Supplement to Moral Anti-Realism

Moral subjectivism versus moral relativism

Relativism holds that moral claims contain an essential indexical element, such that the truth of any such claim requires relativization to some individual or group. According to such a view, it is possible that when John asserts “Stealing is wrong” he is saying something true, but that when Jenny asserts “Stealing is wrong” she is saying something false. An individualistic relativism sees the vital difference as lying in the persons making the utterance; a cultural relativism sees the difference as stemming from the respective cultures that the speakers inhabit. (There are more complicated possibilities. Gilbert Harman, for example, would relativize the utterance to a context shared by both speaker and audience (Harman 1975; Harman and Thomson 1996).) In either case, it may be that what determines the difference in the two contexts is something “mind-dependent”—in which case it would be subjectivist relativism—but it need not be. Perhaps what determines the relevant difference is an entirely mind-independent affair, making for an objectivist relativism. (Consider: Tallness is a relative notion—John is a tall man but a short pro basketball player—but it is not the case that “thinking makes it so.”) Conversely, the subjectivist need not be a relativist. Suppose the moral facts depend on the attitudes or opinions of a particular group or individual (e.g., “X is good” means “Caesar approves of X,” or “The Supreme Court rules in favor of X” or “God commands X,” etc.), and thus moral truth is an entirely mind-dependent affair. Since, in this case, all speakers' moral utterances are made true or false by the same mental activity, then this is not strictly speaking a version of relativism, but is, rather, a relation-designating account of moral terms (see Stevenson 1963: 74 for this distinction). In a relation-designating account of moral goodness (say, Roderick Firth's ideal observer theory, to be discussed in section 5 of the main entry) it is not possible that when John asserts “Stealing is wrong” he is saying something true but that when Jenny asserts “Stealing is wrong” she is saying something false. The mind-dependence relation embodied in a subjectivist theory may give rise to a relation-designating account of moral truth rather than a relativistic account.

In short, the subjectivism vs. objectivism and the relativism vs. absolutism polarities are orthogonal to each other, and it is the former pair that matters when it comes to characterizing anti-realism.

Copyright © 2007 by
Richard Joyce <richard.joyce@vuw.ac.nz>

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