Notes to Isaac Newton

1. Of the many biographies of Newton, two stand out: Westfall 1980 provides the most thorough intellectual biography, and Hall 1992 is meticulous in not overreaching what we truly know about him. Also helpful are Feingold 2004 and Iliffe 2007.

2. This treatise was published in English translations in 1736 and 1737, the latter under the title, “A Treatise of the Method of Fluxions and Infinite Series, With its Application to the Geometry of Curve Lines” (reprinted in [W, I, 27-137]; see also [M, III, 32-372] for a fully annotated version of the Latin text with translation).

3. This specific statement of the problem occurs in Hooke's last letter to Newton during this exchange, a letter of 17 January 1680 that itself followed an unanswered letter of 6 January. See [C, II, 313].

4. Reprinted in [N].

Copyright © 2007 by
George Smith <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to