Supplement to Mohist Canons

Pronunciation Guide

The following is a very rough guide to the pronunciation of some of the Chinese terms used in the article. A question mark indicates a rising tone, an exclamation point a falling tone. (Caution: Some of the suggested English equivalents approximate the Chinese sounds only vaguely.)

Chinese Term Approximate English Pronunciation
Bi (other) “be” as in the verb “to be”
Bian (disputation) “be-yen!” pronounced as a single syllable
Ci (expressions) “tsuh?” as in “catsup,” dropping the initial ‘ca’ and final ‘p’
Da Qu (“Big Selection”) “da!” “chew”
Fei (not-this, wrong) “fey”
He (matching) “her?” without the final ‘r’
Jian ai (inclusive concern) “jee-yen,” pronounced as a single syllable; “I!” as in “I do”
Ke (admissible) “ker” without the final ‘r’
Li (benefit) “lee!”
Mou (drawing parallels) “moe?”
Mozi (classical text) “mwo!” followed by “dz”
Pi (analogy) “pee!”
Qi (breath, energy) “chee!” as in “cheese”
Quan (weighing) “ch” as in “cheese” followed by “when?”
Shi (this, right) “shr!” or “sher!” as in “Sherlock”
Shí (reality, things, objects) “shr?” or “sher?” as in “Sherlock”
Shuo (explanation) “shwo”
Tian (heaven) “tee-yen,” pronounced as a single syllable
Tong (same, similar) “tohng?” (“toe” plus an “-ng?” ending)
Tui (extending) “tway”
Xi (happiness) “shee” as in ‘banshee’
Xiao Qu (“Small Selection”) “sheow” (rhymes with “meow”) “chew”
Xing (shape) “sheeng?” “shee” as in ‘banshee’ plus an “-ng?” ending
Xu (empty, hollow) like “issue” without the initial ‘i’
Xunzi (classical Confucian text) “issue,” without the initial ‘i’ and adding a final ‘n?’, followed by “dz”
Yi (thought, intention) “e!” (a clipped pronunciation of the letter “e”)
Yi (duty, morality) “e!”
Yuan (citing) “yoo-wen?,” pronounced as a single syllable
Zhi (knowledge) “jr!,” roughly like “jerk” without the final ‘k’
Zhi (intention) “jr!”
Zhuangzi (classical Daoist text) “joo-wong” pronounced as one syllable, followed by “dz”

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Chris Fraser <cjfraser@gmail.com>

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