Supplement to Mohism

Texts and Authorship

Like most classical Chinese texts, the Mozi, our main source for Mohist thought, originally consisted of a collection of bamboo-strip scrolls called pian, or “books,” each of which was itself a distinct text or series of short texts ranging in length from several hundred to several thousand graphs. Hence the Mozi is not a single composition or work, in the modern sense, but an anthology of diverse writings probably composed at different times by different writers or editors. No part of the anthology purports to be from the hand of Mo Di himself.

Organization of the Mozi

According to a table of contents compiled during or before the Han dynasty (206 BCE–219 CE), the Mozi originally consisted of 71 books, of which 18 are now lost. The 71 books fall into five groups, which are likely of different origin.

  1. The first group consists of seven short texts on a variety of topics, including essays summarizing Mohist doctrines, anecdotes about Mozi, and a pair of essays that expound what are essentially mainstream early Chinese views on self-cultivation and the value of worthy scholar-officials. This block of texts is probably the latest part of the corpus, dating from perhaps the mid to late 3rd century BCE (one book mentions the fall of a king known to have died in 286 BCE (Lau 1963)).
  2. The second group is the core of the collection, comprising ten “triads,” or sets of three essays expounding the ten main doctrines of the Mohist school, plus two further books containing criticisms of the Ru (Confucians), some of them perhaps stock rebuttals used in debates (and all of them hostile, descending at times to petty slander). Of these 32 texts, seven of the triad essays and one of the anti-Confucian books are now lost. This block of texts probably contains the earliest parts of the corpus, perhaps from Mozi's lifetime or shortly after his death around the end of the 5th century BCE. The essays appear to be of varied date and origin, however, and linguistic, formal, and thematic evidence suggests that they fall into several chronologically distinct strata. One clue to their dates is that Book 18, which falls within a relatively early stratum, must have been written after 431 BCE, since it mentions a war that occurred that year (Graham, 1989). A further clue is that Book 19, which falls within a middle stratum, was probably written well before 334 BCE, because in a list of warlike contemporary states it includes Yue, which was conquered and absorbed by its enemy Chu that year. (For further discussion of the stratification of the triads, see The Ten Triads.)
  3. Next come six books known as the “Later Mohist” or “Neo-Mohist” texts. These include two sets of short “canons” (jing), two sets of longer “explanations” (shuo) of the canons, a brief but rich text on argumentation and logic, and a collection of fragments from two or more lost essays on ethics and semantics. These books treat a variety of topics, including language, epistemology, analogical reasoning, ethics, geometry, mechanics, optics, and economics, and are of the highest philosophical and historical interest. Unfortunately, the texts are the most difficult and corrupt in all the classical Chinese literature. The best editorial reconstruction of the canons and explanations is Graham's (1978), although fundamental aspects of his interpretation of the texts are questionable (Geaney, 1999). This section of the corpus is probably chronologically later than most of the doctrinal books. A reasonable conjecture, based on the intellectual milieu implied by the texts, would be that they date from the first half of the 3rd century BCE.
  4. The fourth group comprises five books that we might call the “dialogues” or the Mohist “analects.” Four are structured mainly as series of short conversations between Mozi and various disciples or opponents, perhaps after the model of the Confucian Analects. The fifth relates an anecdote about Mozi persuading the powerful ruler of Chu not to attack the weak state of Song and then, on his journey home, being denied shelter from the rain by the keeper of one of Song's city gates. These books reflect a flourishing, well-organized Mohist group that trains students, recommends them for government posts or dispatches them on military assignments, and engages in spirited debates with representatives of rival advocacy groups, such as the Ru (Confucians). The writers are familiar with parts of the Confucian Analects, quoting a passage thought to be from the middle strata of that text. Their social status and intellectual environment seem more advanced than those implied by the earliest doctrinal books. Though any estimate of the date of these texts is speculative, a reasonable conjecture is that they date from the middle to late decades of the 4th century BCE. It is thus likely that many of the conversations they report are at least partly fictional.
  5. The final block of 21 books is devoted entirely to military engineering and tactics for defending cities during siege warfare. Ten of these books are lost and others are seriously corrupt. (A partial reconstruction is presented in Yates, 1980.) Unlike any other part of the Mozi, many of these books are organized as replies by Mozi to questions by a leading disciple, Qin Guli, who is referred to as “Master Qin,” suggesting that the texts might have been composed by his disciples and their followers.

This article focuses on aspects of Mohist thought as presented in the core doctrinal books (the ten triads, books 8-37) and the dialogues (books 46-49). (For more information on Later Mohist thought, see the separate entry for “Mohist Canons.”)

The Ten Triads

The ten triads are ten sets of three essays expounding the ten main doctrines of the Mohist school. At the time the Mozi was compiled, each of the ten doctrines was represented by three identically titled essays, labeled the “upper,” “middle,” and “lower” parts of their respective triad. Six of the triads have been preserved complete; four are now missing one or two essays. The essays in the six complete triads are partly similar, running parallel in places for several paragraphs at a time. Yet the texts also show significant differences in language, structure, and content. A number of theories have been proposed to explain the significance of the three versions of each essay. The best explanation, supported by analyses of both language and content, seems to be that the essays belong to different chronological strata and thus represent different stages in the development of Mohist thought (Brooks 1996; Fraser forthcoming [b]). Later, longer essays modify and supplement earlier, shorter ones, developing more sophisticated doctrines, remedying weak points, addressing new issues, and responding to objections. The different strata were probably produced by different writers or editors, who may have belonged to the same or different factions of the Mohist movement. However, the strata do not coincide exactly with the division of the texts into “upper,” “middle,” and “lower” versions, so these labels do not demarcate three distinct series of texts attributable to three different Mohist factions.

For a summary of the argument for this conclusion, including a brief critique of the most prominent competing theories, see the following supplement:

Significance and Chronology of the Triads


All but three of the essays in the ten triads begin with an incipit “Our Master Mozi states...,” a formula used throughout the essays to introduce key doctrinal statements. Since much of the content of the texts is attributed to Mozi in this way, readers have traditionally been inclined to treat them as generally reliable reports of his speech and to regard Mozi as the author of all the ideas the texts present. However, this interpretive approach is undermined by several points.

First, what is known of ancient Chinese writing practices suggests that attribution of a doctrine to a historical figure in a Warring States text is not a sufficient reason for believing that the person actually espoused that doctrine. Most writing in pre-Han China was anonymous, and writers commonly placed their own ideas in the mouths of a venerated teacher or historical figure. For example, scholars have long argued plausibly that many remarks in the Analects attributed to Confucius and speeches in the Guanzi attributed to Guan Zhong were actually written long after their deaths. Moreover, existing texts were routinely rearranged, modified, and supplemented by editors and compilers.

Second, the essays in each triad sometimes present different, even incompatible views that suggest modifications in position over time in response to changing circumstances, challenges from opponents, and perceived weaknesses in earlier positions. One essay in each triad is considerably shorter than the others, which introduce and develop issues not raised in the briefer text. Often a single thinker will revise his views over time, of course, and it remains possible that all the essays express the thought of one man. But on the whole the disparities between them seem better explained by the hypothesis that they were composed by different writers and editors working in different social and intellectual settings. This hypothesis also best explains significant linguistic differences between some of the essays (for more information, see the discussion in Significance and Chronology of the Triads).

Third, in some essays, a significant portion of the argument is not attributed to Mozi at all, but presented in a narrator's voice, with only occasional citations of Mozi's words. This raises the possibility that the basic structure of the argument is due to the writer or editor, and not to Mozi himself.

Given these considerations, we cannot safely attribute to Mo Di himself all of the views expressed in the core doctrinal books, nor, a fortiori, those advanced in the rest of the anthology. A more defensible stance is that the doctrinal essays collect together texts by an unknown number of anonymous Mohist writers, which develop, refine, or extend basic themes or ideas first set forth by Mozi. But the available evidence is so limited that we have no rigorous way of determining which of the detailed statements in these texts, if any, represent Mozi's own views and which are extensions, revisions, or entirely new ideas introduced by his followers. Moreover, even if we had some reliable means of picking out the founder's original statements, the other, later material might well prove to be of greater interest.

For these reasons, in interpreting and discussing the Mozi, the most productive and defensible approach is probably to set aside the issue of which parts of the corpus do or do not represent the views of the historical Mo Di. At the same time, scholarly precision demands that we not suggest, even indirectly, that the texts are generally an accurate presentation of the words or views of a single great thinker named “Mozi,” since historically we know this may well be false. Accordingly, instead of discussing the ideas of “Mozi,” a historical figure whose exact relation to the texts is unknown, we should discuss the diverse, sometimes conflicting statements of “Mohist” doctrines, understood to be an evolving set of views preserved in a collection of texts probably composed by different persons over many years.

Composition of Individual Books

At first glance, the core doctrinal books of the Mozi may appear to be continuous, unified essays. Closer inspection, however, suggests that many of them are highly composite texts, produced by splicing independent short paragraphs together to form a longer whole. An editor's or compiler's hand is readily apparent in places, such as when semi-independent passages are integrated into a longer essay by repeating a brief concluding formula after each. Similar paragraphs are often reused in different books in the same or different triads (Maeder 1992), and in a few places distinctive vocabulary strongly suggests that different paragraphs within the same book are of diverse origin (Fraser forthcoming [b]). It is thus probable that, like the anthology itself, some of the individual books were not originally written as integral works, but composed in piecemeal fashion or in stages, the writers or compilers gradually adding new sections over time.

The Role of Oral Transmission

A common conjecture about the three series of doctrinal essays is that they represent three separate redactions of a shared oral teaching (Graham, 1985). Stated in this simple form, this conjecture is probably incorrect, for three reasons. First, linguistic features indicate that the theory that the three series are the canonical texts of three groups of Mohists is probably mistaken (for details, see Significance and Chronology of the Triads). Second, the essays in each triad differ too extensively in structure and content to plausibly be considered alternative versions of the same orally transmitted teaching. In general, the three parts of each triad are not mere variants of each other, but address different issues and offer different arguments. Third, in some longer essays, paragraphs that run parallel to a shorter essay alternate with other paragraphs in which distinctive stylistic and linguistic features are clustered (Fraser forthcoming [b]). Also, topics raised briefly in one essay are sometimes developed at greater length in another, apparently later one. These patterns suggest that written versions of some of the essays were used as sources for others in the same triad, which supplement and expand on them.

These points make it unlikely that the three essays in each triad represent separate versions of a single, original oral teaching. The possibility remains, however, that the essays might be jointly based on a brief core of orally transmitted material, which was later written down and augmented by new, written material. Traces of this oral core might be evident in certain repetitive, formulaic passages in which two or more of the essays run almost exactly parallel. It is also likely that long after the Mohists adopted the practice of writing down their doctrines, some of their compositions continued to be intended for memorization and oral delivery, especially since some of the Mohists and perhaps much of their audience were probably illiterate. Hence even texts that were composed with the aid of writing may retain the rhythmic, repetitive, formulaic structure characteristic of oral composition and recitation.


Brooks 1996; Fraser forthcoming (b); Geaney 1999; Graham 1978, 1985, 1989; Lau 1963; Maeder 1992; Yates 1980.

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