Supplement to Moral Anti-Realism

Mackie's Arguments for the Moral Error Theory

The Argument from Relativity (often more perspicaciously referred to as “the Argument from Disagreement”) begins with an empirical observation: that there is an enormous amount of variation in moral views, and that moral disagreements are often characterized by an unusual degree of intractability. Mackie argues that the best explanation of these phenomena is that moral judgments “reflect adherence to and participation in different ways of life” (1977: 36). This, at least, is a better explanation than the hypothesis that there is a realm of objective moral facts to which some cultures have inferior epistemic access than others. The example Mackie uses is of two cultures' divergent moral views regarding monogamy. Is it really plausible, he asks, that one culture enjoys access to the moral facts regarding marital arrangements whereas the other lacks that access? Isn't it much more likely that monogamy happened to develop in one culture but not in the other (for whatever cultural or anthropological reasons), and that the respective moral views emerged as a result?

Opposition to the Argument from Relativity can, broadly speaking, take two forms. First, one might deny the empirical premise, arguing that moral disagreement is not really as widespread as it is often made out to be, or at least arguing that much of the conspicuous disagreement masks extensive moral agreement at a deeper level (a level pertaining to more fundamental moral principles). Mackie makes some brief remarks in response to this argument (1977: 37). Second, one might accept the phenomenon of moral disagreement at face value but deny that the best explanation of this favors the error theory. Often both strategies are deployed side by side. For discussion, see Brink 1984; Shafer-Landau 1994; Loeb 1998; Lillehammer 2004; Tersman 2006; Doris & Plakias 2008.

The Argument from Queerness has two strands: one metaphysical and one epistemological. The first states that our conception of a moral property is essentially one of a very unusual kind of property, such that countenancing its instantiation requires us to posit in the world “qualities or relations of a very strange sort, utterly different from anything else in the universe” (Mackie 1977: 38). The second states that in order to track such weird properties we would need “some special faculty of moral perception or intuition, utterly different from our ordinary ways of knowing everything else” (ibid.). These are not independent arguments, since we are forced to posit weird epistemological equipment only if it has already been established that the properties in question are weird. Thus really it is the metaphysical strand of the Argument from Queerness that is load bearing.

The Argument from Queerness may be taken to refer to Mackie's specific version or may be considered in a generic sense. In the generic sense, whenever one argues (A) that morality is centrally committed to some thesis X, and (B) that X is bizarre, ontologically profligate, or just too far-fetched to be taken seriously, etc., then one has presented a kind of Argument from Queerness. (Arguments for the moral error theory need not take this form; one might, for example, simply discover that X is empirically false.) This is generic since “X” could denote any of an open-ended range of options. But even understanding the Argument from Queerness in a non-generic sense is no straightforward matter, since it is not entirely clear what Mackie intends to put in place of “X.”

Mackie says that for moral properties to exist would require the existence of “objective prescriptions,” and it is evidently these prescriptions that he finds metaphysically queer. He claims that in denying the existence of such prescriptions he is denying that any “categorically imperative element is objectively valid” (1977: 29). A categorical imperative is an imperative (“Do φ”) that is applied to a subject irrespective of that person's ends. It is to be contrasted with a hypothetical imperative, which does depend on a person's ends. Thus “Go to bed now” is usually understood to be tacitly conditional, depending on something like “…if you want to get a decent night's sleep.” If it turns out that the person lacks this desire (or any other desire that promises to be satisfied by following the advice), then the imperative should be withdrawn. By contrast, the categorical imperative “Don't murder children” cannot be begged off by the addressee explaining that he really enjoys murdering children, that he lacks any desires that will be satisfied if the imperative is obeyed; it is not a piece of advice at all. Note that it does not appear to be categorical imperatives per se that trouble Mackie, but categorical imperatives that purport to be “objectively valid.” Quite what he means by this restriction, however, remains unclear.

Mackie gives two concrete illustrations of what he has in mind—of what the world would have to be like in order for these putatively weird moral properties to be instantiated. First, he mentions Plato's account of the Form of the Good, which is such that the mere comprehension of the fact that something participates in the Form (i.e., is good) somehow automatically engages the motivation to seek that thing. The Good, for Plato, has a kind of magical magnetism built into it. Second, Mackie mentions Samuel Clarke, who in the early 18th century argued for (in Mackie's words) “necessary relations of fitness between situations and actions, so that a situation would have a demand for such-and-such an action somehow built into it” (1977: 40). The fact that these two illustrations are subtly but importantly different is responsible for at least some of the confusion surrounding the putative source of queerness. The Plato example suggests that the weirdness resides in properties the recognition of which causally compels motivation; the Clarke example suggests that the weirdness resides in properties that demand action (and thus motivation). The latter is arguably the more charitable interpretation (see Garner 1990), and also seems to fit better with comments made elsewhere by Mackie concerning the role of practical reasons in the Argument from Queerness. He writes that “to say that [objective prescriptions] are intrinsically action-guiding [which is one way Mackie sometimes describes the queerness whose existence he is denying] is to say that the reasons that they give for doing or for not doing something are independent of that agent's desires or purposes” (Mackie 1982: 115).

It would make sense if Mackie were, then, simply to deny the existence of such “desire-transcendent” reasons (like Williams 1981); but his position is characteristically more nuanced than this. He allows that we often legitimately employ talk of reasons regarding persons who have no desires that will be satisfied by performing the action in question. If some other people are suffering, for example, and there is some course of action I can take to relieve that suffering, then “it would be natural,” Mackie says, to claim that these sufferings “constitute some reason ... independent of any desire that I now have to help these other people” (1977: 78-9). Though Mackie doesn't attempt to discredit appeals to such desire-transcendent reasons, what he does insist on is that talk of such reasons is made legitimate only by the presence of an institution: What allows the transition from “There is a stranger writhing in agony before me” to “I have a reason to help” is a cluster of institutional facts, not brute facts. Examples of institutions, given by Mackie, include the rules of chess, social practices such as promising, and the thoughts and behaviors associated with the idea of a person's identity persisting through time. Such institutions have rules of conduct which guide the behavior and speech of adherents, and transgressions of which are condemned. Importantly, such requirements “are constituted by human thought, behaviour, feelings, and attitudes” (1977: 81), and thus any such requirements are, in a central sense, mind-dependent. This, perhaps, provides insight into why Mackie objects not to categorical imperatives per se, but to objective categorical imperatives: It is categorical imperatives that profess to transcend all institutions, that purport to depend for their legitimacy on “requirements which simply are there, in the nature of things” (1977: 59), that are singled out as erroneous. As with categorical imperatives, so with reasons: It may not be false to claim “Anyone has a reason to ease the suffering of others,” but its truth is guaranteed only by invoking an institutional way of speaking—an institution of which one may or may not be an adherent. (Mackie writes that one is never “logically committed” to offer allegiance to an institution.) It is only when such a reason claim purports to transcend all institutions—when it is imbued with ambitions of objectivity—that it oversteps the mark.

In light of these observations, the error theory arises because (Mackie thinks) moral discourse is pervaded through and through with aspirations to robust, institution-transcendent prescriptivity. To some extent he considers that this is due to a natural human projectivist tendency (1977: 42), but he also thinks that the problematic notions of “what is intrinsically fitting or required by the nature of things” are in part the product of institutional thinking, and thus so too are the concepts of value, obligation, and reasons that depend on these notions (1977: 82). However, this does not mean that these notions and concepts are institutional in content; the idea of an institution-transcendent requirement is not shown to be any less erroneous, Mackie thinks, if we observe that the idea grew out of, and remains supported by, a widely accepted institution.

For more on Mackie's argument from queerness, see Joyce 2001; Shepski 2008; Bedke 2010; Olson 2014. Several papers in Joyce & Kirchin 2010 directly discuss the argument from queerness.

Copyright © 2015 by
Richard Joyce <>

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