Supplement to Mental Imagery

European Responses: Jaensch, Freud, and Gestalt Psychology

In Germany, some psychologists responded to the crisis engendered by the imageless thought controversy by turning away from the experimental study of “cognitive” questions about the workings of the mind in general, and moved instead toward an understanding of their subject as concerned with interpretive studies of persons, or the differences between them. They, generally, became more interested in their subjects' dispositions, values, motives, etc. than in either their imagery (unless, perhaps, its contents were interestingly idiosyncratic) or their bewusstseinslagen (if any such existed) (Danziger, 1980).

An exception is the work of Jaensch (1930) on eidetic imagery (see Supplement: Other Quasi-Perceptual Phenomena). Unfortunately, although Jaensch's work has not been without influence, and aspects of it may be of continuing scientific value, it is tainted by his enthusiasm for the Nazi racist ideology that was then taking hold in Germany. Eidetic imagery, he claims (on very meager evidence), is characteristic of the less developed minds of not only children, but also members of “southern,” “sun adapted” (i.e. darker skinned) races. (Jaensch later won notoriety for performing an experiment designed to show that “northern” chickens are racially superior – as evidenced by more careful and intelligent pecking – to “southern” ones (Ash, 1998).) Stripped of its openly racist elements, his theory lives on in, for instance, Kubler’s (1985) suggestion that, because of their “primitive” condition, adult paleolithic people (unlike modern adult humans) retained the childlike ability to have eidetic images, and that this accounts for the verisimilitude of their cave paintings. Likewise, Miller (1931) (overtly influenced by Jaensch, but without sign of racism) regarded eidetic imagery (not, I think, clearly distinguished from mental imagery in general in this era) as a “primitive” form of thought, normal in young children, but likely to associated with psychosis and psychotic hallucination if it appears more than very rarely in adult experience.

Indeed, the belief that imagery (as opposed to verbal thought) is more characteristic of minds that are somehow defective or undeveloped was not confined to, and did not originate with, the Nazis and their sympathizers; it seems to have been widespread in the early 20th century. In 1912, a distinguished British psychiatrist apparently thought it quite uncontroversial that there is a "predominance of verbal thought in civilised man, and of concrete imagery in more primitive races" (Mapother, 1912 p. 73). Likewise, the most famous psychiatrist of the age, Sigmund Freud (certainly no Nazi), seems implicitly to have regarded the visual images reported by his patients as part and parcel of their neuroses, as something to be exorcized and replaced, as far as possible, by verbally mediated, “rational” insights (Esrock, 1994 ch. 3; Martin, 2007 p. 204). Furthermore, according to Jay (1993), in France (and, by implication, to a large extent in continental western Europe in general) 20th century intellectual life, across the political spectrum, was permeated by a “denigration of the visual”: visually based thought and experience was actively disvalued in comparison to other modes of sense experience and to verbally mediated thinking (cf. Levin, 1993; Fox Keller & Grontkowski, 1983). Such European attitudes were mirrored in the Anglophone world, especially the United States, by the so called “Behaviorist iconophobia” that gripped American psychological science for most of the first half of the century, leading many psychologists to either deny the existence of mental imagery altogether, or to almost entirely ignore it (see supplement: The American Response: Behaviorist Iconophobia and Motor Theories of Imagery). The discipline of philosophy was also largely in the grip of such attitudes for much of the 20th century (see §3.3 of the main entry).

Arguably, signs of a similar attitude are evident some decades earlier in England, in the responses Francis Galton received to his pioneering questionnaire about mental imagery vividness. According to Galton, unlike the regular folk he questioned, many of the scientists and other intellectuals amongst his respondents were distinctly unwilling to admit to ever experiencing (visual) mental imagery (Galton, 1880a, 1883; see also Roe, 1951). (More recent research, entirely contradicts the implication, often drawn for Galton's findings, that scientists tend to have weaker mental imagery than most other people, or may even lack it altogether (Brewer & Schommer-Aikins, 2006; see also Isaac & Marks, 1994). [1]) It is hard to say how widespread such attitudes were, or how they originated (or why they now seem to have faded[2]) but they may well have contributed to the sharp decline in serious interest in imagery that is apparent, from the early decades of the 20th century, not only in psychology but also philosophy (see Heil, 1998 p. 213; Nyíri, 2001) and literary studies (Esrock, 1994). Only quite recently have there been signs of a revival of philosophical interest in the possibility that imagery might play a major role in cognition (e.g. Rollins, 1989; Ellis, 1995; Thomas, 1997b, 1999b, 2006; Heil, 1998; Nyíri, 2001; Prinz, 2002; McGinn, 2004; Arp, 2005, 2008).

Many other German psychologists, in the wake of the imageless thought controversy, continued to adhere to the Wundtian ambition of developing an experimental science of the mind, and returned to something like the sort of methodological caution in the use of introspective reports that Wundt himself had advocated, often insisting on the direct corroboration of introspective evidence by observable effects on behavior (Danziger, 1980). This usually meant that, as with Wundt himself, although their experimentally based psychology did not explicitly repudiate the essential role traditionally assigned to imagery in thought and memory, in practice it had rather little to say about it. (Plausible behavioral correlates of imagery processes were not established until the rise of the cognitive psychology movement.)

Perhaps the most influential movement arising from this strand of German psychological thought was Gestalt Psychology. It was also perhaps the last German bred movement to make a major impact in the United States, where it became a sort of “official opposition” to the indigenous and dominant Behaviorism. This was facilitated by the fact that, under the pressure of the rising tide of German Naziism, a significant number of Gestalt Psychology's adherents – including the acknowledged leaders, Max Wertheimer, Wolfgang Köhler, and Kurt Koffka – emigrated to America during the 1920s and 30s (Ash, 1998). Gestalt Theory attempted to explain “higher” thought processes in terms of a sort of hypothetical neuroscience (field theory) rather than in terms of the vicissitudes of introspected thought contents (Thomas, 1987; Ash, 1998). Although the Gestalt psychologists were much concerned with the experimental investigation of subjective experience (from whence they sought most of the evidential support for their views), in practice this research focused almost entirely on perceptual experience. The typical Gestaltist experiment sought immediate, unreflective descriptions of the appearance of a carefully constructed stimulus (frequently complex and illusional), and preferentially used subjects naïve to the theoretical views and concerns of the experimenter. This was something very unlike the deliberate “looking within” practiced by psychologically sophisticated, trained introspectors in the laboratories of Titchener, Külpe, and their students and peers. In certain respects Gestalt psychology foreshadowed, and, indeed, importantly influenced, the cognitivist movement of recent decades (Gardner, 1987). Nevertheless, it had little directly to say about the nature or function of imagery.

Copyright © 2014 by
Nigel J.T. Thomas <>

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