Supplement to Moral Anti-Realism

Subjectivism and the anthropological perspective

It may be questioned whether Rosen's frequent appeal to the anthropological standpoint in his attacks on the objective/subjective distinction is quite fair. It is a platitude that whenever invention occurs, discovery-talk can come along for free, for it is always possible for someone else to make discoveries about any act of invention. (One could discover that the pavlova dessert was invented in Australia rather than New Zealand.) But it would be a mistake to allow this platitude to move us to doubt that the very notion of invention is coherent, or doubt that the rhetoric of invention is, in certain cases, appropriate and primary. After all, the anthropological perspective is possible even in a Berkeleyan universe of pure minds, and something has surely gone wrong if even facts in Bishop Berkeley's globally idealistic world count as objective. Recall, first, that Berkeley was no error theorist about ordinary objects like tables and chairs; rather, he thought that all along what we mean to refer to with “table” is an idea, so that when Fred thinks “There's a table,” then, even though all he perceives is an idea of a table, he has, by Berkeley's lights, thought something true. Berkeley admits other minds into his ontology, so let us imagine one of these—an angel, perhaps—doing some anthropological investigation. (It will not alter the point of the case, and will simplify things, if we allow that the angel has thoughts and ideas independently of God.) The angel observes Fred's mind and notices that Fred is perceiving a table (i.e., is having an idea of a table). The fact that Fred is seeing a table is not caused or constituted by any mental activity on the angel's part; the angel's investigations deserve to be described in terms of detection and discovery. Yet the mere possibility or conceivability of an anthropological perspective deserving such descriptions surely does not undermine the assumption that, in the Berkeleyan universe, Fred's thought “There is a table” is, though true, not true in a robustly objective manner.

One response to Rosen's observations might be to construe mind-(in)dependence as a relative notion. From one perspective—that of those doing the “inventing”—a phenomenon may be subjective; while from the perspective of a possible investigating anthropologist the very same phenomenon may be objective. Thus, “Fred is in pain,” may be subjectively true from Fred's perspective, but objectively true from ours. This, however, though coherent, seems an unattractive expedient, clashing with a strong philosophical tradition that takes the relevant mind-dependence relation, and the notions of (anti)-realism built upon it, to be an absolute matter. It would be preferable if we could elucidate the relevant notion(s) of mind-dependence in such a way that it becomes irrelevant and uninteresting if an anthropological perspective—with its attendant imagery of discovery and detection—can be invoked. Rosen's argument boils down to the observation that some of the imagery traditionally associated with mind-independence (i.e., that of discovery and detection) can in fact always be applied to what we might otherwise be tempted to think of as a realm of mind-dependent facts. But he offers no argument to the conclusion that the permissibility of this imagery of discovery excludes the possibility of a robust notion of mind-dependence. If discovery-talk and mind-dependence-talk can co-exist with respect to the same phenomenon (as Rosen observes), the latter may nevertheless remain of conspicuous philosophical significance, since, after all, it will distinguish the case from all those other cases for which discovery-talk is permissible but mind-dependence-talk is wholly misplaced (e.g., concerning the chemical constitution of Jupiter).

Copyright © 2007 by
Richard Joyce <richard.joyce@vuw.ac.nz>

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