Notes to Newton's Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica

1. From the first paragraph of Halley's anonymous review of the Principia in the Transactions of the Royal Society, No. 186 (January, February, March 1687), p. 291.

2. Unless otherwise noted, all quotations from the Principia are from the Cohen-Whitman translation. Because other translations and the original texts are available, the location of the quotations within the Principia will always be indicated in the text, usually in terms of the Book and Proposition. Changes to the Cohen-Whitman translation will be acknowledged in notes. One change has been made to the translation of the quoted passage: “explication” has been used instead of “explanation,” in keeping with Newton's choice of explicationem instead of explanationem. Indeed, no form of explanare occurs anywhere in any of the three editions of the Principia.

3. Two changes have been made to the Cohen-Whitman translation of the last sentence, which in Latin reads, “Et satis est quod gravitas revera existat, & agat secundum leges a nobis expositas, & ad corporum caelestium & maris nostril motus omnes sufficiat.” First, the phrase “to explain,” no counterpart of which occurs in the Latin, has been dropped from the last clause and second, the three verbs existat, agat, and sufficiat have been translated “should exist,” should act,“ and ”should suffice,“ for all three are in the subjunctive in the Latin.

4. For details and background on all these approaches, see Curtis Wilson, ”Predictive Astronomy in the Century after Kepler“ in Taton and Wilson, 1989.

5. In the case of an ellipse, the length of the major axis is twice the mean distance from a focus.

6. The discovery was first announced in ”Letters on Sunspots“ of 1613 and forms the heart of the argument against the Ptolemaic system in the Third Day of his Dialogue Concerning the Two Chief World Systems.

7. The Epitome of Copernican Astronomy of Kepler, the Dialogue Concerning Two Chief World Systems of Galileo, and the Principia (and, posthumously Le Monde) of Descartes. Although Galileo does not expressly identify the Tychonic system as the third chief world system, all of the Fourth Day is directed against it.

8. The reasoning behind Newton's conclusion does not presuppose the law of gravity, for all Newton required was something established in the original ”De Motu“ tract, namely that the relative strengths of the centripetal accelerations (at equal distances) toward Saturn, Jupiter, the Earth, and the Sun vary as the invariant ratio between the squares of the periods and cubes of the mean distances of the bodies orbiting each. Textual evidence from the other scholium added to ”De Motu“ — the one on resistance — shows that Newton did not yet have the law of gravity, for he had not yet formulated the concept of mass. For details, see G. E. Smith, ”How Did Newton Discover Universal Gravity?“ in Beyond Hypothesis: Newton's Experimental Philosophy, The St. John's Review, vol. xlv, no. 2 (1999), pp. 32-63).

9. Kepler expresses concerns about whether the orbital elements of Jupiter, Saturn, and Mars are stable in the Preface to the Rudolphime Tables, Johannes Kepler Gesammelte Werke, vol. x, p. 44, lines 21-25.

10. See Isaac Newton's Papers and Letters on Natural Philosophy, ed. I. Bernard Cohen, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1978, p. 106, where Newton remarks, ”For if the possibility of hypotheses is to be the test of the truth and reality of things, I see not how certainty can be obtained in any science; since numerous hypotheses may be devised, which shall seem to overcome new difficulties.“

11. See N. Jardine, The Birth of History and Philosophy of Science: Kepler's A Defence of Tycho against Ursus with essays on its provenance and significance, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.

12. The ”Copernican scholium“ of the augmented version of ”De Motu first became public in Ball, 1893, p. 54f.

13. For details, Cohen,1971.

14. See G. E. Smith, “The Origins of Book 2 of Newton's Principia,” forthcoming.

15. Journal des Sçavants, vol. 16 (2 August 1688), pp. 237-8. Translation by Alexandre Koyré. For details on other reviews, see Cohen, 1971, Chapter VI.

16. The quotation, with the italics in the original, is from Bertoloni Meli's translation, p. 132. Bertoloni Meli shows in his book that, contrary to what Leibniz claimed when publishing his Tentamen, he had read at least significant parts of Newton's Principia.

17. The second half of Book 2 Section 7, as it appeared in the first edition, can be found in V, 775-784; for an English translation, see Buchwald and Cohen, 2001, 299-313.

18. The philosophical discussion of Newtonian space and time divides across three distinct eras. During most of the eighteenth century, before the extent to which Newton's theory of gravity succeeds in dealing with the actual orbital motions became clear, the burden of proof fell more or less equally on the supporters and critics of Newton. During the nineteenth century the burden of proof fell heavily on Newton's critics. During the twentieth century, following Einsteinian relativity, the discussion, much of it highly sophisticated, has centered on stating with precision the Newtonian assumptions that were in error, as illustrated by the classic philosophical discussion in Stein 1967. For an illuminating examination of the history of the discussion, as well as a very careful analysis of Newton's position, see DiSalle 2006. The position in the text derives from Stein and DiSalle.

19. Today we would be more inclined to say no quantity without unequivocal ordinality among its values, in the process distinguishing between ordinal, interval, and ratio scales. Although Newton was perfectly aware of the difference between interval and ratio scales, his insistence on the quantities entering physics involving definite proportions is clear throughout the Principia.

20. For more about these assumptions and their later rejection, see DiSalle 2006.

21. This analysis of Newton's second law is developed in detail in Bruce Pourciau's “Newton's Interpretation of Newton's Second Law,” Archive for History of Exact Sciences, 60, 2006, pp. 157-207.

22. The idea of using the tension in the string to measure the centrifugal endeavor of an object in uniform circular motion originated not with Huygens, but with Descartes in a too much ignored passage, D, 3, 59. Huygens and Newton were both familiar with this passage.

23. Newton had employed the third law in his lectures on algebra as one of two principles from which problems of impacting hard spheres could be solved. See Whiteside, The Mathematical Papers of Isaac Newton, vol. v, p. 149. The third law first became public, however, in his Principia.

24. Newton goes on to say, “By means of the first two laws and the first two corollaries Galileo found that the descent of heavy bodies is in the squared ratio of the time and that the motion of projectiles occurs in a parabola, as experiment confirms, except insofar as these motions are somewhat retarded by the resistance of the air.” In fact, Galileo does not employ the notion of force at all in his derivation of these two relationships, and contrary to legend however much Galileo may have anticipated the first law, he never showed the least sign of appreciating the implication that Descartes emphasized, that curvilinear motion requires something to deflect the body out of its motion in a straight line. In the second edition of the Principia Newton adds a passage indicating how the two Galilean relationships can be derived using the first two laws and first two corollaries. All the evidence indicates that Newton never read Galileo's Two New Sciences and knew of the results in it only through secondary sources, including Huygens's Horologium Oscillatorium. His claim about Galileo accordingly was more likely just presumptuous, and not dishonest.

25. The term “dynamics,” as we now use it, derives from Leibniz (in the 1690s) and not from Newton. The word does not occur in any of the three editions of the Principia.

26. For a reconstruction of Newton's efforts from his notes, see R. S. Westfall, “Newton and the Acceleration of Gravity,” Archive for History of Exact Sciences, 35, 2986, pp. 255-272.

27. For details of Huygens's efforts to measure surface gravity in 1659, see Joella Yoder, Unrolling Time: Christiaan Huygens and the Mathematization of Nature, Cambridge University Press, 1988, Chapters 3 and 4.

28. The center of oscillation problem that Huygens addressed and solved was to determine the length of the simple pendulum, with a single point-mass bob on a massless string, that would have the same period as a pendulum with multiple point-masses as bobs or with one or more rigid bodies as bobs. The problem became celebrated after Marin Mersenne noted that the answer is not the center of gravity of the distributed mass.

29. For details, see the historical introduction in the first section, “The Various Principles of Dynamics,” of Part II of Lagrange's Analytical Mechanics, tr. A. Boissonnade and V. N. Vagliente, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1997; or G. E. Smith, “The Vis Viva Dispute: A Controversy at the Dawn of Dynamics,” Physics Today, October 2006, pp. 31-36.

30. Strictly speaking, their logical form is “if… [then if…,then…]” where the initial antecedent involves the laws of motion or their corollaries.

31. The spiral is treated in Sections 2, 8, and 9 of Book 1.

32. Section 9 of Book 1 treats precessing orbits, with Propositions 43 and 44 providing the striking result about the relationship between precession and the inverse-cube and Proposition 45 developing this result further for the case of nearly circular orbits, that is, for orbits like those of all the then known planets and satellites.

33. Corollaries 2 and 3 of Proposition 91, which were added to the first edition of Book 1 in the summer of 1686, in proof.

34. In the Cohen and Whitman translation, the Latin dedi expositos is rendered, “given explanations;” because Newton used expositos rather than explanatos, the phrase is here translated “set forth,” which is less awkward than the literal “given settings forth” or “given narrations.”

35. Huygens's full solution for the central force in uniform circular motion can be found in his posthumously published “De Vi Centrifuga,” [OH, XV, 253-301]; the corresponding independently developed solution by Newton can be found in his “De Motu,” [M, 36-39] or [U, 273].

36. That is, on the period of the pendulum remaining the same as the arc length described by the bob increases or decreases.

37. Book 1, Proposition 4, Corollary 7, which was added in the second edition.

38. Johann Bernoulli, “Nouvelles Pensées sur le Systeme de M. Descartes, Et la maniere d'en déduire les Orbites & les Aphélies des Planètes,” in Opera omnia, Lausanne and Geneva, 1742, vol. III, pp. 133-173, p. 144. The translation is from René Dugas, Mechanics in the Seventeenth Century, tr. Freda Jacquot, Éditions du Griffon, 1958, p. 571.

39. In the first edition this General Scholium follows Section 7.

40. The methodological complications raised by Newton's approach to resistance forces in the second edition are discussed at length in Smith, 2005.

41. In classic use the term “hypothesis” marked propositions from which deductions were to be made. During the seventeenth century it came also to mark conjectured theoretical claims. The first edition of Book 3 begins with a list of nine hypotheses that were clearly intended to be propositions from which the deductions of the Book were to be made, and not theoretical conjectures. The shift to “Rules” and “Phenomena” in the second edition clarified the logical structure of the derivation of the law of universal gravity and removed any thought that this derivation gave the law an only hypothetical status. Newton did not entirely abandon the label “hypothesis” in the second and third editions. Section 9 of Book 2, as noted earlier, opens with a Hypothesis, and Proposition 11, asserting that the center of gravity of our planetary system is at rest, is immediately preceded by the Hypothesis, “The center of the system of the world is at rest.”

42. For a step-by-step analysis of Newton's deduction of universal gravity, see William Harper, “Newton's Argument for Universal Gravitation” in Cohen and Smith 2002.

43. See Pierre Duhem, The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory, Princeton University Press, 1991, pp. 190-195. Duhem makes the widely made mistake of saying that Newton deduced the inverse-square from the ellipse, but his point holds equally well for the premise Newton actually uses, that the orbits are stationary.

44. See for example, Clark Glymour, Theory and Evidence, Princeton University Press, 1980, pp. 203-226.

45. The only anachronism in this way of stating the conclusions is the term ‘field’ itself; that Newton certainly had the concept, though not the word, is clear from his Definitions 6-8, [P, 406-08].

46. Duhem, op. cit., p. 195.

47. The subjunctive is Newton's, but the emphasis is added.

48. From Newton's remark in the text for Proposition 8, a second requirement for taking the law to be exact is that there be some configuration that at least approximates the pertinent celestial bodies toward which the net centripetal forces of gravity are exactly inverse-square if these forces arise from forces directed toward each part of the body. The configuration cited is a sphere with spherically symmetric density. In the treatment of resistance forces in Section 7 of Book 2 Newton shows a similar preoccupation for identifying circumstances in which the net force is exact when composed from forces acting on the parts of the body.

49. In the first edition Newton gave no value for the perturbing action of the Sun in Proposition 3, instead only claiming that this action accounts for the 4/243 fraction. For more information on his use of twice the correct value and the historical reaction to it, see Section 8.16 of “A Guide to Newton's Principia” in the Cohen-Whitman translation of the Principia.

50. For details, see Stein 1990.

51. See Eric Schliesser and George E. Smith, “Huygens's 1688 Report to the Directors of the Dutch East India Company on the Measurement of Longitude at Sea and the Evidence it Offered Against Universal Gravity”, Archive for History of Exact Sciences, forthcoming.

52. Save for his failure to credit his rival Clairaut properly, Jean d'Alembert's long article on the figure of the Earth in the Encyclopédie of the 1750s provides a highly informative account of the history of this issue in relation to Newton's theory.

53. Newton's Theory of the Moon's Motion, published 1702 as part of David Gregory's Astronomiae Physicae & Geometricae Elementa, employed an epicycle-like device that Jeremiah Horrocks had devised for representing the precession of the lunar apogee and the inequality known as the “evection.” In this regard, it was not derived from the theory of gravity.

54. Computers now allow the orbital motions to be computed by means of numerical integration of the equations of motion.

55. As Halley observed, if the comet that now bears his name had appeared at regular intervals in the past, these intervals were not precisely 75 years long, but varied from roughly 73 to 77 years. Clairaut provided an explanation for this when he included the gravitational effects of Jupiter and Saturn in his successful calculation of the return of this comet in 1759. The question then arose, however, whether the nearly one-month discrepancy in Clairaut's calculation might not be evidence of some small resistance acting on the comet. Euler subsequently suggested that the unexplained secular motion of the Moon might also be from fluid resistance. So, as historically compelling as Newton's argument was against resisting fluid in space, it did not end all discussion.

56. Newton to Bentley, 25 February 1692/3, in [C, III, 254].

57. For a discussion of the methodology that instead takes the Scholium at the end of Section 11 as the starting point, see George E. Smith, “The Methodology of the Principia,” in Cohen and Smith 2002.

58. Huygens offered an exceptionally lucid statement of this method in the preface to his Treatise on Light of 1690, which was immediately followed within the same covers by his Discourse on the Cause of Gravity [HD] containing his response to Newton's Principia:

One finds in this subject a kind of demonstration which does not carry with it so high a degree of certainty as that employed in geometry; and which differs distinctly from the method employed by geometers in that they prove their propositions by well-established and incontrovertible principles, while here principles are tested by the inferences which are derivable from them. The nature of the subject permits of no other treatment. It is possible, however, in this way to establish a probability which is little short of certainty. This is the case when the consequences of the assumed principles are in perfect accord with the observed phenomena, and especially when these verifications are numerous; but above all when one employs the hypothesis to predict new phenomena and finds his expectations realized.

59. For details of how this accommodation came about, see Koffi Maglo, “The Reception of Newton's Gravitational Theory by Huygens, Varignon, and Maupertuis: How Normal Science may be Revolutionary,” Perspectives on Science vol. 11, 2003, pp. 135-169.

Copyright © 2007 by
George Smith <george.smith@tufts.edu>

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