substrate with forms); and 2) the Aristotelian position that the world is eternal. Suffice it to say that there is much scholarly debate over the exact nature of Maimonides' true view on creation. First of all, there are theorists (following in the tradition of Leo Strauss) who view Maimonides as committed to esoteric writing strategies rooted in socio-political considerations—essentially, on such a view, Maimonides will often be seen to have written the exact opposite of what he truly believed. For these theorists, the stated view of Maimonides will almost always be in extreme contrast to his true, unstated view [for a related discussion, see Section 7]. Applying this theoretical starting point to the case at hand, the fact that Maimonides seems to embrace creation ex nihilo would suggest to some that he truly believed in Aristotelian eternity, the opposite view.
There are, though, other compelling reasons to question Maimonides' view of creation. Leaving aside, that is, any particular commitments to Straussian writing strategies, we might simply note that Maimonides' own treatment of creation and its various sub-themes seems to leave room for interpretation, oftentime admitting of ambiguous—and even changing—details. Careful readings and re-readings of the Guide seem to support more than one way of understanding the precise nature of and relationship between such concepts as: creation [simpliciter], creation ex nihilo, creation ex aliquo, creation taken in a temporal sense, creation taken in a non-temporal sense, continuous creation, ontological dependency, emanation, and will, among other inter-related concepts. “Will,” for example, is sometimes described as a feature of creation ex nihilo, but other times seems to emerge as a feature of “creation” more broadly; but, as we have seen earlier in our discussion of The Theology of Aristotle, in Maimonides' philosophical context “creation” (and even “creation ex nihilo”) might in theory be used to describe even Neoplatonic eternal emanation or Aristotelian eternity viewed in a certain way (for the explicit reconciliation of creation language with doctrines of eternity in Maimonides' immediate philosophical milieu, see Averroes). And so, scholarly debates about Maimonides' true view on this matter abound: while some attribute to him a view of creation in time, others find in Maimonides a secret belief in Platonic creation ex aliquo (Davidson 1979, 16-40), a secret belief in the Aristotelian view of eternity, or a belief in the identity between the notion of Biblical creation and Aristotelian eternity (W. Z. Harvey 1981).
Whatever his ultimate view, Maimonides certainly engages the idea of creation, describing God as the Creator (a description that is, of course, also used in the Theology of Aristotle tradition in a way that has nothing to do with the Bible, and nothing to do with “creation in time”):
For the universe exists in virtue of the existence of the Creator, and the latter continually endows it with permanence in virtue of the thing that is spoken of as overflow—as we shall make clear in one of the chapters of this Treatise… (G 1.69, P 168)
Here, God emerges as the cause (in at least some sense) of the world's existence. We see here too an emphasis on the continuous relationship between God and the world in this regard: As cause of the world's “permanence,” God is a continual sustainer. Here too, we learn of the idea of a cosmic overflow, an idea to which we will return below.
Looking to his Islamic context, it is important always keep in mind that describing God as the source and cause of being (and even describing God as a “creator”) can mean very different things, and so care must be taken not to assume we know what Maimonides is talking about just because his God is a creating source and cause. Describing God as a cause of being, or as a creator, or even as a creator ex nihilo might mean—as it does in al-Kindi—that He brings about the existence of the world in time (in this way standing in clear opposition to an Aristotelian view of eternity or a Plotinian view of emanation), or it might mean something else entirely: It might mean for instance that God is an eternal ontological source. This idea can be seen in Avicenna for whom God is the Being eternally engaged in an ongoing process of emanation, and in this way eternally generating existence itself. This idea of God-as-source can be seen too in a somewhat different way in Averroes for whom God-as-creator is the eternal-ontological source, the Aristotelian uncaused cause who eternally sustains the universe and—absent an Avicennian process of emanationist intermediation—is the constant productive source—and in this sense, the creator—of cosmic existence (see Leaman 1988, esp. 42-71 and Davidson 1987; see too Taylor 2012a, Other Internet Resources). Averroes in this regard champions an ab aeterno generation which can in part be characterized as not-quite-a-creation-view, and can in part be characterized as not-quite-an-eternity-view (depending, of course, on what one means by those terms):
But in truth it [i.e. the world] is neither truly generated, nor is it truly eternal. For what is truly generated is necessarily corruptible, and what is truly eternal has no cause…Thus the doctrines about the world are not all so far apart from one another that some of them should be charged as unbelief and others not. (DT sections 19-20, B 15-16)
According to Averroes, it is important to acknowledge that the existence of the world has a cause, and so any philosophical account of eternity that suggests otherwise won't do, whereas it is equally important to recognize that existence itself along with time “extend continuously at both extremes,” and so, any unreflective religious commitment to origination in time won't do. Exposing the weaknesses in holding either that the world is created in time (muhdath) or that it is eternal (in the sense of “uncaused”), Averroes instead upholds a notion of the world's being “generated ab aeterno.”
For Avicenna and for Averroes—though in different ways—the idea of eternity does not exclude talking about the existence of the universe as a created effect of God: for Avicenna, God is the “cause of being” in the sense that He is the eternally emanating source of being, whereas for Averroes, God is the “cause of being” in the sense of an ab aeterno non-emanative source of generation. Maimonides—given all of his overt talk of emanation (fayḍ) in the Guide—would seem best grouped with Avicenna on this issue, though as we have seen above, other aspects of his view of God’s role in the universe resonate strongly with Averroes. To be sure, the exact nature of Maimonides’ view—and the extent of its similarities to and/or influences from the views of Avicenna and Averroes—seems reasonably open to debate. Given the subtle interplay of the notions of emanation, creation, eternal sustenance, and ontological causal grounding—in addition to Maimonides' own arguably ambiguous claims about creation—it is difficult to know for sure what Maimonides is advocating, even when he is advocating “creation.”
Adding to the conceptual complexity, one might note too that there are, in Maimonides' own Islamic context, debates about just how to understand the Quranic description of a Creator God. While Quran II, 117 and VI, 101 describe God as the Badī‘, or Absolute Creator, it is unclear exactly what is meant by the activity of ibdā‘ (absolute creation, or innovation) and how it relates to an act of ikhtirā‘ (invention, origination, or making anew). Looking to certain Islamic interpretations of God's creative role as described in the Quran, the idea of “creation ex nihilo ” can be seen to fall away in light of Quranic verses—such as Quran XI, 7 (“…and His throne was on the water…”) and XLI, 2 (“Then He directed Himself towards the sky, and it was smoke”)—which can be taken (as they are by Averroes; see DT section 21, B 16), as overtly signifying substances co-eternal with God (such as the “smoke” of XLI, 2 taken as denoting an eternally co-existing something). For Averroes, the meaning of the Quran on creation is that “[the world's] form really is generated, whereas being itself and time extend continuously at both extremes…” (DT section 21, B 16). Along these lines, we might note that there is no reason that the ambiguity (or openness) of what the Quran means in its description of God should not have carried through to Maimonides' own thoughts on the Biblical account, where the philosophically relevant details of God's Genesis act of creation (brī’ah) are arguably left unspecified and open to interpretation.
Seen in this context, interpreting Maimonides' own views on creation—including difficulties in ascertaining what on his view counts as “the Biblical account” of creation—is difficult. We might add a further difficulty: Maimonides' overall treatment of creation is tempered by his acknowledgement (G 2.16) that the question of creation v. eternity is an open question—in other words, there is no conclusive proof, according to Maimonides, for creation and no conclusive proof for eternity (a claim which can be seen too in Averroes' Tahāfut, 1st discussion, 1st proof). In this spirit, Maimonides offers the following summary of a chapter in which the creation question has been considered:
To sum up: Nothing in the methods we have set forth in this chapter is capable either of establishing an opinion [about the eternity of the world] as correct or of proving it false or of arousing doubts with regard to it… (G 2.15, P 292)
Returning to our earlier citation, we find in Maimonides' description of God's creative act the idea of a cosmic overflow:
For the universe exists in virtue of the existence of the Creator, and the latter continually endows it with permanence in virtue of the thing that is spoken of as overflow—as we shall make clear in one of the chapters of this Treatise… (G 1.69, P 168)
Related to the question of God's ontologically grounding relationship to the cosmos, there emerges not only in Maimonides but in his Islamic philosophical context, an emanationist notion of divine “overflow” which incorporates—and, as it were, tries to reconcile—certain Aristotelian ideas about cosmic separate intellects (see De Anima 3.5, as well as Metaphysics Λ) together with overtly Neoplatonic ideas found in the Theology of Aristotle. For al-Farabi, as for Avicenna, the cosmic overflow is, in particular, a series of 10 emanating separate intellects, each linked to its own celestial sphere (and in turn to the various planets which respectively occupy those spheres), with the lowest of these separate intellects being al-‘aql al-fa‘‘āl, the “active intellect” (or: “agent intellect”). For al-Farabi and Avicenna, the active intellect is seen as the emanating source and support of the entire sublunar realm, and also as the source for all human knowledge, including prophecy. In the Arabic philosophical tradition, this active intellect is further identified with the “separate intellect” spoken of by Aristotle at De Anima 3.5 (though, other Islamic philosophers—such as Averroes, as well as ancient Greek commentators of Aristotle and contemporary Aristotle scholars would, in their various interpretations, deny the idea of an emanating intellect responsible for the existence of the world in De Anima 3.5).
That Maimonides is influenced by at least some of these ideas about overflow and active intellect is certain. Offering an elaboration of the idea of overflow at Guide 2.11 (G 2.11, P 275), Maimonides describes the cosmogonical activity through which the cosmos—as seen first in a series of intellects—is generated. Preparing in 2.11 to address the world's having been created in time, Maimonides talks of the divine overflow, promising us that “these views do not contradict anything said by our prophets and the sustainer of our Law” (G 2.11, P 276). On the views in question, there is a divine overflow that brings about a series of cosmic intellects, these intellects themselves being related through a process of overflow to one another and to the realities which follow from them respectively. He begins:
the overflow (al-fayḍ) coming from Him, may He be exalted, for the bringing into being of separate intellects overflows likewise from these intellects, so that one of them brings another one into being and this continue up to the active intellect. With the latter, the bringing into being of separate intellects comes to an end (G 2.11, P 275; Arabic at Munk 1931, 192).
Here, Maimonides rehearses the idea, seen clearly in his Islamic predecessors, that there are a series of intellects which generate one another (i.e. the highest generating the next highest, and so on until the lowest intellect, viz. active intellect). Maimonides then goes on to mirror the idea, also found in al-Farabi and Avicenna, that each intellect additionally generates the body of its sphere, and that there is, furthermore, a set of influences which these spheres wield over the generation and corruption of terrestrial, corporeal beings on earth:
Moreover a certain other act of bringing into being overflows from every separate intellect until the spheres come to an end with the sphere of the moon. After it there is the body subject to generation and corruption, I mean the first matter [al-mādda al-ūlā (Munk 1931, 192), referring to Aristotelian prime matter] and what is composed of it. Furthermore, forces from every sphere enter the elements until their overflow is completed with the completion of generation and corruption (G 2.11, P 275).
All in all, Maimonides at Guide 2.11 wishes to
show that governance overflows from the deity, may He be exalted, to the intellects according to their rank; that from the benefits received by the intellects, good things and lights overflow to the bodies of the spheres; and that from the spheres—because of the greatness of the benefits they have received from their principles—forces and good things overflow to this body subject to generation and corruption (G 2.11, P 275).
To be sure, Maimonides here mirrors ideas found in earlier Islamic authors. In this regard, consider al-Farabi's own explanation of the cosmic overflow:
The First [i.e. God] is that from which everything which exists comes into existence…The genesis of that which comes into existence from it takes place by way of an emanation (fayḍ) (PS 88), the existence of which is due to the existence of something else, so that the existence of something different from the First emanates from the First's existence… (PS 89-91)
Going on to elaborate the unfolding of the universe from God, the first intellect, al-Farabi describes the emanation of 10 discrete intellects from the First, explaining how the dual intellection of each of these intellects (intellection of its own essence on the one hand, and intellection of God on the other) in turn results in the coming into being of (a) a heaven or celestial sphere, and (b) the intellect below it:
From the First emanates the existence of the Second. This Second is, again, an utterly incorporeal substance, and is not in matter. It thinks of its own essence and thinks the First. What it thinks of its own essence is no more than its essence. As a result of its thinking of the First, a third existent follows necessarily from it; and as a result of its substantification in its specific essence, the existence of the First Heaven follows necessarily. The existence of the Third, again, is not in matter, its substance is intellect, and it thinks its own essence and thinks the First. As a result of its substantification in its specific essence, the existence of the sphere of the fixed stars follows necessarily, and as a result of its thinking of the First, a fourth existence follows necessarily… (PS 101-3)
And so on until the last intellect arises. This last intellect arising in the great cosmic chain of being is the active intellect, described by al-Farabi here as the “eleventh existence.” For al-Farabi, the active intellect is—as in other Arabic philosophical texts—the 10th of the emanated intellects; its description as “eleventh existence” does not challenge that idea, but simply follows from the fact that Farabi counts God as a first intellect above the other separate intellects, the first emanated intellect after God as the first intellect (separate, that is, from God), and so on until the active intellect, which, as the 10th emanated intellect after God, is the “eleventh existence,” (see PS II.3.9-10, W 105; PS IV.13.2, W 203).
With al-Farabi and Avicenna, Maimonides adopts a cosmology of 10 separate intellects, with active intellect governing the sublunar realm in which we live. With his Islamic predecessors, Maimonides additionally identifies these separate intellects with the angels spoken of in religious tradition. One Islamic philosophical example of this view can be seen in al-Farabi who, in the introductory summary to his treatise on the perfect state, describes the ten separate cosmic intellects as “the existents which should be believed to be the angels ” (PS 39), and as those “of which it should be said that they are the angels ” (PS 41).
On the question of being's source, while Maimonides shares with his Islamic predecessors a commitment to God's role as the ultimate cause of the world, he additionally seems to share with al-Farabi and Avicenna, and in opposition to the views of Averroes, the idea that the active intellect is a dator formarum (a giver of forms). On this view, the active intellect actually supplies the world in which we live with its forms and as such, plays a crucial causal role in the very formation of existence. In this sense, the active intellect is allowed to play a shared role in God's creative, sustaining role as source of existence (in whatever way that process is ultimately understood).
That Maimonides is influenced by earlier Islamic writings on overflow and active intellect is certain. What is uncertain, though, is how all the details of these ideas play out exactly in his own ultimate view of creation. Maimonides' own views on the issues related to creation—the necessitation of creation, the role of will, and the possibility of eternality—are, as we have already said, subject to much debate, and for good reason given how many different things he says about these subjects. Given the complexity of Maimonides' view of creation one must be careful not to make too many assumptions about what exactly is entailed by the Maimonidean “overflow” view. Not only can one not take Maimonides' talk of “overflow” as automatically committing him to the eternal emanation view espoused by Avicenna, but, one can't, it seems, be too sure of what it means at all—even in Avicenna. In this spirit, we might cite al-Farabi's own reminder of the vicissitudes of language in trying to explain the nature of the world's deepest underpinnings. Al-Farabi warns of taking cosmological spatial languages of “higher and lower ” too literally, and offers the same warning for the language of “overflow”:
Indeed by “higher” and “lower,” he means the venerable and superior, not spatial location…It is the same with what [philosophers say] about the “overflowing” of the intellect to the soul and the “overflowing” of the soul to nature. By that, he means only the benefit the intellect provides by assisting the soul to retain the universal forms when it apprehends their particulars…By the “overflowing” of the soul to nature, he means the benefit it provides by yearning for what is useful for its subsistence… (HTO sections 71-73; B 163-4).
Yet one more reason to take care in approaching Maimonides'—or anyone else's—emanationist account of cosmic overflow. In fact, Maimonides himself mirrors this insight at Guide 2.12 where in the context of trying to explain some of the different ways the term “overflow” can be used, and trying to explain what sense there is in using the term to describe God's activity, he stresses that “we are not capable of finding the true reality of a term that would correspond to the true reality of the notion” (G 2.12, P 279). In fact, this sensitivity to the temperamental nature of language when it comes to transmitting important truths leads us to another key aspect of Maimondean thought, one too which is deeply influenced by its Islamic context and to which we will turn below (see Section 7).
We have seen the Islamic philosophical context of Maimonides' cosmology of separate intellects (the “angels”), with active intellect at the helm of the sublunar world in which we live. For Maimonides—as for his Islamic philosophical predecessors and contemporaries—the active intellect is an important governing principle for the sublunar realm, a cosmic intellectual principle which, in addition to whatever other roles it plays in the workings of our terrestrial realm, plays a crucial role in human knowledge—including prophecy, and in fact serves even as the foundation for a theory of immortality.
With Islamic philosophers before him, Maimonides describes the active intellect as an overflow from God which overflows onto humans, giving them knowledge and leading them towards perfection. Expositing the Psalms 36:10 verse, “For with Thee is the fountain of life; in Thy light do we see light,” Maimonides explains that
through the overflow of the intellect that has overflowed from Thee [i.e., God], we intellectually cognize, and consequently we receive correct guidance, we draw inferences, and we apprehend the intellect. Understand this. (G 2.12, P 280)
Commenting on this cosmic dynamic at the very start of the Guide, Maimonides understands the Genesis 1:26-27 idea that man was created “in the image” of God as pointing to the divine link between God and man found in the human intellect (and its link to active intellect):
Now man possesses as his proprium something in him that is very strange as it is not found in anything else that exists under the sphere of the moon, namely, intellectual apprehension (al-idrāk al-‘aqlī). In the exercise of this, no sense, no part of the body, none of the extremities are used; and therefore this apprehension was likened unto the apprehension of the deity…It was because of this something, I mean because of the divine intellect (al-‘aql al-ilāhī) conjoined (al-muttaṣil) with man, that it is said of the latter that he is in the image of God and in His likeness… (G 1.1; P 23; Pines' use of italics indicates Maimonides' use of Hebrew in his text; for Arabic, see Munk 1931, 15).
It is in our intellectual apprehension that we are most like unto God. In fact, described not only as a likeness to God but as an overflow from God, the human moment of intellect may be seen as the mark of divine presence in man. Bemoaning the absence among humans of a pure state of fully actualized intellect, Maimonides allegorically exposits the Genesis Biblical account of Adam's transgressions in the Garden of Eden as man's falling away from his God-given intellect—an intellect, described above as a “divine intellect” here described further as an overflow from God:
For the intellect that God made overflow (afāḍa; Munk 1931, 16) unto man and that is the latter's ultimate perfection, was that which Adam had been provided with before disobeyed. It was because of this that it was said of him that he was created in the image of God and in His likeness…(G 1.2; P 24; Pines' use of italics indicates Maimonides' use of Hebrew in his text).
On the epistemological/psychological details of active intellect, Maimonides appears to follow a Farabian tradition in at least some respects. With Aristotle, al-Farabi describes the goal of human existence as the attainment of happiness. Al-Farabi goes on to describe this state of human perfection in at least partly passive terms—as something which is “given to the possible beings capable of receiving it ” (PR, N1 35). In this context, the “giver” emerges as active intellect. Al-Farabi describes the purpose of active intellect as “true and supreme happiness ” (PR, N1 38), and further clarifies that the human being can have this happiness “only when the active intellect first gives the first intelligibles, which constitute the primary knowledge…” (PR, N1 35).
For al-Farabi and Avicenna, as for Maimonides, this “giving” activity of active intellect is described in particular as an emanative overflow, and is seen as foundational to the activity of human knowing. Contrasting human intellection from God's own fully actualized state of intellection (see above), al-Farabi follows Aristotle and speaks of the actualization process of human intellect as requiring an activating cause:
…neither the rational faculty nor what is provided in man by nature has the wherewithal to become of itself intellect in actuality. To become intellect in actuality it needs something else which transfers it from potentiality to actuality… (PS IV.13.1, W 199).
The activating cause needed to bring man from a state of potential to a state of actual knowing is the active intellect (sometimes translated as “agent” intellect). Rooted in Aristotle's own account of soul at De Anima 3.5 (BWA, 591), this idea stands as a cornerstone to Islamic—and Maimonidean—philosophical theories of epistemology, prophecy, and even afterlife and immortality. How to best interpret what Aristotle is actually trying to say at De Anima 3.5 need not concern us. Looking, rather, for the features of Aristotle's text which served as a basis for various Islamic philosophical accounts of active intellect, we find Aristotle's description of a “separable ” (BWA 592), essentially “active” (BWA 592) intellect “without [which] nothing thinks,” an “impassible,” and “unmixed” state of intellect, furthermore described by Aristotle not only as “immortal and eternal” (BWA 592) but as the perfected reality of the human mind once it is “set free from its present conditions ” (BWA 592).
In thinking about the Islamic philosophical context to Maimonides’ epistemology, we can talk broadly of the influence on his thought of Islamic Neoplatonized Aristotelian theories of Active Intellect: Human knowledge-formation relies on the activity of this lowest of the separate intellects. It is important, though, to keep in mind some important Islamic philosophical points of difference in considering Maimonides’ context: Starting with al-Farabi and Avicenna, both envision Active Intellect as a key reality outside of God and outside of the human mind which plays a key role in the human process of knowledge-formation. Following Taylor, however (see Taylor 2012), we might note that while Avicenna sees the ideas contained within Active Intellect as the source for the human intellect’s own ideas, al-Farabi sees the Active Intellect as merely preparing a person’s mind to abstract ideas from her sensory encounter with the material world—an idea, as Taylor points out, found too in Themistius’ Paraphrase of the De Anima in which he speaks of a “separate agent intellect which contains all the forms [and which] comes to be in the human agent intellect empowering and guiding its action” (Taylor 2012b, Other Internet Resources). Summarizing this divide between al-Farabi and Avicena in another way, we might note that while al-Farabi upholds a doctrine of abstraction by which the human mind receives content from the outside world, Avicenna instead treats the mind as receiving representations of the intelligibles from the Active Intellect. Taylor—citing Burnyeat 2008—reminds us (Taylor 2012b, Other Internet Resources) that there is actually no doctrine of abstraction in Aristotle; that said, we may nonetheless speak of al-Farabi’s more Aristotelian (because more sensory and world-reliant) approach to knowledge as opposed to Avicenna’s more Platonic/Neoplatonic approach according to which humans receive ideas from “on high” so to speak (in the case of Plato from the realm of forms, in the case of Plotinus from the universal intellect, and in the case of Avicenna from the active intellect). Taylor also emphasizes the representationalist aspect of Avicenna’s view: it is not the active intellect’s intelligibles that enter into the human mind, but rather representations of those intelligibles (Taylor 2012b, Other Internet Resources).
Turning to Averroes’ mature view (as found in his Long Commentary on De Anima), he advances the idea not only of a shared active intellect, but of a shared material intellect, revealing, as Taylor argues, elements of al-Farabi and Themistius in his sense of the active intellect’s role in enabling the human intellect to reliably abstract from the outside world. In this sense, Averroes rejects the Avicennian sense of active intellect emanating ideas into the human mind. (Note: Taylor points to the further vestige of Themistius in Averroes’ argument that shared human discourse necessitates belief in a shared intellect.) Along similar lines, Averroes rejects the Platonic/Neoplatonic description—found in both al-Farabi and Avicenna—of active intellect as a repository of ideas. Averroes instead focuses on active intellect as a “form for us”, in the sense, says Taylor, of “intrinsically operating within us” (Taylor 2005, 29)—though not in the sense of suggesting that there is either an active intellect or a material intellect for each person, and also while maintaining that active and material intellect are themselves completely separate intellects. For Averroes, there is for all humans one shared separate active intellect and one shared separate material intellect, with the activation of abstraction taking place in the shared active intellect and the reception of the abstracted intelligibles taking place in the shared material intellect. In using her soul’s powers correctly the human being is able to benefit from these processes of abstraction and reception, in this way moving from a state of sensation to a state of knowledge. Even with the involvement of shared separate active and material intellects, Averroes describes the process as intrinsic to the individual human soul and as active intellect becoming “form for us” (itself understood as the human’s final end) in a true conjunction or uniting of the individual human soul with the active intellect. (In fact, it is precisely this intimate relation/conjunction/unification that Averroes find lacking in al-Farabi’s (and we might add, Avicenna’s) view of active intellect as simply emanating data into the human soul; see Taylor 2005, 26-31.) As Taylor summarizes this view in Averroes: “We must use our powers of sense, imagination, cogitation and memory to form particular refined intentions, intelligibles in potency, for presentation to the agent intellect [i.e. the active intellect] for abstraction, that is, for transference to the higher level of being intelligibles in act, and for the attendant impression upon the receptive material intellect“ (Taylor 2005, 31). (For further insights on Averroes’ epistemology, see for example: Taylor 1998, 2004, 2005, 2007, 2009, 2011, 2012b (Other Internet Resources); Wolfson 1958; Kogan 1985; Davidson 1992; Kaplan 1977; Twetten 1995).
In approaching Maimonides’ own writings, it is important to keep in mind competing epistemological views at play in his Islamic philosophical context. In this way we can continue to work to determine which of al-Farabi, Avicenna, or Averroes is more influential on his epistemological thinking, and what—if any—broader religious and philosophical implications that might have for how we view his work.
We might here also consider the extent and nature of Maimonides’ view on the limits of human knowledge (a point about which there is much scholarship and much debate); in two classical essays by Altmann and Pines on this topic, the Islamic influences on Maimonides of al-Farabi, ibn Bajja, Avicenna, and Averroes are explored (see Altmann 1987 and Pines 1979).
Relevant to Islamic—and Maimonidean—ideas about the active intellect's role in knowing and prophecy in particular is Aristotle's additional description of this active intellectual principle as analogous to light. Especially for the Neoplatonic Islamic readers of De Anima, this reference to light opens an interpretive floodgate, offering a clear crossover from talk of a separable, immortal active intellect (in De Anima 3.5) to overtly illuminationist and emanationist Neoplatonic doctrines (in the Theology of Aristotle). For, in the Theology of Aristotle (as in Plotinus' original Greek writings, and as in Neoplatonic texts more generally), one finds abundant metaphors of light used to describe the elusive process of emanation through which the world exists. Looking to the Neoplatonic cosmologies of Al-Farabi and Avicenna, we additionally find metaphors of light to describe the unique influence that the active intellect casts over the sublunar world. In the metaphorical idea of a light pouring down from active intellect, there emerges the ontological idea that this intellect emanates forth the very form of the world. There emerges too the epistemological idea of illumination—the idea that human knowledge is actualized not by mere encounter with the world, and not merely by some mechanism internal to the individual's mind, but by the active intellect as a “source of enlightenment” which pours down on it, as it were. Here seen in its epistemological role, the active intellect “illuminates” the human mind, enabling it to become filled with truths (in one or another way; see previous section on differences in this regard between al-Farabi and Avicenna). For Al-Farabi and Avicenna, as for Maimonides, this illuminationist tendency (rooted at least in part, we might say, in the De Anima 3.5 notion of light) goes hand in hand with a complex Aristotelian account of the workings of the individual human mind in the attainment of knowledge. Their commitment to a complex Aristotelian epistemology and psychology, however, is tempered with a doctrine of illumination on which the active intellect plays a key role in the final attainment of knowledge—including prophecy. For Maimonides, as for his Islamic predecessors, active intellect is like a light: it is the overflowing illuminating fount of human intellection and prophecy.
In addition to this language of overflow, Maimonides speaks of the moment of perfected human contact with active intellect in terms of a “conjunction” (ittiṣāl) between the human intellect and active intellect. The notion and language of ittiṣāl in particular can be seen in Maimonides when he speaks, for example, of active intellect as the “divine intellect conjoined (al-muttaṣil) with man” (G 1.1, P 23; for Arabic see Munk 1931, 15). While it might be noted that this language of ittiṣāl can conceptually be linked to a notion of unification at play in Sufi discussions of union-with-God (with its Hebrew correlate, devēqūth, occuring frequently in Jewish Kabbalistic writings), Maimonides' own use of the concept of ittiṣāl (to describe conjunction with the active intellect) is in line with the commonplace technical terminology at play in Arabic textual traditions of [Neoplatonized] Aristotelian epistemology.
It might be additionally noted that Maimonides reflects mystical Islamic Sufi language once again when, in his description of the culminating moment of intellectual perfection, he employs the Arabic language of “‘ishq” (passionate love, love, desire). This terminology is also expressly used by Maimonides’ Islamic philosophical predecessor Avicenna in his own “Risālah fī’l-‘ishq” (“Treatise on Love”) where he explores God’s reality as the pure object of love (a point seen already in Aristotle’s idea of God as the final object of all desire), as well as the pure subject of love. Reflecting on the related Hebrew term ḥōshēq (one who loves passionately) as it relates to his reading of Psalms 91:14, Maimonides explains,
…you know the difference between the terms one who loves (here Maimonides uses the Hebrew word “ōhēv”) and one who loves passionately (here Maimonides uses the Hebrew word “ḥōshēq”); an excess of love, so that no thought remains that is directed toward a thing other than the Beloved, is passionate love (‘ishq) (G 3.51, P 627).
It is certainly not evident that Maimonides literally has a mystical union in mind in this passage, even with his use of what might seem to be charged mystical language. The possibility of a mystical meaning for this and surrounding passages at Guide 3.51 remains subject to debate, although the most straightforward account of what Maimonides is up to here remains entirely non-mystical: purely in line with an Islamic Neoplatonized Aristotelian epistemological tradition of overflow/conjunction, Maimonides understands “passionate love” of God (and related Biblical claims about God's kissing the prophet Moses) as that moment in which the human intellect comes into full alignment with the active intellect, thus reaching the height of human perfection.
The active intellect is a divine intermediary. Not only is it a cosmic overflow whose ultimate source is God Himself, and not only does it stands as governor of sublunar existence and key illuminating source in all human intellection, but active intellect is additionally identified as the divine intermediary for prophecy. As Maimonides notes,
Know that the true reality and quiddity of prophecy consists in its being an overflow overflowing from God, may He be cherished and honored, through the intermediation of the active intellect… (G 2.36, P 369)
And, drawing upon the epistemological ideas found in his Islamic philosophical milieu, he describes this process further in terms of active intellect's causing the human intellect to “pass from potentiality to actuality” (G 2.38, P 377).
At the heart of this epistemology is a notion of human receptivity; in line with our discussion of al-Farabian vs. Avicennian epistemology above, we might describe this receptivity in one of three ways: (1) the soul’s receiving an overflow of intelligibles from active intellect, (2) the soul’s receiving an overflow of representations of intelligibles from active intellect, or (3) the soul’s receiving an overflow from active intellect which enables it to abstract intelligibles from the sensory world). There emerges additionally a notion of human fitness: human happiness is, as al-Farabi says, “given to the possible beings capable of receiving it” (PR, N1 35). For al-Farabi, human beings possess different natural dispositions, leaving some of them unable—by their very nature—to ever rise to the level of human perfection:
…not every man is equipped by natural disposition to receive the first intelligibles, because individual human being are made by nature with unequal powers and different preparations… (PR, N1 35)
Maimonides here too appears to follow al-Farabi's treatment. Speaking of the overflow from active intellect, Maimonides remarks that it is that “through which there is a difference of rank between our intellects ” (G 2.37, P 373), and speaks too of the “natural disposition” of different people's imaginative faculties (G 2.36, P 369), speaking in various ways throughout the Guide of the natural aptitudes of humans and how some people are simply not as disposed towards intellectual apprehension as others: some souls are more fit than others.
It is for the most fit of human souls, then, that we can expect the highest level of conjunction with the active intellect. It is precisely this corollary to the theory of human intellection which lies at the heart of the Islamic philosophical—and with it, the Maimonidean—understanding of prophecy. Prophecy is a natural phenomenon, stemming precisely from the cosmological structure of reality and the epistemological/psychological structure of human minds. The prophet is, in this context, the person whose ability to receive the overflow from active intellect is especially superb. And, following on this naturalized tradition of prophecy, there will be different levels of prophecy—as well as different levels of providence—corresponding to different levels of engagement with the overflow from active intellect.
The active intellect in these traditions is a natural cosmic mechanism at play in human knowledge, but also in prophecy (as well as in providence and immortality). It is in this sense that such traditions—including Maimonides—are often described as holding “naturalized” theories of prophecy. Following this naturalizing tendency further, we might note the fluid back and forth between natural and supernatural descriptions of the active intellect and other cosmic processes: In this context, the angels (the divine emissaries, as it were) are identified with the separate intellects, and active intellect in particular emerges as the bearer—or even, messenger—of prophecy to the human intellect. In this spirit, we find in Maimonides and in his Islamic predecessors descriptions of the active intellect in divine terms. For example, returning to the context in which Maimonides explains the Biblical notion (Genesis 1:26-27) of man's being created in the image of God in terms of man's possession of an intellectual faculty, we find the description of the active intellect—whence man's own intellect receives its power—as a “divine intellect”:
…It was because of this something, I mean because of the divine intellect (al-‘aql al-ilāhī) conjoined (al-muttaṣil) with man, that it is said of the latter that he is in the image of God and in His likeness… (G 1.1, P 23; Pines' use of italics indicates Maimonides' use of Hebrew in his text; for Arabic see Munk 1931, 15).
Turning to al-Farabi we readily see the divine descriptions of this natural cosmic principle at play as well:
…of the active intellect it ought to be said that it is the trustworthy spirit and the holy spirit; and it is called by names resembling these two…”
Describing active intellect in this same sacred way in another text, and identifying it further in this regard as the agent of revelation, al-Farabi, in the context of describing the virtuous ruler of the virtuous city in the Book of Religion, speaks of
…the spiritual being governing the king who is the first ruler of the virtuous city, namely the one set down as the trustworthy spirit, and this is the one through which God, may He be exalted, communicates the revelation to the first ruler of the city…(BR, B 111, section 26).
Following on the general association (described above) of the cosmic separate intellects with angels (with the active intellect emerging in particular as the angel Gabriel), here and above, al-Farabi correlates the active intellect to the Trustworthy Spirit of Quran XXVI, 193, identifying the active intellect as the agent of prophetic revelation.
It is in this spirit that we can approach Maimonides' own account of active intellect as a divine overflow responsible for prophecy. Following al-Farabi's idea above, Maimonides speaks of the perfected human being as having his intellect in most full contact with the active intellect, speaking in terms of “the intellect that God made overflow (afāḍa) unto man” (G 1.2, P 24; Munk 1931, 16). And with al-Farabi, Maimonides too identifies this most perfected human intellectual state as the state of prophecy. Speaking of prophecy as active intellect's mediation of divine overflow onto man, Maimonides adds,
…This is the highest degree of man and the ultimate term of perfection that can exist for his species… (G 2.36, P 369)
While the mechanics of active intellect point to a naturalizing tendency in Maimonides' philosophical treatment of prophecy, we must not lose sight of what at least prima facie appears in 2.32 to be a more robust role for God in this story. “The opinions of people concerning prophecy are like their opinion concerning the eternity of the world or its creation in time…” (G 2.32, P 361) After addressing two other views of prophecy (one of which is described as the completely naturalized view held by the philosophers), Maimonides goes on to recount the “opinion of our Law,” which he contrasts from the completely naturalized view as follows:
[This third opinion, viz., “the opinion of our Law”] is identical with the philosophic opinion except in one thing. For we believe that it may happen that one who is fit for prophecy and prepared for it should not become a prophet, namely, on account of the divine will. To my mind this is like all the miracles and takes the same course as they… (G 2.32, P 361)
This view is sometimes described as a “divine veto” view: while with the philosophers Maimonides understands prophecy as a natural human encounter with active intellect, he here adds the idea that God has the power to prevent—or “veto”—this natural phenomenon from leading to prophecy if He were to so desire. It is not at all clear, however, how we ought take this caveat. Together with his view on creation, Maimonides' view on the exact mechanics of prophecy—and the supra-natural role, if any, of God in that mechanics—is open to scholarly debate. It is in part difficult to know for certain what Maimonides has in mind here since, as above in the case of creation, there are arguably different ways—some more naturalized than others—that one might understand Maimonides' notion of “divine Will,” and hence, arguably different ways that one might understand the import of the above claim from 2.32. There are, hence, arguably different ways that one might understand the exact mechanics of Maimonidean prophecy and the role that God plays in that mechanics at 2.32 and in the Guide more broadly.
We might also note that to the extent that one sees in Maimonides a sense that the prophet is able to arrive at truths intuitively and directly without the ordinary processes of reasoning (as one seems to find in Guide 2.38), one might detect the influence of Avicenna (See Pines 1969, ci-ciii). (For more on prophecy in this context, see for example: Taylor 2012c, Other Internet Resources; Kreisel 2001; Walzer 1957; Altmann 1978; Davidson 1979; W.Z. Harvey 1981.)
On the importance of the active intellect not only for a Maimonidean theory of epistemology and psychology, but theology and ethics as well, we might note that for Maimonides, as for his Islamic predecessors and contemporaries, the active intellect, in its intimate relationship with human intellects, lies also the heart of a theory of providence:
…providence watches over everyone endowed with intellect proportionately to the measure of his intellect…The providence of God, may He be exalted, is constantly watching over those who have obtained this overflow…For the thing that necessarily brings about providence and deliverance from the sea of chance consists in that intellectual overflow… (G 3.51, 624-5)
While not here mentioned explicitly, it is indeed the active intellect that, in the context of Maimonides' Neoplatonized Aristotelian context, is the cosmic source of the “intellectual overflow” under discussion in this passage. As such, the active intellect emerges as the cosmic underpinning for Maimonides' mechanics of providence: The more in touch a person's intellect is with the active intellect, the more we may say of her that she is “living providentially.” As Maimonides notes, “providence watches over everyone endowed with intellect proportionately to the measure of his intellect…” (G 3.51, 624). Taken in the context of Maimonides' theory of active intellect as that cosmic intermediary responsible for human intellectual actualization, the above claim suggests that “divine providence” is found in one's ability to conjoin to the active intellect. This, of course, is a decidedly naturalized understanding of providence: far from a hand of God intervening in the lives of men, divine providence here emerges as the properly directed life that one who conjoins with active intellect—and who, as such, attains the heights of knowledge available to the human mind—will be more readily able to live.
Stressing further the theological and ethical import of the active intellect, we find him, at the very end of his treatise, speaking of this overflow in urgent tones:
A call to attention. We have already made it clear to you that that intellect which overflowed from Him, may He be exalted, toward us is the bond between us and Him. You have the choice: if you wish to strengthen and to fortify this bond, you can do so; if, however, you wish gradually to make it weaker and feebler until you cut it, you can also do that. You can only strengthen this bond by employing it in loving Him and in progressing toward this…And it is made weaker and feebler if you busy your thought with what is other than He… (G 3.51, P 621)
Placing Maimonides in his Islamic philosophical context, we can say that Maimonides is here—in his reference to “that intellect which overflowed from Him”—adverting to the doctrine of active intellect as key to human knowledge:
It is fitting that your attention be roused to the nature of that which exists in the divine overflow coming toward us, through which we have intellectual cognition… (G 2.37, P 373)
We might here also note the strong affinity between Maimonides’ and Averroes’ naturalized views of providence. As we saw above (see section 3 on God), for Averroes God is the final cause who moves the separate intellects which in turn move the heavens which in turn gives rise to the natural heat which, by actualizing forms, activates the entire motion and reality of nature. It is precisely this set of ideas that lies at the heart of Averroes’ conception of divine providence (‘ināya Allāh) as the well-ordered functioning of species (and of individuals under their species) as a result of God’s functioning as the final cause in this way. While there are different ways to read Maimonides’ final view on providence, this Averroean view ought be treated as a serious possibility. (See Averroes' CAM 1715, G 200-201; see Taylor 2012a, 9, Other Internet Resources)
In their idea of the active intellect, the Islamic philosophical tradition—and Maimonides in its wake—finds not only the grounding mechanism for human knowledge and prophecy, but for immortality as well. In the context of Aristotle's De Anima 3.5 remarks about an eternal cosmic principle which is the perfected reality of the human intellect set free from its body, various traditions of Islamic philosophy explain immortality in terms of a person's truest nature (viz. his intellect) living on eternally in (or, as) the reality of active intellect. Keeping in mind that there are important differences which arise on questions of individual, or personal, immortality between various Islamic thinkers (Avicenna upholds a sense of individualization after death in contrast to Averroes; see e.g. Pines 1963, cii-ciii; Stroumsa 2009, 181), and leaving debates over Maimonides' own exact position on this question aside (Pines and Stroumsa identify Maimonides’ position as agreeing with Averroes on this matter; see Pines 1963, cii; Stroumsa 2009, 181), we can summarily say that Maimonides follows in the spirit of understanding the afterlife in terms of the human intellect's relationship—individual or otherwise—to the active intellect. In effect, the afterlife is here understood as the human intellect's ultimate return to and joining with the cosmic active intellect, a set of ideas pulled directly from his Islamic philosophical context.
In his sensitivity to the importance of politics, Maimonides follows in the footsteps of other Islamic philosophers, noting, with Aristotle that man is a political animal by nature (see G 3.27, P 511). Maimonides understands that since average people cannot conjoin with (and hence cannot receive truths from) active intellect themselves, they need help—in the form of virtuous guidance—to help them live in accordance with the truth. And it is toward this end that Maimonides understands the importance of the prophet. The prophet must not only be able to receive truths from active intellect, but must be able to guide people to living in accordance with those truths.
It is in this spirit that, following his Islamic predecessors, Maimonides describes the prophet as having both a perfected intellect (for knowing) and a perfected imagination (for guiding, teaching, and leading). For Maimonides, even the paradigmatic prophet Moses—a man whose prophecy is understood by Maimonides as a direct engagement between mind and active intellect without the intermediation of imagination —must be understood as having a perfected imagination. Along these lines, Maimonides, draws a distinction between the philosopher as having a perfected intellect, and the prophet as having perfected intellect plus perfected imagination:
…the case in which the intellectual overflow overflows only toward the rational faculty and does not overflow at all toward the imaginative faculty…is the characteristic of the class of men of science engaged in speculation. If, on the other hand, this overflow reaches both faculties—I mean both the rational and the imaginative—…and if the imaginative faculty is in a state of ultimate perfection owing to its natural disposition, this is characteristic of the class of prophets… (G 2.37, P 374)
What is important about this distinction for Maimonides emerges from the following description of two different kinds of perfect individuals, the second kind being perfect not only in his own right, but being further able to help others perfect themselves:
For sometimes something comes from it [viz. active intellect] to a certain individual, the measure of that something being such that it renders him perfect, but has no other effect. Sometimes, on the other hand, the measure of what comes to the individual overflows from rendering him perfect toward rendering others perfect… (G 2.37, P 373-4).
For Maimonides, both the philosopher and the prophet receive the truth in their intellects through conjunction with the active intellect, but, only the prophet is able to use those truths to help other people (viz. the masses—those who cannot on their own receive truths from active intellect) live in accordance with truth. This further ability on the part of the prophet is precisely tied to his having a strong imaginative faculty. Following upon a decidedly Platonic political sensibility, Maimonides, in line with his Islamic philosophical predecessors and contemporaries, thinks that a leader can't help average people live good lives (i.e. live lives in accordance with truth) by merely spewing intellectual truths at them. Rather, the only way to help average people live good lives is to couch those truths in terms which they can understand and which can, furthermore, actually move them to appropriate action. On this picture, rhetoric and persuasion become key.
The importance of speaking in different ways to different people is a cornerstone not only of Maimonides but of Islamic political philosophy more broadly. In fact, in these contexts, religion is itself understood as the rhetorically persuasive means, par excellence, for directing the average person towards appropriate living. Starting with al-Farabi, we find a distinction drawn between the ideas of philosophy and those of religion: while the former are ideas known through intellect and arrived at via demonstration, the latter are ideas known only through imaginings of likenesses, and arrived at through persuasion (AH 77). Drawing on a Platonic distinction between truths-as-they-are (as known to the intellect) on the one hand, and the mere likenesses (or, pale reflections) of those truths on the other, al-Farabi explains the relationship between philosophy and religion as follows:
…according to the ancients, religion is an imitation of philosophy…In everything of which philosophy gives an account based on intellectual perception or conception, religion gives an account based on imagination. In everything demonstrated by philosophy, religion employs persuasion… (AH 77)
In his Book of Religion, al-Farabi explains along these same lines that most people are not able to grasp truths through an exercise of intellect, but rather, “either due to nature or because they are occupied with other things” these people (the average folks) will “understand generally accepted or persuasive things” (BR, B 98; BR, M § 48). In this context, rhetoric becomes an important tool, helping the virtuous leader in his attempts to found a virtuous city by ably engaging average people's imaginations (and affecting them in a way that philosophical argument could never affect them), and in this way guiding them along towards right action and the happiness that comes from human flourishing. (It is a matter for debate whether the average person even has a chance at a further kind of happiness, viz. the kind of true philosophical happiness that comes from intellectual apprehension.) . In The Attainment of Happiness, al-Farabi speaks in this regard of the legislator's representing truths to “the multitude” (the average people whom he also calls “the vulgar” in contrast to “the elite”—a distinction employed by Maimonides as well), providing guidance to them through images and persuasive speech acts, all of which “take hold of their souls and dominate them so that they are unable to resolve to do anything else” (AH 79). He describes this same sort of visceral overtaking in his commentary on Plato's Laws where, speaking to the importance of a leader's capturing the hearts of the people and leading them towards virtue, al-Farabi takes note of Plato's own philosophical focus on dancing and flute-playing. As al-Farabi sees it, the art of singing is “truly very useful, especially because its working penetrates the soul; and since the law concerns itself with the soul, he [i.e. Plato] spoke at length about this subject” (PL 94).
There too, al-Farabi illumines the rhetorical task of the virtuous ruler with an insightful lesson to be drawn from Plato's analogy of the “gentle physician”:
The Lawgiver ought to address every group of men with what is closer to their comprehension and intellects, and to set them aright with what they are capable of doing. For sometimes it is difficult for men to comprehend a thing, or they are incapable of doing it; its difficulty causes them to reject it and prompts them to neglect and discard it. [Plato] gave as an example of this the skilled and gentle physician who offers the sick man the drugs that are useful to him in his familiar and appetizing food (PL 92).
In spite of differences from al-Farabi's political teachings, Averroes mirrors his predecessor, stressing the importance of rhetoric and its impact on the imagination of the average person. In his Decisive Treatise, commenting on the person who is not “adept in demonstration,” Averroes points out the sense in which “it is difficult [for that person] to come to assent to an existing thing that is not linked with something imaginable” (DT, B 20). In his Commentary on Plato's Republic (preserved in a Hebrew translation from the Arabic by Samuel ben Judah in the early 14th century), Averroes notes too that,
No bringer of a nomos is to be found who does not make use of invented stories, for this is something necessary for the multitude to reach their happiness… (CPR 24)
And commenting on why Aristotle took an interest in the art of poetics—here, in much the same spirit as al-Farabi's above comments on why Plato took an interest in music, and flute playing—Averroes notes that,
Aristotle came to the opinion that this art [viz., the art of poetics] was highly useful, because by means of it the soul of the multitude could be moved to believe in or not believe in a certain thing and towards doing or abandoning a certain thing. For that reason, he enumerated the matters which enable a man to devise an imaginative representation for any particular thing he wishes and to do so in the most complete manner possible for that thing… (CAP 84)
In like manner, Averroes describes Aristotle's interest in rhetoric as an interest in “the means by which man is able to effect persuasion about each and every one of the particular matters and to do so in the most complete and most artful manner possible with regard to each thing” (CAR 78). Of course, all of this is of interest to Averroes himself in that, like al-Farabi, he is sensitive to the fact that different people need to be guided in different ways, and that it is the job of religion in particular to help lead “the rhetorical people, who are the overwhelming multitude” (DT, B 26).
Leaving a detailed consideration of differences between al-Farabi and Averroes aside, it is clear that Maimonides' own work falls within the broad trajectory of these Islamic political philosophies, and it is in their spirit that we must work towards understanding his own thoughts on the relation between philosophy and religion. Maimonides' own ideas about the prophet—as lawgiver—are certainly developed against the backdrop of Farabian political theory. For Maimonides the prophet/lawgiver is not only, as philosopher, possessed of a perfected intellect, but he is also a gifted rhetorician, and (as such) teacher, leader, and religious guide; he is able to take the philosophical truths he knows so well, and, by imaginatively devising an effective system of concepts, images, rituals, and stories, actually enable these truths to work in the lives of ordinary people. As we have seen in al-Farabi's account of religion above, these persuasive words are impressed upon the imagination of listeners, as they are themselves crafted in the imagination of the lawgiver. In this context, the imaginatively devised system of concepts, images, rituals, and stories is religion, and the prophet, as Lawgiver, is the giver of religion: he (the one with direct access to the truths found in active intellect) gives people a context in which they can actually live in accordance with truth, even while they themselves do not have access to truth directly (epistemologically failing, as they do, to conjoin their intellects to the active intellect; see discussion of active intellect in section 6).
In like manner, we might point to Maimonides’ own appreciation for the power of music—a point mentioned in connection with al-Farabi above, and found too in the writings of al-Ghazali. Contrary to some who describe Maimonides as being opposed to music (see e.g. Idelsohn 1929, 126; Stroumsa, 52, n. 1), others emphasize Maimonides’ appreciating the importance of music for the soul, something that Bland calls the “utilitarian hedonism” of music according to which it can bring a soul to a better-ordered state—either a contemplation-ready state that can lead to philosophy, or simply an emotionally rested state that can lead to increased human wellness. (See Bland 1993, 2000; see too Farmer 1933)
In considering Maimonides on politics and prophecy, one might also consider Leo Strauss’ emphasis on the significance of the divide between revelation and reason in Maimonides, and his connection of Maimonides along these lines to an ancient tradition that he sees as exemplified in Plato’s Laws and as continued in Islamic philosophical tradition in such thinkers as al-Farabi, Avicenna, and Averroes. There is scholarly debate about how to read Strauss, how to understand Strauss’ final sense of revelation’s status vis-à-vis reason, and, as such, how to understand Strauss’ final understanding of Maimonides’ own brand of rationalism (all of which is made more difficult by debates over whether—and if so, where and to what extent and to what end—Strauss himself utilizes the esoteric writing strategies that he attributes to Maimonides and to his Islamic predecessors). The details and debates aside, we might simply note that Strauss strongly places Maimonides into a Platonist-into-Islamic tradition of political philosophy with implications for the way Maimonides understands prophecy, religion, law, and the relationship between revelation and reason.
It is precisely in the context of the above insights that the idea of interpreting texts in terms of an external and internal layer—including, as we will see, allegorical interpretation of the Bible—becomes so important for Maimonides. For Maimonides, allegory — which couches difficult truths in colorful, vibrant images—and other forms of obscure writing emerge as especially effective tools for leading average people to live in accordance with the truths they cannot understand on their own (in this way allowing them the opportunity to live a good life) while shielding them from scientific and philosophical truths which would be so hard for them to understand as to (a) be unable to effect any positive outcomes in their lives, and/or (b) confuse them to the point of apostasy (an outcome which, for Maimonides, precisely blocks the opportunity to live a good life). In this context, Maimonides sees the Bible itself as filled with allegorical renderings — renderings masterfully crafted by Moses, the prophet par excellence. Here, the Bible is a literary masterpiece penned by Moses under the inspiration of the active intellect, but through his own imaginative lens: the Bible is in this sense the truth couched in imaginative and rhetorically persuasive images (such as anthropomorphic descriptions of God as sitting, standing, etc.). Again (see 7.1), it is precisely the Bible's construction (by Moses the prophet) through imaginative and rhetorically effective images and stories that enables it to operate upon the hearts (or, more technically, the imaginations) of average people, enabling them to live lives in accordance with the truths that they themselves cannot grasp. For his Islamic predecessors it is, of course, Muhammad who plays this operative role as the virtuous lawgiving prophet able to lead a community to virtue through the creative imagery and persuasions of religion through the imaginative and rhetorically persuasive imageries of the Quran.
As we will discuss more below, in such a context, allegorical interpretation emerges as the key method of properly interpreting the Bible (or, in the Islamic case, the Quran). For, if the prophet pens the Scripture in a way designed to couch the philosophical truth in imaginative images (e.g., anthropomorphic depictions of God), then the true interpretation of that Scripture must aim at uncovering the philosophical truth behind the surface images.
Maimonides' own sensitivity to the effectiveness and necessity of couching ideas in imaginative images — and, as such, the efficacy of giving voice to truth always indirectly — can help us understand (and, can afford philosophical significance to) what seems to be Maimonides' own indirect (and sometimes, as we have seen in the case of creation, downright confusing) manner of expressing himself in the Guide. Relatedly, Maimonides' sensitivity to the effectiveness of indirectly expressing truths can help us see philosophical significance in his own use of metaphors and parables, as well as his allegorical interpretations of the Bible throughout the Guide. In fact, Maimonides himself expresses the importance of allegory through his own allegorical rendering of the Proverbs 25:11 idea that “A word fitly spoken is like golden apples in silver filigree casings” (“tapūḥēy zahav bi-maskīyyōt kesef, davar davūr al afnav”) (G Intro, P 11). Here, following in the spirit of al-Farabi's Platonic “gentle physician” (see above) who “offers the sick man the drugs that are useful to him in his familiar and appetizing food ” (PL 92), Maimonides is sensitive to the importance of hiding truth (gold) in more familiar (silver) garb—garb which, also following al-Farabi above—must be attractive and fanciful (silver filigree) so as to impress itself upon the imagination of the average person. The truths which Maimonides seeks to reveal with this image are manifold: sometimes, in order to do service to the golden truth, one must craft delicate silver casings (viz., allegories, parables, stories, metaphors, and other effective uses of language); these ‘casings’ are filigreed—incredibly difficult to make, as well as extremely beautiful and tempting to look at; these casings cover the golden core reality (which is to say, allegories hide the truth in itself), and yet, they allow onlookers to catch a glimpse—through the filigree's apertures—of the very golden core which they cover; and, finally, in at once hiding and revealing the true center, these filigree casings of silver are not themselves gold: where gold stands for truth, we may say that these filigree casings of silver are not themselves truth. Where the casings are the allegories, parables, and other methods employed by the Lawgiver (in the Bible and in other forms of religious guidance), the implication is that that many of the ideas of the Bible and of religion more generally (as, for example, anthropomorphic descriptions of God as sitting, standing, talking, willing, etc.) are not actually true. They are, rather, delicate craftings (even: works of art) designed to captivate the interests of average people and, in this way, lead them to living in accordance with the truth.
As these lessons apply to the Biblical imagery used to describe God, we meet back up with our earlier ideas of apophasis (negative theology) in Maimonides: Maimonides, with Islamic philosophers before him, denies that God has attributes, and, as such, reads those passages of the Bible which describe God in human terms as allegorical in nature. In this regard, Maimonides seizes upon the rabbinic dictum that the Torah speaks in the language of humans. Beholden to the idea of using “words fitly spoken,” Maimonides sees the Bible as filled with allegorical constructions, constructions which admit of both an external and an internal sense: the external sense of the text are the “words fitly spoken” (the “silver filigree casings” aimed at the masses), while the internal sense—the golden apple—is the philosophical truth reserved for the elite.
Following on this general sensitivity to various layers of textual meaning, Maimonides shares his penchant for allegorical reading together with many Islamic philosophical exegetes, including Al-Farabi, Avicenna, and Averroes, and in this way is part of a larger tradition of textual interpretation (ta‘wīl) in which Scriptures are seen as having “outer” (ẓâhir) as well as “inner” (bāṭin) senses.
On the importance of keeping philosophical interpretations (i.e. true insights alluded to by the text) away from average people, consider Averroes. Reflecting in particular on texts dealing with the afterlife, he notes:
For anyone not adept in science, it is obligatory to take them [the descriptions of the next life] in their apparent [ẓāhir] sense; for him it is unbelief to interpret them because it leads to unbelief. That is why we are of the opinion that, for anyone among the people whose duty it is to have faith in the apparent [ẓāhir] sense, interpretation is unbelief because it leads to unbelief. Anyone adept in interpretation who divulges that to him calls him to unbelief; and the one who calls to unbelief is an unbeliever [kāfir]. [DT 34, B 21]
While Averroes himself sees the surface meaning as separate from truth-yielding philosophical interpretations of the scriptural text, he criticizes allegorical interpretation as an allowable mode of scriptural interpretation for the average person as it will lead them to confusion and possible apostasy.
We might here note Kraemer’s reminder too about the broader context of obscure writing in this milieu:
Alexandrian introductions to Aristotle, which were known in the Islamic environment, elucidated that the aim of Aristotle’s obscurity was to exclude the unworthy, like curtains in temples (Kraemer 2010, 50).
Turning to an example of allegorical rendering of Scriptures in Maimonides' Islamic philosophical context, consider al-Farabi's identification of the Trustworthy Spirit of Quran XXVI, 193 with the active intellect. And, stressing the allegorical nature of the Quran, Avicenna describes the prophet's proper mode of communication, stating that “a condition the prophet must adhere to is that his words should be symbols and his expression hints” (PP 116). Along similar lines, speaking in general to a hermeneutics of scriptural interpretation, Averroes points out that since the Quran does not conflict with reason, any apparently unreasonable (or, philosophically untenable) Quranic verses must be read allegorically so as to be brought into accordance with reason. In this spirit of allegorical hermeneutics, Maimonides includes “lexicographical chapters” throughout his Guide in which he explains the various equivocal meanings of Biblical terms; this strategy can be seen in many Islamic contexts, as, for example in Avicenna's fī ithbāt al-nubuwwāt, where “light” is defined as an equivocal term partaking of an essential as well as a metaphorical meaning (PP 116).
In addition to sharing the sensibility that Scripture admits of equivocal terms and “inner meanings”, Maimonides and his Islamic predecessors and contemporaries often draw their attention to very similar sorts of scriptural claims, most notably, those scriptural claims (in the Bible for Maimonides, and in the Quran for the Muslim thinkers) which suggest divine corporeality on their surface. One example can be found in a comparison of Maimonides' and Averroes' respective allegorical analyses of the idea—found in various guises in both the Bible and the Quran—that God rests in a place. For both thinkers, it is simply false to say of God that He is found in space in some place. And so, Maimonides renders this idea of God-in-place allegorical in his treatment of a number of Biblical terms, including the terms “place” (maqōm) (Guide 1.8), “throne” (G 1.9), “indwelling” (G 1.10; G 1.25), and “to sit” (G 1.11). In like manner, we find Averroes' commenting too on texts suggesting that God has a place (or, relatedly, that He has a body)—including the Quranic description of “God's directing Himself [2:29] and the Tradition about His descent”—as texts which have a surface meaning which “is obligatory for those adept in demonstration” to interpret allegorically (DT, B 19).
It might be noted that while Maimonides seems to see Biblical allegory as speaking (like any well-crafted allegory or parable) in ways most fit for helping its average readers, there is an odd way in which he also seems to fault the Bible's frequent allegories (e.g., its talk of God in corporeal terms) for providing folks with ideas about God which are false, and which stand, it would seem, as obstacles to their attainment of knowledge. Observing that “man has in his nature a love of, and an inclination for, that to which he is habituated” (G 1.31, P 67), and that “man has love for, and the wish to defend, opinions to which he is habituated and in which he has been brought up and has a feeling of repulsion for opinions other than those,” Maimonides notes:
For this reason also man is blind to the apprehension of the true realities and inclines toward the things to which he is habituated. This happened to the multitude with regard to the belief in His corporeality and many other metaphysical subjects as we shall make clear. All this is due to people being habituated to, and brought up on, texts that it is an established usage to think highly of and to regard as true and whose external meaning is indicative of the corporeality of God and of other imaginings with no truth in them, for these have been set forth as parables and riddles… (G 1.31, P 67)
Along these very same lines, Maimonides wonders why some religious practitioners believe God to have attributes, to be corporeal and to be essentially change-able in any way. To this he answers,
For he who believes in this doctrine was not led to it by intellectual speculation; he merely followed the external sense (zawāhir literally “external senses”) of the texts of the Scriptures (G 1.53, P 119; Munk 1931, 81).
It seems fair to say, in light of such passages in the Guide as the two above, that the allegorical artistry of the Bible, in its intended effect—of leading average people to be able to live in accordance with the truth—comes with some unpleasant side effects, viz. it might indeed leave some people with patently false ideas about God and reality. In a system where having knowledge of the truth is paramount—and is even the precondition for providence (as we have seen above)—the fact that the Bible's “surface” (or: “external”) sense leads some to embrace false beliefs is a pretty serious problem, suggesting, it would seem, that the average person who needs to be led by the external sense of Biblical parables will never be able to attain the true human perfection. Here, it seems that the persuasive rhetoric of Scripture's external sense fills the imagination with images vibrant enough to lead even the average person to live in accordance with truth, but will, as such, stand always as a veil preventing that person from ever attaining the truth per se.
Having explored the Islamic background, we might additionally note that Maimonides himself associates the tradition of allegorical interpretation of Biblical texts with Rabbinic writing strategies; as such, we may say that Maimonides sees a kinship between philosophical allegorization and a Biblical and Rabbinic Jewish hermeneutic at the heart of Judaism.
It is important to note in all of this that Maimonides emphasizes the importance of sharing with even average people the truth of God’s absolute unity and (relatedly) the truth of God’s incorporeality. This means, of course, that in spite of his emphasis on the need to shield the golden apple of truth from the masses much of the time, Maimonides advocates overtly teaching every person that the anthropomorphic images in the Bible are literally false. In other words, in spite of Maimonides’ emphasis on (a) the importance of addressing the average person by way of imagination (not intellect), (b) the role of the Bible’s external layer (the “silver filgree”) as precisely aimed at the imagination, and (c) the repeated appearance in the Bible’s external layer of imaginative anthropomorphic images, Maimonides nonetheless thinks it is important to tell people that God has no body.
We might highlight a difference in this regard with Averroes for whom it is never a good idea to share any such truths with the masses (see Pines 1969, cxviii-cxix; Stroumsa 2009, 74-76). This can be seen as signaling a larger philosophical-hermeneutical divide between the two thinkers: Whereas both understand the difference between religion and philosophy, and while both understand the role of religious scriptures (and religion) as aiming—through its external meanings—to address the imaginative needs of the average person, Maimonides has a broader understanding of the external layer of the text: For Maimonides, but not for Averroes, when it comes to the topic of divine embodiment, even the external layer of text, when carefully read, offers a non-anthropomorphic set of meanings. In line with his strong sense that even the average religious person must be taught that God is incorporeal, Maimonides sees the Bible’s external claims about divine corporeality as themselves beckoning—even within the external layer of the text—to non-corporeal meanings, even for the average person. Averroes does not share this sense and, as Pines puts it, instead feels that “the simple faith of the average nonphilosophical person should not be troubled; and he should be left free to stick to his own unsophisticated beliefs even in such matters as the corporeality of God” (Pines 1969, cxix).
Stroumsa sees Maimonides as actively responding to Averroes on this very point at Guide 2.25 where he emphasizes that the “intention of the text” is to offer, even at the external level, a non-corporeal interpretation of anthropomorphic claims about God; Stroumsa sees this as a response on Maimonides part to Averroes’ own talk of the “intention of the Lawgiver” which, on the contrary, ensures that the external meaning of the scriptural text is simply an imaginative teaching about divine corporeality aimed to accommodate the average person’s need for images. Reflecting on some of the hermeneutical tensions (or subtleties) in Maimonides’ work, Stroumsa identifies the influence of al-Ghazali’s Fayṣal where Maimonides tries to save midrashic ideas by describing them as allegories, and the influence of Averroes where Maimonides emphasizes the importance of the reader’s staying within the limits of her ability to understand truths.
Moving from Maimonides' allegorical rendering of the Bible, we might note too his use of a dynamic of external and internal senses in the very construction of his own treatise, a dynamism which can be seen earlier in an even more emphatic form in Avicenna's own elaborate “visionary recitals ” (see Corbin 1960). Seen in Maimonides own construction of parables (see Guide 3.51 for the parable of the palace), in his use of metaphors, in his allegorical renderings of Biblical verses, but also more broadly in the overall construction of the Guide (in his leaving lots of ambiguities and in his giving voice to outright contradictions), the creative spirit of “inner vs. outer” reading and writing strategies is part of what makes it so difficult to interpret Maimonides on such important topics as creation, providence, and immortality. In fact, Maimonides prefaces his Guide with a list of seven reasons for “contradictory or contrary statements” (G Intro, P 17) in books, together with the overt declaration that the Guide itself will contain “divergencies” which may be explained in light of the list. Reflecting on the writing dynamics at play in his own text, Maimonides explains:
Divergences that are to be found in this Treatise are due to the fifth cause and the seventh. Know this, grasp its true meaning, and remember it very well so as not to become perplexed by some of its chapters. (G Intro, P 17)
The fifth cause of contradictory writing is related by Maimonides to “the necessity of teaching and making someone understand” (G Intro, P 17-18), whereas the seventh is related to the necessity of “conceal[ing] some parts” and “disclos[ing] others” when it comes to treating “very obscure matters ” (G Intro, P 17). And while he does not cite the third cause as one of his own strategies of writing, he does cite it as a principle at play in the prophetic Scriptures; returning us again to the idea of “external” vs. “internal” senses, this is the case in which,
[n]ot all the statements in question are to be taken in their external sense; some are to be taken in their external sense, while some others are parables and hence have an inner content… (G Intro, P 17)
Starting off his treatise as he does with attention to the dynamics of internal and external meanings (seen too in his reflections on the golden apples and silver casings of Proverbs 25:11), Maimonides clearly illustrates his sensitivity to the importance and pedagogical effectiveness of various writing and speaking strategies in which meanings are hidden, surface senses meet inner senses, and expression-via-contradiction is an art form.
Evidence of shared ideas between Maimonides and Islamic philosophers on these themes abounds. As is clear from even the representative quotes from Islamic sources cited throughout, these interrelated features of imagination, allegory, politics, and religion in Maimonides' thought are hallmarks of the political philosophical writings of al-Farabi, Avicenna, and Averroes as well. Here, as throughout our investigation, understanding the Islamic philosophical context of the Guide is key for understanding the intricacies of Maimonides' thought.
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2. Averroes (Ibn Rushd)
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- Tahāfut al-Tahāfut (The Incoherence of the Incoherence); see: Van Den Bergh, Simon (tr.), Averroes' Tahafut Al-Tahafut (The Incoherence of the Philosophers). London, 1969.
- [DT] The Decisive Treatise (Faṣl al-maqāl
wa-taqrīr mā bayna al-sharī‘a
wa’l-ḥikma min al-ittiṣāl).
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3. Avicenna (Ibn Sina)
- [RFI] “Risālah
fī’l-‘ishq” (“Treatise on
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- [BR] The Book of Religion (Kitāb al-Milla wa
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- [PS] Perfect State (Mabādi’
Arā’ Ahl al-Madīna al-Faḍila).
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- [HTO] The Harmonization of the Two Opinions of the Two Sages,
Plato the Divine and Aristotle (Kitāb al-Jam‘ bayn
Ra’yay al-Ḥakīmayn Aflāṭūn
al-Ilāhī wa Arisṭūṭālīs).
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- [PR] The Political Regime (or The Treatise on the
Principles of Being) (al-Siyāsah al-Madanīyah).
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- Iḥṣā’ al-‘Ulūm (The
Enumeration of the Sciences).
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- Amin, Uthman (ed.) Iḥṣā’ al-‘Ulūm li-al-Fārābī. Cairo, 1949.
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5. Kalām fī maḥḍ al-khair (aka Liber de Causis)
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- For English translation, see Guagliardo, Hess, and Taylor, 1996.
6. Moses Maimonides
- [G] The Guide of the Perplexed.
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- Munk, S. (ed., with variant readings by Joel, Issachar). Dalālat al-hā‘irīn. Jerusalem: J. Junovitch, 1931.
- For other primary texts, see Marx 1935.
- The Enneads. Armstrong, A. H. (tr.) Plotinus, The Enneads. The Loeb Classical Library. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1966.
8. Theology of Aristotle
- [TAB] Badawi, A. (ed.) 1955. Plotinus Apud Arabes, Theologia Aristotelis et fragmenta quae supersunt. Cairo: Maktabat al-nahda al-Misriya.
- [TAL] Lewis, G.L. (trans.) 1959. Plotiniana Arabica. In Plotini Opera, vol. 2, P. Henry & H.-R. Schwyzer (eds). Bruxelles: Edition universelle.
- Adler, Eve. 1995. Introduction to Philosophy and Law: Contributions to the Understanding of Maimonides and His Predecessors, by Leo Strauss, tr. Eve Adler. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
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