Notes to Mencius

1. For a translation of the stories, see Wang (2003), pp. 150–155.

2. Wong (1989) is a classic discussion.

3. See Graham (1967) for a detailed discussion.

4. See Ivanhoe (2002), pp. 73–79 for a discussion of Mencius's arguments for the sprouts.

5. A classic discussion of the debate between Mencius and Gaozi is David S. Nivison, “Philosophical Voluntarism in Fourth–Century China,” reprinted in Nivison (1996), pp. 121–132.

6. Ivanhoe and Van Norden (2005), p. 228, but with the word “mind” changed to “heart.”

7. Translation of Mencius 2A2 from Ivanhoe and Van Norden (2005), p. 126. The relationship between the Zhuangzi and Mencius passages was first noted in Nivison, “Philosophical Voluntarism in Fourth–Century China,” op. cit.

8. For a partial translation of the Four Books, see Gardner (2007). For selections from Han Yu, Zhu Xi, and other Neo–Confucian philosophers, see Tiwald and Van Norden (2014).

9. For a detailed discussion of this point, see Ivanhoe (2002). The situation is arguably similar to the development of Christian theology in the West, in which (for example) Augustine's understanding of the Bible was deeply influenced by the Platonism of his own intellectual milieu.

10. The situation is complex, though. For a Marxist appropriation of Confucian (including Mencian) ideas, see Liu (1939). For a general discussion, see Nivison (1956).

11. For a good summary, see N. Serina Chan, “What Is Confucian and New about the Thought of Mou Zongsan?” in Makeham (2003), pp. 131–164. For the difficulties in defining “New Confucianism,” see Makeham, “The Retrospective Creation of New Confucianism,” ibid., pp. 25–53.

12. Chan (1999) is a seminal article in this debate.

13. For discussion of these issues, see the essays in Liu and Ivanhoe (2002) and the references therein. See also the excellent discussion in Wong (2013), subsection 2.5 on “Mencius's Defense of Love with Distinctions.”

14. For other works that advocate a virtue ethics interpretation of Confucianism, see Sim (2007), Van Norden (2007), and Yu (2007).

Copyright © 2014 by
Bryan Van Norden <>
Kwong Loi Shun

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