Supplement to Mental Imagery

From the Hellenistic to the Early Modern Era

Despite the obscurities surrounding the concept of phantasia, the impact on latter thinkers of Aristotle's account of cognition in general, and of imagery and imagination in particular, was enormous, and extended far beyond those who were avowed Aristotelians. Indeed, phantasia was an important concept in the epistemology and cognitive theory of the Stoic and Epicurean philosophical schools that dominated philosophy in the Hellenistic and earlier Roman Empire periods. However, the Stoics gave the word a rather different sense to that of Aristotle, and it is disputed whether his work had any significant impact on them (Sandbach, 1985; Long, 1986; Annas, 1992).

The Epicurean understanding of imagery (and of cognition in general), which we know mainly through the Latin verses of the Epicurean poet Lucretius (c.99-50 B.C.E.), was certainly very different from that of Aristotle. The Epicureans were atomists, committed materialists who held that nothing exists but atoms – tiny, indivisible particles in constant motion – and void. Our bodies, and all the objects of our ordinary experience, consist of large clumps of atoms, but because of their continual motion the atoms at the surfaces of things are constantly being thrown off in the form of thin films of atoms known as eidola or simulacra. It is because of these, it is held, that we are able to see. As they fly rapidly away from their source, the simulacra initially retain the form of the surface of the object from which they have come, and, if they enter our eyes fairly soon after being emitted, they cause our visual experience of the object (Lucretius, De Rerum Natura, Bk. IV lns. 54-238; Epicurus, Letter to Herodotus).

However, we are told that by no means all such simulacra enter someone's eyes soon after they are emitted. There are innumerably many of them, and many may fly around unperceived for a long time. During that time, they may collide with one another and become damaged and intermingled in various ways (simulacra may also form spontaneously in the air, out of stray atoms coming together). Also, as atoms continue to fly off in random directions, over time simulacra decay and become more and more attenuated until eventually they are so fine that they can enter our bodies through pores rather than through the eyes, and can enter even when our eyes are shut in sleep. Thus, thanks to the attenuated and often fragmented and entangled simulacra with which we are perpetually being bombarded, we have dreams and fantasies in which we may experience visions of centaurs or other chimeric monsters, or of men long dead (their simulacra may continue to be flying about, even long after they themselves are gone), or, indeed, of any other things or combinations of things that have ever existed. Like perceptions themselves, our imaginal experiences were held, by the Epicureans, to come not from within us, but from outside. This view seems to have extended even to deliberate thought. If we wish to mentally represent something to ourselves, to think about it, we do so not by internally constructing a representation, or by calling it up from some inner storehouse, but by selecting (via some sort of active attention) appropriate images from the enormous and diverse welter of attenuated, entangled, and fragmentary simulacra that is incessantly bombarding us from without (Lucretius, De Rerum Natura, Bk. IV lns. 722-822; see also: Long, 1986; Annas, 1992).

The revival of Platonism, that stemmed from the work of Plotinus in the third century C.E., also led to a revival of Aristotelian cognitive theory. What is now known as Neoplatonism rose to become the dominant philosophical system of later antiquity, deeply influencing late Roman and early medieval Christian thought (before being displaced by overt Aristotelianism). Although, of course, the Neoplatonists looked principally to Plato, in fact they also drew liberally on Aristotle's work. Aware, as they were, of the twenty formative years that Aristotle had spent studying under Plato in the Academy, they regarded him not so much as a critic of his master (as modern and Renaissance scholars tend to see him) but as an insightful, if occasionally misguided, developer of themes within the Platonist framework (Harris, 1976; Gerson, 2005; Karamanolis, 2006). As Plato himself has relatively little to say about cognitive processes, and Aristotle has much, this meant that Neoplatonist cognitive theory, and particularly its view of imagery and imagination, was very largely drawn from Aristotle (Wallis, 1972; Blumenthal, 1976, 1977-8, 1996; Emilsson, 1988; Sheppard, 1991). It is true that Plotinus, the founder of Neoplatonism, inveighs against the idea that either perception or memory depend upon anything like imprints or impressions (i.e., something analogous to an impression in wax) in the soul (Ennead IV, 6), but this is most plausibly read not as a denial of the role of imagery experiences in memory and thought, but rather of the theory that such experiences arise from the inner presence of spatially extended, picture-like representations (Emilsson, 1988) (something to which Aristotle himself may have been less than committed (Nussbaum, 1978)). Like contemporary enactive theorists of perception and imagery (see section 4.5 below), Plotinus does not regard either perceiving or imagining to be forms of passive receptivity, but, rather, as involving an active reaching toward the object of the experience.

As is well known, in the wake of the renaissance of learning of the 12th century C.E. (Haskins, 1927), Aristotelianism soon became the dominant philosophy of Western Christendom, and continued as such until the dawn of the modern era. (Even before that, it had had a seminal influence on the Islamic philosophical tradition.) However, even as the revolt against Aristotelianism (presaging the rise of modern science) got under way in the 16th and 17th centuries, Aristotle's views about imagery (and certain other aspects of cognition) retained much of their influence.

Consider, for example, Italian Renaissance philosopher Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola,[1] who, in around 1500, published a work entitled De Imaginatione (On the Imagination) (Caplan, 1930) which relied heavily and overtly on Aristotle's discussions of phantasia and phantasmata (Caplan, 1930; Schmitt, 1967). The book seems to have been quite widely read in the 16th century: at any rate, it went through five or six Latin editions as well as two editions in French translation (Schmitt, 1967 p. 57n6 & p. 191). Later in his career Pico became an outspoken and wide ranging critic of Aristotle's philosophy, a pioneer of the anti-Aristotelian movement. However, he explicitly did not repudiate his earlier work on imagination, remarking that although he rejects Aristotle's teachings when they are false (most of the time, as he now thinks), he still accepts them when they are true (Schmitt, 1967 p. 57).

Later, better-known, anti-Aristotelian philosophers of the early modern period continue to show clear traces of Aristotelian influence in their discussions of imagery and imagination. Rees (1971 p.194) and White (1990), both remark how much Hobbes' account of imagination and imagery (in Leviathan and De Corpore, particularly – see section 2.3.2) seems to rely upon Aristotle. This extends to very close parallels between Hobbes' actual words and relevant passages in Aristotle's Rhetoric (which Hobbes happened to have translated into English). It is also notable how Descartes, in his Treatise of Man (1664) describes the surface of the pineal gland as both the seat of imagination (i.e., the image forming capacity), and of common sense (the latter expression, as used here, referring to a distinctively Aristotelian perceptual faculty that is closely associated, or even identified, with imagination (phantasia) in Aristotelian cognitive theory – see section 2.3.1, especially note 9).

Copyright © 2010 by
Nigel J.T. Thomas <>

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