Supplement to Mental Imagery

Founders of Experimental Psychology: Wilhelm Wundt and William James

Wilhelm Wundt, acclaimed as “the father of experimental psychology”, established the first psychological research and teaching laboratory within the Philosophy Department at Leipzig in around 1876 (Fancher, 1996). He regarded his psychology as a branch of philosophy, an attempt to apply the experimental methods of natural science (particularly, the physiology of Helmholtz) to essentially philosophical problems concerning the nature of mind and its metaphysical status. This view of the subject persisted, in Germany, at least until the Nazi era. Wundt's research program aimed to investigate the “elements of consciousness,” and the laws governing the combination of these elements (Wundt, 1912). Although his theoretical system made a place for emotional feelings as one class of element, in practice the main focus of Wundt's experimentally based research program was on the elements of sensation and their compounding into ideas. As has been the case in the Empiricist philosophical tradition, these ideas were conceived of as, to all intents and purposes, mental images. Indeed, Wundt insists, much in the spirit of Hume, that there is no fundamental difference in kind between the ideas arising directly from perception and “memory images” (Wundt, 1912). Thus, Wundtian experimental psychology was largely a study of cognitive processes, and, for him (and most of his numerous students and imitators), the mental image (under the rubric idea) played essentially the same crucial, representational role in cognition that it had played for most of his philosophical predecessors.

Wundt's American counterpart, and contemporary, William James, took a not dissimilar view, although he was careful to acknowledge that in some people the “thought stuff,” as he called it, might consist not so much of visual imagery as of imagery of other modes, especially the “verbal images” of inner speech (James, 1890 ch. 18). In his textbook The Principles of Psychology (1890) James has much that is insightful to say about psychological processes in general, and about the role of imagery in them in particular, but, although he presented experimental demonstrations in the course of his psychology teaching at Harvard, James had little interest in the actual pursuit of experimental research, and established no graduate teaching program in experimental psychology (Fancher, 1996). Thus, despite the lucidity of his justly famous text, and the wide readership it has continued to find, his direct influence on the disciplinary development of scientific psychology, even in his native America, probably never equaled that of Wundt (or even lesser German pioneers, such as G.E. Müller), who trained many Americans (as well as many Germans, and students of other nationalities) in the techniques of experimental research. Just around this time, when psychology was the latest intellectual fashion, the American Universities were undergoing a tremendous expansion. Thus many of these students were able to return from Germany to the United States to found experimental psychology teaching programs of their own. It was because of this, much more than the intellectual influence of James, that the U.S.A., well before it grew into a dominant world power and achieved its current leadership in the sciences generally, quickly grew to rival, and eventually surpass, Germany's initial preeminence in scientific psychology.

Although psychologists of this era have often been portrayed (notably by Boring (1950)) as using an introspective methodology, in fact Wundt, in particular, was very sensitive to standard criticisms of introspection, such as the contention that the very attempt to observe our own mental activities will itself alter them. He thus limited its use to situations where he was satisfied that the causes of the relevant mental events, the experimental stimuli, could be strictly controlled and the results shown to be replicable, with any introspective reports being made unreflectively, as soon as the relevant content appeared in the mind (Mischel, 1970; Danziger, 1980). Wundt's research did not rely upon discursive descriptions of mental contents. An “introspective” report in his laboratory might typically have involved no more than indicating the moment when a certain sensation entered consciousness, or saying whether a musical tone seemed higher or lower than the one presented just before. Such “introspective reports” differ little from the sorts of responses that might be called for in many modern cognitive psychology experiments. Wundt's methodological discipline meant that the data collected in his laboratory were primarily such things as reaction times or discrimination thresholds, rather than introspective accounts of inner contents or processes; it also meant, in practice, that his experiments were restricted almost entirely to the study of “lower” psychological processes, principally sensation and perception. Thus, although Wundt did hold that “higher” mental process, such as thought and memory, depended largely upon mental images (including verbal imagery, silent speech), in practice his experimental work did little directly to illuminate these. “Higher” mental processes, for Wundt, were best investigated non-experimentally, via a methodology that he called völkerpsychologie, a hermeneutic study of cultural products to which he devoted much of his later career, but which never achieved anything like the influence of his experimentally based work.

Copyright © 2010 by
Nigel J.T. Thomas <>

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