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When a person performs or fails to perform a morally significant action, we sometimes think that a particular kind of response is warranted. Praise and blame are perhaps the most obvious forms this reaction might take. For example, one who encounters a car accident may be regarded as worthy of praise for having saved a child from inside the burning car, or alternatively, one may be regarded as worthy of blame for not having used one's mobile phone to call for help. To regard such agents as worthy of one of these reactions is to ascribe moral responsibility to them on the basis of what they have done or left undone. (These are examples of other-directed ascriptions of responsibility. The reaction might also be self-directed, e.g., one can recognize oneself to be blameworthy). Thus, to be morally responsible for something, say an action, is to be worthy of a particular kind of reaction—praise, blame, or something akin to these—for having performed it.
Though further elaboration and qualification of the above characterization of moral responsibility is called for and will be provided below, this is enough to distinguish concern about this form of responsibility from some others commonly referred to through use of the terms ‘responsibility’ or ‘responsible.’ To illustrate, we might say that higher than normal rainfall in the spring is responsible for an increase in the amount of vegetation or that it is the judge's responsibility to give instructions to the jury before they begin deliberating. In the first case, we mean to identify a causal connection between the earlier amount of rain and the later increased vegetation. In the second, we mean to say that when one assumes the role of judge, certain duties, or obligations, follow. Although these concepts are connected with the concept of moral responsibility discussed here, they are not the same, for in neither case are we directly concerned about whether it would be appropriate to react to some candidate (here, the rainfall or a particular judge) with something like praise or blame.
Philosophical reflection on moral responsibility has a long history. One reason for this persistent interest is the way the topic seems connected with a widely shared conception of ourselves as members of an importantly distinct class of individuals—call them ‘persons.’ Persons are thought to be qualitatively different from other known living individuals, despite their numerous similarities. Many have held that one distinct feature of persons is their status as morally responsible agents, a status resting—some have proposed—on a special kind of control that only they can exercise. Many who view persons in this way have wondered whether their special status is threatened if certain other claims about our universe are true. For example, can a person be morally responsible for her behavior if that behavior can be explained solely by reference to physical states of the universe and the laws governing changes in those physical states, or solely by reference to the existence of a sovereign God who guides the world along a divinely ordained path? It is concerns like these that have often motivated individuals to theorize about moral responsibility.
A comprehensive theory of moral responsibility would elucidate the following: (1) the concept, or idea, of moral responsibility itself; (2) the criteria for being a moral agent, i.e., one who qualifies generally as an agent open to responsibility ascriptions (e.g., only beings possessing the general capacity to evaluate reasons for acting can be moral agents); (3) the conditions under which the concept of moral responsibility is properly applied, i.e., those conditions under which a moral agent is responsible for a particular something (e.g., a moral agent can be responsible for an action she has performed only if she performed it freely, where acting freely entails the ability to have done otherwise at the time of action); and finally 4) possible objects of responsibility ascriptions (e.g., actions, omissions, consequences, character traits, etc.). Although each of these will be touched upon in the discussion below (see, e.g., the brief sketch of Aristotle's account in the next section), the primary focus of this entry is on the first component—i.e., the concept of moral responsibility. The section immediately following this introduction is a discussion of the origin and history of Western reflection on moral responsibility. This is followed by an overview of recent work on the concept of moral responsibility. For further discussion of issues associated with moral responsibility, see the related entries below.
- 1. Some Historical Background
- 2. Recent Work on the Concept of Responsibility
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
What follows in this section is a brief outline of the origins and trajectory of reflection on moral responsibility in the Western philosophical tradition. Against this background, a distinction will be drawn between two conceptions of moral responsibility that have exerted considerable influence on subsequent thinkers.
An understanding of the concept of moral responsibility and its application is present implicitly in some of the earliest surviving Greek texts, i.e., the Homeric epics (circa 8th century BCE but no doubt informed by a much earlier oral tradition). In these texts, both human and superhuman agents are often regarded as fair targets of praise and blame on the basis of how they have behaved, and at other times, an agent's behavior is excused because of the presence of some factor that has undermined his/her control (Irwin 1999: 225). Reflection on these factors gave rise to fatalism—the view that one's future or some aspect of it is predetermined, e.g., by the gods, or the stars, or simply some facts about truth and time—in such a way as to make one's particular deliberations, choices and actions irrelevant to whether that particular future is realized (recall, e.g., the plight of Oedipus). If some particular outcome is fated, then it seems that the agent concerned could not be morally responsible for that outcome. Likewise, if fatalism were true with respect to all human futures, then it would seem that no human agent could be morally responsible for anything. Though this brand of fatalism has sometimes exerted significant historical influence, most philosophers have rejected it on the grounds that there is no good reason to think that our futures are fated in the sense that they will unfold no matter what particular deliberations we engage in, choices we make, or actions we perform.
Aristotle (384–323 BCE) seems to have been the first to construct explicitly a theory of moral responsibility. In the course of discussing human virtues and their corresponding vices, Aristotle pauses in Nicomachean Ethics III.1–5 to explore their underpinnings. He begins with a brief statement of the concept of moral responsibility—that it is sometimes appropriate to respond to an agent with praise or blame on the basis of her actions and/or dispositional traits of character (1109b30–35). A bit later, he clarifies that only a certain kind of agent qualifies as a moral agent and is thus properly subject to ascriptions of responsibility, namely, one who possess a capacity for decision. For Aristotle, a decision is a particular kind of desire resulting from deliberation, one that expresses the agent's conception of what is good (1111b5-1113b3). The remainder of Aristotle's discussion is devoted to spelling out the conditions under which it is appropriate to hold a moral agent blameworthy or praiseworthy for some particular action or trait. His general proposal is that one is an apt candidate for praise or blame if and only if the action and/or disposition is voluntary. According to Aristotle, a voluntary action or trait has two distinctive features. First, there is a control condition: the action or trait must have its origin in the agent. That is, it must be up to the agent whether to perform that action or possess the trait—it cannot be compelled externally. Second, Aristotle proposes an epistemic condition: the agent must be aware of what it is she is doing or bringing about (1110a-1111b4).
There is an instructive ambiguity in Aristotle's account of responsibility, an ambiguity that has led to competing interpretations of his view. Aristotle aims to identify the conditions under which it is appropriate to praise or blame an agent, but it is not entirely clear how to understand the pivotal notion of appropriateness in his conception of responsibility. There are at least two possibilities: a) praise or blame is appropriate in the sense that the agent deserves such a response, given his behavior and/or traits of character; or b) praise or blame is appropriate in the sense that such a reaction is likely to bring about a desired consequence, namely an improvement in the agent's behavior and/or character. These two possibilities may be characterized in terms of two competing interpretations of the concept of moral responsibility: 1) the merit-based view, according to which praise or blame would be an appropriate reaction toward the candidate if and only if she merits—in the sense of ‘deserves’—such a reaction; vs. 2) the consequentialist view, according to which praise or blame would be appropriate if and only if a reaction of this sort would likely lead to a desired change in the agent and/or her behavior.
Scholars disagree about which of the above views Aristotle endorsed, but the importance of distinguishing between them grew as philosophers began to focus on a newly conceived threat to moral responsibility. While Aristotle argued against a version of fatalism (On Interpretation, ch. 9), he may not have recognized the difference between it and the related possible threat of causal determinism (contra Sorabji). Causal determinism is the view that everything that happens or exists is caused by sufficient antecedent conditions, making it impossible for anything to happen or be other than it does or is. One variety of causal determinism, scientific determinism, identifies the relevant antecedent conditions as a combination of prior states of the universe and the laws of nature. Another, theological determinism, identifies those conditions as being the nature and will of God. It seems likely that theological determinism evolved out of the shift, both in Greek religion and in Ancient Mesopotamian religions, from polytheism to belief in one sovereign God, or at least one god who reigned over all others. The doctrine of scientific determinism can be traced back as far as the Presocratic Atomists (5th cent. BCE), but the difference between it and the earlier fatalistic view seems not to be clearly recognized until the development of Stoic philosophy (3rd. cent. BCE). Though fatalism, like causal determinism, might seem to threaten moral responsibility by threatening an agent's control, the two differ on the significance of human deliberation, choice, and action. If fatalism is true, then human deliberation, choice, and action are completely otiose, for what is fated will transpire no matter what one chooses to do. According to causal determinism, however, one's deliberations, choices, and actions will often be necessary links in the causal chain that brings something about. In other words, even though our deliberations, choices, and actions are themselves determined like everything else, it is still the case, according to causal determinism, that the occurrence or existence of yet other things depends upon our deliberating, choosing and acting in a certain way (Irwin 1999: 243–249; Meyer 1998: 225-227; and Pereboom 1997: ch. 2).
Since the Stoics, the thesis of causal determinism and its ramifications, if true, have taken center stage in theorizing about moral responsibility. During the Medieval period, especially in the work of Augustine (354–430) and Aquinas (1225-1274), reflection on freedom and responsibility was often generated by questions concerning versions of theological determinism, including most prominently: a) Does God's sovereignty entail that God is responsible for evil?; and b) Does God's foreknowledge entail that we are not free and morally responsible since it would seem that we cannot do anything other than what God foreknows we will do? During the Modern period, there was renewed interest in scientific determinism—a change attributable to the development of increasingly sophisticated mechanistic models of the universe culminating in the success of Newtonian physics. The possibility of giving a comprehensive explanation of every aspect of the universe—including human action—in terms of physical causes now seemed much more plausible. Many thought that persons could not be free and morally responsible if such an explanation of human action were possible. Others argued that freedom and responsibility would not be threatened should scientific determinism be true. In keeping with this focus on the ramifications of causal determinism for moral responsibility, thinkers may be classified as being one of two types: 1) an incompatibilist about causal determinism and moral responsibility—one who maintains that if causal determinism is true, then there is nothing for which one can be morally responsible; or 2) a compatibilist—one who holds that a person can be morally responsible for some things, even if both who she is and what she does is causally determined. In Ancient Greece, these positions were exemplified in the thought of Epicurus (341–270 BCE) and the Stoics, respectively.
Above, an ambiguity in Aristotle's conception of moral responsibility was highlighted—that it was not clear whether he endorsed a merit-based vs. a consequentialist conception of moral responsibility. The history of reflection on moral responsibility demonstrates that how one interprets the concept of moral responsibility strongly influences one's overall account of moral responsibility. For example, those who accept the merit-based conception of moral responsibility have tended to be incompatibilists. That is, most have thought that if an agent were to genuinely merit praise or blame for something, then he would need to exercise a special form of control over that thing (e.g., the ability at the time of action to both perform or not perform the action) that is incompatible with one's being causally determined. In addition to Epicurus, we can cite early Augustine, Thomas Reid (1710–1796), and Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) as historical examples here. Those accepting the consequentialist conception of moral responsibility, on the other hand, have traditionally contended that determinism poses no threat to moral responsibility since praising and blaming could still be an effective means of influencing another's behavior, even in a deterministic world. Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679), David Hume (1711–1776), and John Stuart Mill (1806–1873) are, along with the Stoics, representatives of this view. This general trend of linking the consequentialist conception of moral responsibility with compatibilism about causal determinism and moral responsibility and the merit-based conception with incompatibilism continued to persist through the first half of the twentieth century.
The issue of how best to understand the concept of moral responsibility is important, for it can strongly influence one's view of what, if any, philosophical problems might be associated with the notion, and further, if there are problems, what might count as a solution. As discussed above, philosophical reflection on moral responsibility has historically relied upon one of two broad interpretations of the concept: 1) the merit-based view, according to which praise or blame would be an appropriate reaction toward the candidate if and only if she merits—in the sense of ‘deserves’—such a reaction; or 2) the consequentialist view, according to which praise or blame would be appropriate if and only if a reaction of this sort would likely lead to a desired change in the agent and/or her behavior. Though versions of the consequentialist view have continued to garner support (Smart; Frankena 1963: ch. 4; Schlick 1966; Brandt 1992; Dennett 1984: ch. 7; and Kupperman 1991: ch. 3), work in the last 50 years on the concept of moral responsibility has increasingly focused on: a) offering alternative versions of the merit-based view; and b) questioning the assumption that there is a single unified concept of moral responsibility.
Increased attention focusing on the stance of regarding and holding persons morally responsible has generated much of the recent work on the concept of moral responsibility. All theorists have recognized features of this practice—inner attitudes and emotions, their outward expression in censure or praise, and the imposition of corresponding sanctions or rewards. However, most understood the inner attitudes and emotions involved to rest on a more fundamental theoretical judgment about the agent's being responsible. In other words, it was typically assumed that blame and praise depended upon a judgment, or belief (pre-reflective in most cases), that the agent in question had satisfied the objective conditions on being responsible. These judgments were presumed to be independent of the inner attitudinal/emotive states involved in holding responsible in the sense that reaching such judgments and evaluating them required no essential reference to the attitudes and emotions of the one making the judgment. For the holder of the consequentialist view, this is a judgment that the agent exercised a form of control that could be influenced through outward expressions of praise and blame in order to curb or promote certain behaviors. For those holding the merit view, it is a judgment that the agent has exercised the requisite form of metaphysical control, e.g., that she could have done otherwise at the time of action (Watson 1987: 258).
If holding responsible is best understood as resting on an independent judgment about being responsible, then it is legitimate to inquire whether such underlying judgments and their associated outward expressions can be justified, as a whole, in the face of our best current understanding of the world, e.g., in the face of evidence that our world is possibly deterministic. According to incompatibilists, a judgment that someone is morally responsible could never be true if the world were deterministic; thus praising and blaming in the merit-based sense would be beside the point. Compatibilists, on the other hand, contend that the truth of determinism would not undermine the relevant underlying judgments concerning the efficacy of praising and blaming practices, thereby leaving the rationale of such practices intact.
In his landmark essay, ‘Freedom and Resentment,’ P. F. Strawson (1962) sets out to adjudicate the dispute between those compatibilists who hold a consequentialist view of responsibility and those incompatibilists who hold the merit-based view. Both are wrong, Strawson believes, because they distort the concept of moral responsibility by sharing the prevailing assumption sketched above — the assumption that holding persons responsible rests upon a theoretical judgment of their being responsible. According to Strawson, the attitudes expressed in holding persons morally responsible are varieties of a wide range of attitudes deriving from our participation in personal relationships, e.g., resentment, indignation, hurt feelings, anger, gratitude, reciprocal love, and forgiveness. The function of these attitudes is to express “…how much we actually mind, how much it matters to us, whether the actions of other people—and particularly some other people—reflect attitudes towards us of good will, affection, or esteem on the one hand or contempt, indifference, or malevolence on the other.” (p. 5, author's emphasis) These attitudes are thus participant reactive attitudes, because they are: a) natural attitudinal reactions to the perception of another's good will, ill will, or indifference (pp. 4–6), and b) expressed from the stance of one who is immersed in interpersonal relationships and who regards the candidate held responsible as a participant in such relationships as well (p. 10).
The reactive attitudes can be suspended or modified in at least two kinds of circumstances, corresponding to the two features just mentioned. In the first, one might conclude that, contrary to first appearances, the candidate did not violate the demand for a reasonable degree of good will. For example, a person's behavior may be excused when one determines that it was an accident, or one may determine that the behavior was justified, say, in the case of an emergency when some greater good is being pursued. In the second kind of circumstance, one may abandon the participant perspective in relation to the candidate. In these cases, one adopts the objective standpoint, one from which one ceases to regard the individual as capable of participating in genuine personal relations (either for some limited time or permanently). Instead, one regards the individual as psychologically/morally abnormal or undeveloped and thereby a candidate, not for the full range of reactive attitudes, but primarily for those objective attitudes associated with treatment or simply instrumental control. Such individuals lie, in some sense or to some varying extent, outside the boundaries of the moral community. For example, we may regard a very young child as initially exempt from the reactive attitudes (but increasingly less so in cases of normal development) or adopt the objective standpoint in relation to an individual we determine to be suffering from severe mental illness (P. F. Strawson 1962: 6–10; Bennett: 40; Watson 1987: 259–260; R. Jay Wallace: chs. 5-6).
The central criticism Strawson directs at both consequentialist and traditional merit views is that both have over-intellectualized the issue of moral responsibility—a criticism with which many subsequent thinkers have wrestled. The charge of over intellectualization stems from the traditional tendency to presume that the rationality of holding a person responsible depends upon a judgment that the person in question has satisfied some set of objective requirements on being responsible (conditions on efficacy or metaphysical freedom) and that these requirements themselves are justifiable. Strawson, by contrast, maintains that the reactive attitudes are a natural expression of an essential feature of our form of life, in particular, the interpersonal nature of our way of life. The practice, then, of holding responsible—embedded as it is in our way of life—“neither calls for nor permits, an external ‘rational’ justification” (p. 23). Though judgments about the appropriateness of particular responses may arise (i.e., answers to questions like: Was the candidate's behavior really an expression of ill will?; or Is the candidate involved a genuine participant in the moral sphere of human relations?), these judgments are based on principles internal to the practice. That is, their justification refers back to an account of the reactive attitudes and their role in personal relationships, not to some independent theoretical account of the conditions on being responsible.
Given the above, Strawson contends that it is pointless to ask whether the practice of holding responsible can be rationally justified if determinism is true. This is either because it is not psychologically possible to divest ourselves of these reactions and so continually inhabit the objective standpoint, or even if that were possible, because it is not clear that rationality could ever demand that we give up the reactive attitudes, given the loss in quality of life should we do so. In sum, Strawson attempts to turn the traditional debate on its head, for now judgments about being responsible are understood in relation to the role reactive attitudes play in the practice of holding responsible, rather than the other way around. Whereas judgments are true or false and thereby can generate the need for justification, the desire for good will and those attitudes generated by it possess no truth value themselves, thereby eliminating any need for an external justification (Magill 1887: 21; Double 1996b: 848).
Strawson's concept of moral responsibility yields a compatibilist account of being responsible but one that departs significantly from earlier such accounts in two respects. First, Strawson's is a compatibilist view by default only. That is, on Strawson's view, the problem of determinism and freedom/responsibility is not so much resolved by showing that the objective conditions on being responsible are consistent with one's being determined but rather dissolved by showing that the practice of holding people responsible relies on no such conditions and therefore needs no external justification in the face of determinism. Second, Strawson's is a merit-based form of compatibilism. That is, unlike most former consequentialist forms of compatibilism, it helps to explain why we feel that some agents deserve our censure or merit our praise. They do so because they have violated, met, or exceeded our demand for a reasonable degree of good will.
Most agree that Strawson's discussion of the reactive attitudes is a valuable contribution to our understanding of the practice of holding responsible, but many have taken issue with his contentions about the insular nature of that practice, namely that a) since propriety judgments about the reactive attitudes are strictly internal to the practice (i.e., being responsible is defined in relation to the practice of holding responsible), their justification cannot be considered from a standpoint outside that practice; and b) since the reactive attitudes are natural responses deriving from our psychological constitution, they cannot be dislodged by theoretical considerations. Responding to the first of these, some have argued that it does seem possible to critique existing practices of holding responsible from standpoints outside them. For example, one might judge that either one's own existing community practice or some other community's practice of holding responsible ought to be modified (Fischer and Ravizza 1993: 18; Ekstrom: 148–149). If such evaluations are legitimate, then, contrary to what Strawson suggested, it seems that an existing practice can be questioned from a standpoint external to it. In other words, being responsible cannot be explicated strictly in terms of an existing practice of holding responsible. This then, would suggest a possible role to be played by independent theoretical conditions on being responsible, conditions which could prove to be compatibilist or incompatibilist in nature.
Objecting to the second of Strawson's anti-theory contentions, some have argued that incompatibilist intuitions are embedded in the reactive attitudes themselves so that these attitudes cannot persist unless some justification can be given of them, or more weakly, that they cannot but be disturbed if something like determinism is true. Here, cases are often cited where negative reactive attitudes seem to be dispelled or mitigated upon learning that an agent's past includes severe deprivation and/or abuse. There is a strong pull to think that our reactive attitudes are altered in such cases because we perceive such a background to be deterministic. If this is the proper interpretation of the phenomenon, then it is evidence that theoretical considerations, like the truth of determinism, could in fact dislodge the reactive attitudes (Nagel: 125; Kane: 84–89; Galen Strawson 1986: 88; Honderich 1988: vol. 2, ch. 1; and replies by Watson 1987: 279–286 and 1996: 240; and McKenna 1998).
Versions of Strawson's view continue to be very ably defended, and shortly, more will be said about the significant way in which his work continues to shape contemporary discussion of the concept of responsibility. However, many have taken objections of the above sort to be decisive in undermining the most radical of Strawson's anti-theory claims. Incompatibilists, in particular, seem largely unpersuaded and so have continued to assume a more or less traditional merit-based conception of moral responsibility as the basis for their theorizing. A number of compatibilists also remain unconvinced that Strawson has successfully shown independent theoretical considerations to be irrelevant to ascriptions of responsibility. It is noteworthy that some of these have accorded the reactive attitudes a central role in their discussions of the concept of responsibility. The result has been new merit-based versions of compatibilism (see e.g., Fischer & Ravizza 1998).
It is likely that Strawson and others writing on moral responsibility have traditionally seen themselves as attempting to articulate an account of responsible agency that would map onto what was presumed to be a unitary and shared concept of moral responsibility. However, more recently a number of authors have suggested that at least some disagreements about the most plausible overall theory of responsibility might be based on a failure to distinguish between different aspects of the concept of responsibility, or perhaps several distinguishable but related concepts of responsibility.
Broadly speaking, a distinction has been drawn between responsibility understood as attributability and responsibility as accountability. The central idea in judging whether an agent is responsible in the sense of attributability, say for an action, is whether the action discloses something about the nature of the agent's self (Watson 1996: 228). Some hold additionally that a judgment of responsibility in this sense includes an assessment of the agent's self as measured against some standard (though not necessarily a moral standard)-i.e., that our interest is in what the action discloses about the agent's evaluative commitments (Watson 1996: 235; Bok: 123, nt. 1). Perhaps the clearest example of a conception of responsibility emphasizing attributability is the so-called “ledger view” of moral responsibility. According to such views, the practice of ascribing responsibility involves assigning a credit or debit to a metaphorical ledger associated with each agent (Feinberg: 30–1; Glover: 64; Zimmerman: 38–9; and discussion of such views in Watson 1986: 261–2; and Fischer and Ravizza 1998: 8–10, nt. 12). To regard an agent as praiseworthy or blameworthy in the attributability sense of responsibility is simply to believe that the credit or fault identified properly belongs to the agent.
To be responsible for an action in the sense of being accountable (or “appraisable” according to the terminology of some) presupposes responsibility in the sense of attributability. However, to judge that an agent is responsible in the further sense of being accountable entails that the behavior properly attributed to the agent is governed by an interpersonal normative standard of conduct that creates expectations between members of a shared community (whereas the standard invoked above may or may not be thought to generate interpersonal expectations). In this way, the concept of moral responsibility as accountability is an inherently social notion, and to hold someone responsible is to address a fellow member of the moral community (Stern; Watson 1987; McKenna). By emphasizing the way the reactive attitudes were tied to expectations of good will grounded in our interpersonal relationships, Strawson drew attention to this social aspect of responsibility. Recent attempts to further articulate how best to understand the relevant notion of holding responsible and its relation to being accountable reflect his on-going influence.
An agent is praiseworthy or blameworthy, in the sense of accountable, if one is warranted, or justified, in holding her responsible. On one popular view, holding someone responsible is interpreted as regarding him or her as an apt candidate for the reactive attitudes and possibly other forms of reward or censure based on what the agent has done (Zimmerman; R. J. Wallace: 75-77; Watson 1996: 235; Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 6–7). On another view, holding someone responsible is fundamentally a matter of making a moral judgment accompanied by an expectation that the agent who performed the act acknowledge the force of the judgment or provide an exonerating explanation of why she performed the action. To hold someone responsible is thus to be one to whom an explanation is owed. On this view, the reactive attitudes and associated practices are grounded in this more fundamental expectation (Oshana: 76–7; Scanlon 1998: 268–271). Since the reactive attitudes and associated practices may have consequences for the well-being of an agent (especially in the case of those blaming attitudes and practices involved in holding someone accountable for wrong-doing), they are justified only if it is fair that the agent be subject to those consequences (R.J. Wallace: 103–117; Watson 1996: 238–9). The fairness of being subject to those consequences has often,in turn, be interpreted as the source of the idea that praise and blame are justified only if they are merited in the sense of deserved (Zimmerman: ch. 5; Wallace: 106–7; Watson 1996: 238–9; Magill 1997: 42–53). 
The recognition and articulation of diversity within the concept (or amongst concepts) of moral responsibility has generated new reflection on the nature of and prospects for theories attempting to spell-out the conditions on being morally responsible. While some continue to believe that a plausible unified theory can be offered that captures the conceptual diversity sketched above, a number of others have concluded that at least some of the conditions for the applicability of our folk concept are in tension with one another (Nagel; G. Strawson 1986, 105-117, 307–317; Honderich 1988: vol. 2, ch. 1; Double 1996a: chs. 6–7; Bok: ch. 1; Smilansky: ch. 6); For example, some have argued that while a compatibilist sense of freedom is necessary for attributability, genuine accountability would require that agents be capable of exercising libertarian freedom. A rapidly expanding body of empirical data on folk intuitions about freedom and responsibility has added fuel to this debate (Nahmias et. al. 2005 and 2007; Vargas 2006; Nichols and Knobe; Nelkin; Roskies and Nichols; and Knobe and Doris).
If there are irreconcilable tensions within the concept of responsibility, then the conditions of its application cannot be jointly satisfied. Of course, there have always been those—e.g., hard determinists — who have concluded that the conditions on being morally responsible cannot be met and thus that no one is ever morally responsible. However, a noteworthy new trend amongst both contemporary hard determinists and others who conclude that the conditions for the applicability of our folk concept cannot be jointly satisfied has been the move to offer a revisionist conception of moral responsibility and its associated practices rather than to reject talk about being responsible outright (For this general trend, see Vargas 2004 and 2005). Revisionism about moral responsibility is a matter of degree. Some revisionists seek to salvage much if not most of what they take to be linked to the folk concept (Dennett 1984: 19; Honderich 1988: vol. 2, ch. 1; Scanlon 1998: 274–277; and Vargas 2004 and in Fischer et. al. 2007), while others offer more radical reconstructions of the concept and associated practices (Smart; Pereboom: 199–212; Smilansky: chps. 7–8; Kelly).
The future direction of reflection on moral responsibility is uncertain. On the one hand, there has been a resurgence of interest in metaphysical treatments of freedom and moral responsibility in recent years, a sign that many philosophers in this area have not been persuaded by Strawson's central critique of such treatments. On the other hand, discussion of the place and role of the reactive attitudes in human life continues to be a central theme in accounts of the concept of responsibility. What is clear is that the long-standing interest in understanding the concept of moral responsibility and its application shows no sign of abating.
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[Please contact the author with other suggestions.]