Notes to Mohism

1. ‘Mozi’ is pronounced roughly like “mwo dzuh,” ‘Mo Di’ like “mwo dee.” In the older, Wade-Giles romanization, ‘Mozi’ is written as ‘Mo-tzu’ or ‘Mo Tzu’ and ‘Mo Di’ as ‘Mo Ti’. “Mohism” is an English rendering of the Chinese Mo zhe or Mo jia, two terms for Mozi's followers. The ‘h’ in ‘Mohism’ is phonetically redundant but conventionally included to avoid the implication that Mohist views are in any way wet.

2. “Confucianism,” the conventional English rendering of Ru, is in fact a poor equivalent for the Chinese term, which has a connotation more similar to “classicist” or “ritualist.” In the Chinese tradition, Confucius is the most famous of the Ru, but the word ‘Ru’ itself does not allude directly to Confucius or his teachings.

3. Unless otherwise noted, this and subsequent references are to the Mozi. All translations from the Chinese are by the author.

4. Though both romanized as li, the Chinese words for “ritual” and “benefit” are distinct and are pronounced and written differently. To distinguish between the two, I will romanize “ritual” as li and “benefit” as

5. Hansen (1992) rightly underscores this point and its relation to the Mohists' critique of traditionalism (pp. 99-100, 106-108).

6. As Graham insightfully points out, for early Chinese thinkers, “The crucial not the Western philosopher's ‘What is the truth?’ but ‘Where is the Way?’, the way to order the state and conduct personal life” (1989, p. 3). Hansen's (1992) interpretation of the classical discourse -- and of Mohist thought in particular -- also stresses the centrality of the concept of dao (way).

7. Hansen (1992) and Garrett (1993) in particular have called attention to the fundamental role of distinctions and pattern recognition in early Chinese conceptions of knowledge and reasoning.

8. The most common use of the word zhi (know) in early Chinese texts seems to be in contexts in which it is best interpreted as “knowing-of” or “knowing-about,” a sort of recognition, familiarity, or understanding. A second common use is to mean roughly “know-to” or “know-how-to,” referring to a kind of competence or ability. Occasionally, zhi can be found in contexts in which it is interpretable as “knowing that,” and thus refers to propositional knowledge. However, it is not clear that early Chinese writers themselves distinguish such contexts from “knowing-of.” In any case, the Mohists' discussion of issues such as fatalism and the existence of ghosts indicates that the three sorts of knowledge are interrelated, and all three are explained by appeal to the ability to draw distinctions properly: To know-that or know-of is to know-to distinguish kinds of things correctly and apply the correct names or phrases to them. (For a different view, see Harbsmeier 1993, 1998.)

9. Hansen (1992) insightfully highlights this contrast and stresses the pragmatic focus of Mohist epistemology (pp. 104, 139).

10. In fact, in this version, unlike the other two, the standards are referred to as the three “gnomons” (biao), rather than the three “models” (fa). Gnomons were wooden poles or markers used in sets of three to fix the direction of sunrise and sunset on the horizon and thus determine the four cardinal directions.

11. Of course, some of the individuals in the state of nature might be ethical egoists, whose conception of yi is that it is morally right to pursue one's self-interest.

12. Donald Munro (1969) seems to have been the first to point out the central role of model emulation in early Chinese ethics and psychology, though he devotes little attention to Mohism in particular.

13. Tian xia, the expression translated “all under heaven” here and “the world” in a number of passages above, refers to the human social world, not the natural world. When the Mohists speak of “the benefit of tian xia,” they are referring to the welfare of all human beings, not that of the natural environment.

14. The criticism of modern moral theories is due to Michael Stocker. For more on this and related issues, see his “The Schizophrenia of Modern Ethical Theories” and the other essays collected in Roger Crisp and Michael Slote, eds., Virtue Ethics (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997). Note that despite the prominent place of virtues in Mohist ethics, the theory is not a form of virtue ethics, because the virtues are not taken as the basis for fundamental criteria of right action. Rather, the fundamental criterion of right is to promote benefit and eliminate harm to everyone. The virtues are intrinsic moral goods (presumably because they are considered intrinsically morally admirable) posited as elements of “benefit.”

15. I am indebted to Dan Robins for this point.

16. It is raised once, by an opponent named Wumazi in an anecdote in Book 46, “Geng Zhu,” but is dismissed without careful consideration.

17. Part of the problem here is that the Mohists draw no distinction between permissibility, obligation, and supererogation. One probable reason for this is that their conception of judgment and argumentation tends to lead them to cast all issues as a matter of deciding between a pair of polar opposites, one of which is “right” (shi) and one “not” (fei). They think it is enough to show that inclusive care is shi, not fei, leaving unanswered the issue of what exactly shi amounts to. Another possible source of confusion is an ambiguity in the word jian, which can be read in either the weak sense of “all-inclusive” or the strong sense of “jointly, as one.”

18. I owe this reference to Graham (1978).

Copyright © 2010 by
Chris Fraser <>

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