Notes to Markets

1. The influence of Protestantism on the rise of capitalist markets – Max Weber's classical thesis (2002) [1905] – is still under debate, as are the general reasons for why market economies first became predominant in Western Europe and North America. Becker and Woessmann (2009) have recently argued that the influence of Protestantism was indirect, namely through the propagation of literacy, which supported economic development.

2. A related argument that has sometimes been raised is that free markets and the habits they bring are conducive to certain forms of government that respect the rights and liberties of the citizens (in Adam Smith's famous words: “… commerce and manufactures gradually introduced order and good government, and with them, the liberty and security of individuals, among the inhabitants of the country… This […] is by far the most important of all their effects” (WN III.IV.4). There is, however, a chicken-and-egg question about the relation between “good government” and economic development, as a certain degree of security with regard to property rights is usually regarded as a precondition of markets (see below).

3. In the background of this discussion is the question of how to evaluate social outcomes at all, because the way in which rights and liberties are understood in the Western tradition is sometimes accused of itself being biased towards free markets, and hence towards those who are fully able to enjoy the advantages of free markets. The development of the idea of welfare rights (cf. in particular Marshall 1992) can be understood as a response to this deficit. Another approach is the so-called “capability approach” that uses a number of basic capabilities (see e.g. Sen 1993; for an overview see Robeyns 2011), rather than formal rights, as standard for evaluating institutions, including markets.

4. Some critics of markets have also charged markets with changing not only the relations between individuals within societies, but also between nations – capitalist markets have been accused of leading to increased military aggression (e.g. Luxemburg 2003 [1913]). Defenders of market, in contrast, have argued that trade can reduce international tension, because it creates bonds of mutual dependence between countries (on the 18th century debate see Hont 2005).

5. This is a problem, for example, for theories that assume full and equally distributed information about all goods and services, a condition that is impossible to fulfil in real-life settings.

6. Property rights and the equal possibility of enforcing them are also among the key factors that theorists have pointed to in the hotly debated question about why the economic development in some parts of the world is so different from others (cf., e.g., Smith WN III; similar arguments about the crucial role of centralized power and inclusive institutions have recently been brought forward by Acemoglou and Robinson 2012). Within the anarchist tradition there are strands that hold the contrary position, i.e. that markets do not rely on other institutions for securing property rights, but could provide services such as law-enforcement themselves; see for example the anarcho-capitalist positions defended by Murray Rothbard (1970) or David Friedman (1973).

Copyright © 2013 by
Lisa Herzog <herzog@em.uni-frankfurt.de>

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