Supplement to Mohist Canons

Canon B73

The following example, Canon B73, gives a good taste of later Mohist argumentation at its most rigorous. The canon concerns whether the notion of the “limitless”—that is, infinity—makes all-inclusive moral concern logically impossible.

Canon. The limitless doesn't interfere with all-inclusiveness. Explained by: Filling or not.

Explanation. [Objection:] If the south has a limit, then it can be exhausted [that is, its end can be reached]. If it is limitless, then it cannot be exhausted. Whether it has a limit or not cannot yet be known, so whether it can be exhausted or not cannot yet be known. Whether or not people fill it not yet being known, [and so] whether or not people can be exhausted also not yet being known, it is perverse to insist that one can be concerned for all people.

[Reply:] If people do not fill the limitless, then people have a limit. Exhausting what has a limit presents no difficulty. If people do fill the limitless, then the limitless can be exhausted. [So] exhausting the limitless presents no difficulty.

The explanation first presents an objection: We do not know whether the mass of humanity is infinite or not, since we don't know whether the south—the direction of the top of an ancient Chinese map—has a limit, and we don't know whether the mass of humanity fills it, and is thus finite or infinite. So it is unreasonable to insist on the ethical standard that we must be all-inclusively concerned for all of humanity, since humanity could turn out to be infinitely vast. The Mohists reply that even if the world is limitless in size, inclusive concern is possible, as shown by a dilemma: Either humanity fills the limitless or it doesn't. If it doesn't, then the mass of humanity is limited, and it can be “exhausted”—that is, its end can in principle be reached. If it does, then the limitless can be “exhausted,” and obviously so can the mass of humanity inside it. Either way, there is no logical problem involved in holding that one should be concerned inclusively for all of humanity.

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Chris Fraser <cjfraser@gmail.com>

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