Notes to Indispensability Arguments in the Philosophy of Mathematics

1. In general, an indispensability argument is an argument that purports to establish the truth of some claim based on the indispensability of the claim in question for certain purposes (to be specified by the particular argument). For example, if explanation is specified as the purpose, then we have an explanatory indispensability argument. Thus we see that inference to the best explanation is a special case of an indispensability argument. See the introduction of Field (1989, pp. 14-20) for a nice discussion of indispensability arguments and inference to the best explanation. See also Maddy (1992) and Resnik (1995a) for variations on the Quine-Putnam version of the argument. I should add that although the version of the argument presented here is generally attributed to Quine and Putnam, it differs in a number of ways from the arguments advanced by either Quine or Putnam. Indeed, see Putnam (2012) for an explicit rejection of key elements of the argument as presented here. Still, the argument presented here is influential in the contemporary literature. (Think of the attribution to Quine and Putnam as an acknowledgement of intellectual debts rather than an indication that the argument, as presented, would be endorsed in every detail by either Quine or Putnam.)

2. Most scientific realists accept inference to the best explanation. Indeed, it might be said that inference to the best explanation is the cornerstone of scientific realism. But, as we saw in note 1, inference to the best explanation may be seen as a kind of indispensability argument, so any realist who accepts the former while rejecting the latter is in a somewhat delicate position.

3. This theorem states that relative to a partition of the vocabulary of an axiomatizable theory T into two classes, t and o (theoretical and observational, say) there exists an axiomatizable theory T* in the language whose only non-logical vocabulary is o, of all and only the consequences of T that are expressible in o alone. If the vocabulary of the theory can be partitioned in the way that Craig's theorem requires, then the theory can be reaxiomatized so that apparent reference to any given theoretical entity is eliminated. See Field (1980, p. 8) for further details.

4. It turns out that the details of the formulation of naturalism are crucial to the argument. See Maddy (1998) for a slightly different formulation that doesn't support the conclusion of the Quine-Putnam argument.

5. The issue of how likely modern theories such as general relativity and quantum mechanics are to yield to nominalisation is a very interesting and controversial matter. David Malament (1982) argues that quantum mechanics, for one, is likely to resist nominalisation because of the central role infinite-dimensional Hilbert spaces play in the theory. Mark Balaguer (1996a; 1998), however, suggests a way of nominalising the Hilbert spaces in question and Otávio Bueno (2003) criticizes Balaguer's suggestion.

6. For example, the continuum hypothesis is the assertion that the cardinality of the real numbers is the first non-denumerable cardinal. It turns out that neither this hypothesis nor its negation is provable from the ZFC axioms; the question of the size of the continuum is independent of ZFC.

7. It is tempting to formulate Maddy's third objection as follows:

Naturalism endorses actual mathematical practice. This practice typically does not rely on extra-mathematical canons of justification. So it seems that naturalism endorses belief in some mathematical theories with or without finding physical applications for them. Presumably this belief carries with it certain ontological commitments. So it seems that we ought to have ontological commitment to at least some entities that are not indispensable to our best (empirical) theories. Thus it might be argued that a thoroughgoing naturalist is not committed to only the entities of our best scientific theories and thus is not committed to P1.

This, however, I think is to misrepresent Maddy's argument. For starters, the indispensability argument can be made to work with P1 reading: ‘We ought to have ontological commitment to all the entities that are indispensable to our best scientific theories’. That is, the ‘only’ part argued against in the above formulation of Maddy's objection is unnecessary. More importantly, I think that Maddy's objection is subtler than this formulation. The objection is directed at the motivation for P1 - not at P1 itself. Her aim is to show that confirmational holism ought to be rejected. This would rob P1 of much of its plausibility, as we shall see in the discussion following that dealing with Sober's objection.

8. For example, ‘There is a city larger than Hobart’ and ‘There is a natural number larger than 100’ are true just in case there exist objects in the respective domains of quantification with the properties of being larger than Hobart and being larger than the natural number 100 respectively. Such a strategy is not open to anyone who holds that (i) both these sentences are true, (ii) numbers do not exist and (iii) cities do exist. Most nominalists thus find themselves unable to employ such a semantics. Field is a notable exception here (Field, 1980; 1989); he denies that sentences such as ‘There is a natural number larger than 100’ are true. He claims that they are true-in-the-story-of-mathematics but that this is not true simpliciter. He thus avoids the difficult problem of providing a nominalisticlly acceptable account of the truth of such sentences. (He does, however, have a residual worry. According to Field, sentences such as ‘In Peano number theory there is a number larger than 100’ are true simpliciter, but it's not clear that he has a fully-developed semantics for these.)

Copyright © 2014 by
Mark Colyvan <mark.colyvan@sydney.edu.au>

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