A nonexistent object is something that does not exist. Some examples often cited are: Zeus, Pegasus, Sherlock Holmes, Vulcan, the perpetual motion machine, the golden mountain, the fountain of youth, the round square, etc. Some important philosophers have thought that the very concept of a nonexistent object is contradictory (Hume) or logically ill-formed (Kant, Frege), while others (Leibniz, Meinong, the Russell of Principles of Mathematics) have embraced it wholeheartedly.
One of the reasons why there are doubts about the concept of a nonexistent object is this: to be able to truly claim of an object that it doesn't exist, it seems that one has to presuppose that it exists, for doesn't a thing have to exist if we are to make a true claim about it? In the face of this puzzling situation, one has to be very careful when accepting or formulating the idea that there are nonexistent objects. It turns out that Kant's view that “exists” is not a “real” predicate and Frege's view, that “exists” is not a predicate of individuals (i.e., a predicate that yields a well-formed sentence if one puts a singular term in front of it), has to be abandoned if one is to accept the claim that there are nonexistent objects.
This entry is an examination of the many questions which arise in connection with the view that there are nonexistent objects. The following are particularly salient: What reasons are there (if any) for thinking that there are nonexistent objects? If there are nonexistent objects, then what kind of objects are they? How can they be characterized? Is it possible to provide a consistent theory of nonexistent objects? What is the explanatory force of a consistent theory of nonexistent objects (if such a thing is possible)?
- 1. The Concept of a Nonexistent Object
- 2. Historical Roots: Alexius Meinong and the Problem of Intentionality
- 3. Further Motivations for Belief in Nonexistent Objects
- 4. Problems with Belief in Nonexistent Objects
- 5. Consistent Meinongian Theories: From Nonexistence to Abstractness
- 6. Themes for Further Investigation
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
The very concept of a “nonexistent object” has an air of paradox about it, at least for those philosophers whose thinking is rooted in the Humean tradition. For Hume suggested that to think of an object is always and necessarily to think of an existent object, or to put it differently, that to think of an object and to think of the same object as existing are just one and the same thing. Immanuel Kant took up Hume's idea and claimed that existence is not a “real predicate”, a claim that is often interpreted as an anticipation of Gottlob Frege's famous doctrine that existence is not a predicate of individuals. (See Hume 2000, Book 1, Part 2, Sect. 6; Kant 2003, B 627; Frege 1966, pp. 37f.) Kant's motivation for rejecting the view that existence is a “real predicate” was the so-called “ontological proof” of God's existence, which says, roughly, that God's perfection entails God's existence, since a being that would have all of God's perfections except existence (i.e., omniscience, omnipotence, benevolence) would be less perfect than a being with the same perfections plus existence. For centuries, philosophers have felt that there is something wrong with this proof, but Kant was the first one who was able to point out a possible error: he argued that the mistake of the “ontological argument” lies in the treatment of existence as a “real predicate”.
If Hume is right, then the concept of an object includes the concept of existence, and the concept of a nonexistent object would be as self-contradictory as the concept of a round square. If existence is not a predicate of individuals, then one might suppose that neither is nonexistence. Therefore, if Frege is right, to say of an object that it is nonexistent is a kind of nonsense that arises from a violation of logical grammar.
Thus, in order to take the idea of nonexistent objects seriously, one has to give up views held by important philosophers about the nature of existence and adopt the view that existence is some kind of predicate of individuals. This view entails, among other things, that to say, for instance, that some white elephants exist is to say that some white elephants have the property of existence (or, to put it the other way around, that not all white elephants are nonexistent)—a consequence that might strike some as strange.
Furthermore, in order to assert “there are nonexistent objects” without implying “nonexistent objects exist”, one has to suppose that sentences of the form “There are Fs” mean something different from sentences of the form “Fs exist”. Some philosophers reject a distinction between “there is” and “exists” (see, for instance, Lewis 1990, Priest 2005, Quine 1953), some philosophers (e.g., Meinong 1960, Parsons 1980, Zalta 1988) think that there are good reasons for making this distinction. Some of the latter think that the distinction between “there is” and “exists” is rooted in ordinary language, but others deny this firmly (see for instance, Geach 1971). Obviously, although there might be a tendency among competent English speakers to use “there is” and “exists” in different contexts, ordinary language use is too wavering and non-uniform in this respect to be a stable ground for a philosophical theory. Of course, this does not rule out that there are theoretical reasons for a distinction between “there is” and “exists”, some of which are discussed below.
In those logics that stand in the Frege-Quine tradition, both “there is” and “exists” are expressed by means of the “existential quantifier” (“∃”), which is, consequently, interpreted as having “ontological import”. Thus, in these formal systems, there is no means to distinguish between “there is” and “exists”. However, it has been shown that the distinction between the two can be coherently regimented in various ways. In the systems of Terence Parsons, Edward N. Zalta, and Dale Jacquette, for instance, “there is an x such that … x…” is expressed by “∃x(…x…)”, whereas “there exists an x such that … x…” is expressed by “∃x(E!x & …x…)”, where “E!” is the existence predicate (Parsons 1980, Zalta 1983, Zalta 1988, Jacquette 1996). “Some things do not exist” could thus be rendered in logical notation as follows: “∃x(¬E!x)”; “Pegasus does not exist” as “¬E!p”; and so forth.
Graham Priest (2005) has proposed a theory of nonexistent objects that treats “there is” and “exists” as synonyms. He interprets quantification as utterly ontologically neutral. The quantifier should express neither “there is” nor “there exists”. Rather, quantifier expressions should be read “For some x, …x…”, where “For some x, …x…” does not imply that there is (or exists) an x such that …x…”.
Thus, Priest belongs to those philosophers who distinguish between “quantifier commitment” and “ontological commitment” (see Azzouni 2004), claiming that to “quantifier over” objects of a certain kind does not entail an ontological commitment to objects of this kind.
The various logics of nonexistent objects cannot be described and discussed here in detail. In the following two sections, the main motivations for believing in nonexistent objects are delineated.
Philosophical writings on nonexistent objects in the 20th and 21st century usually take as their starting point the so-called “theory of objects” of the Austrian philosopher Alexius Meinong (1853–1920). Therefore, it is appropriate to give an outline of the basic principles of and motives behind this theory.
Meinong was concerned about the problem of intentional states which are not directed at anything existent. The starting point of this problem is the so-called “principle of intentionality”, which says that mental phenomena are characterized by an “intentional directedness” towards an object. For instance, to love is always to love something, to imagine is always to imagine something, and so forth. In other words, every intentional act is “about” something. The problem is that sometimes people imagine, desire or fear something that does not exist. Some people fear the devil, although the devil doesn't exist. Many people hope for peace in the Middle East. But there is no peace in the Middle East. Ponce the Leon searched for the fountain of youth, even though it doesn't exist. It is easy to imagine a golden mountain, even if no such thing exists.
Cases like these seem to be clear counterexamples to the principle of intentionality. However, many philosophers found this principle too appealing to be given up completely. While some came to the conclusion that intentionality is not a real relation and therefore does not require the existence of an object (see, for instance, Brentano 1874, Searle 1983), Meinong offered another solution: there is indeed an object for every mental state whatsoever—if not an existent then at least a nonexistent one.
The problem of intentionality may still count as one of the most important motivations for thinking there are nonexistent objects. But there are other motivations as well.
Very briefly, the problem can be stated as follows: it seems that in order to deny the existence of a given individual one must assume the existence of that very individual. Thus, it seems that it is impossible to deny the existence of an individual without getting involved in a contradiction.
However, this conclusion seems hard to accept. In fact, there are lots of negative existence statements that we take not only to be sensible but also to be true (or at least not to be necessarily false). Consider, for instance,
Pegasus does not exist.
Yugoslavia does not exist anymore.
The perpetual motion machine does not exist and never will exist.
From the common sense point of view, negative singular existence statements are ubiquitous, comprehensible and sometimes true. So why is it that many philosophers are so puzzled about them? In particular, why think one has to assume the existence of an individual in order to deny its existence?
One traditional reason that has been given is based on the following assumptions:
- Only meaningful sentences can be true.
- In a meaningful sentence, every constituent of the sentence must be meaningful.
- If a singular term is meaningful, then it denotes something.
- If a singular term “b” denotes something, then “b does not exist” is false.
Let's see how these assumptions lead to a problem in light of the negative singular existence sentence “Pegasus does not exist”. If “Pegasus does not exist” is true, then it must be meaningful (by (1) above). If it is meaningful, all of its constituents must be meaningful, including the singular term “Pegasus” (by (2) above). If “Pegasus” is meaningful, then “Pegasus” denotes something (by (3) above). If “Pegasus” denotes something, then “Pegasus does not exist” is false (by (4) above). Thus, the assumption that “Pegasus does not exist” is true leads to the conclusion that this same sentence is false. So if the above premises are correct, it is impossible that “Pegasus does not exist” is true: Either “Pegasus” denotes something, in which case “Pegasus does not exist” is false; or “Pegasus” does not denote anything, in which case “Pegasus does not exist” is not even meaningful, let alone true.
There are several ways to resolve this problem, i.e., to account for meaningful and true negative singular existence sentences. One solution that became very prominent in the 20th century consists in the strategy of “analyzing away” the proper names and definite descriptions appearing in negative singular existential claims. This strategy consists of two steps:
- Ordinary proper names are interpreted as disguised definite descriptions. For instance, “Pegasus” is to be analyzed as short for “the flying horse from Greek mythology”. This is often called the description theory of proper names. Thus to say “Pegasus exists” is simply to say “the flying horse of Greek mythology exists”.
- Definite descriptions are to be analyzed along the lines of Bertrand Russell's theory of definite descriptions. On Russell's theory, to say “the flying horse of Greek mythology exists” is to say “there is exactly one x which is a flying horse of Greek mythology”.
Thus, combining these two steps, it follows that:
- To say “Pegasus doesn't exist” is to say “it is not the case that there is exactly one x which is a flying horse of Greek mythology”.
And if “Vulcan” is short for “the planet between Mercury and the sun which the 19th century astronomer Le Verrier searched for”, then:
- To say “Vulcan doesn't exist” is to say “it is not the case that there is exactly one x which is (a) such that x is a planet between Mercury and the sun, and (b) such that the 19th century astronomer Le Verrier searched for x”.
The point of these paraphrases is to show that the original sentences can be analyzed in terms of sentences in which the singular terms (“Pegasus”, “Vulcan”, “the flying horse of Greek mythology”, and “the planet between Mercury and the sun …”) have all disappeared. The paraphrases involve the general terms “flying horse from Greek mythology” and “planet between Mercury and the sun…”, along with the existential quantifier (“there is”) and a uniqueness condition (“exactly one”). (Let's ignore the fact that the singular terms “Mercury” and “Le Verrier” appear within the general terms; of course this means that our procedure isn't perfectly general, but for now, let's overlook this problem.) The problem of negative singular existentials is thereby resolved because sentences containing names which appear to be about nonexistent objects are paraphrased in terms of sentences involving general terms, quantifiers and uniqueness conditions. These latter sentences are meaningful independently of whether the general terms apply to anything.
However, both the description theory of proper names and Russell's theory of definite descriptions have been subject to serious criticisms. One might object that they fail to do full justice to our actual use of proper names and definite descriptions. Often we use proper names—successfully—without having any definite description in mind. Sometimes we don't need a definite description in order to refer to a particular object, because we individuate the respective object by means of perception or perceptual memories. Sometimes we simply do not know of a definite description that individuates the object we wish to refer to. Most of us know about Cicero just that he was a famous Roman orator; but the Romans had more than one famous orator. Nevertheless, we can use the name “Cicero” successfully to refer to a particular famous Roman orator. Even when we have something like the mental correlate of a definite description in mind when we use a proper name, usually we do not treat the description as a definition of the proper name (as the Russellian picture suggests). Suppose what I have in mind when I use the name “Socrates” corresponds to the description “the ancient Greek philosopher who died from drinking hemlock”. Suppose furthermore that the famous story about Socrates' death is actually a myth and that Socrates in fact died peacefully of old age. Do I then simply fail to refer to Socrates whenever I use the name “Socrates”? It does not seem so. When I eventually come to know that Socrates did not die from drinking hemlock, I will take this as a piece of information about Socrates, the person I referred to all the time by using the name “Socrates”.
As to the theory of definite descriptions, two kinds of problem arise. First, some philosophers simply deny that the paraphrases properly capture the meaning of sentences with definite descriptions, simply on the grounds that the meaning of a proper name like “Pegasus” is just less specific than the meaning of the definite description “the flying horse of Greek mythology”. Second, some philosophers have objected that the theory of definite descriptions sometimes yields the wrong results. Consider, for instance: “The ancient Greeks worshipped Zeus.” Prima facie, this sentence expresses a real relation between the ancient Greeks and Zeus; and it is surely a historical fact that the ancient Greeks worshipped Zeus. Yet on Russell's analysis, proper names like “Zeus” have to be replaced by definite descriptions, even in contexts other than existence claims. So “Zeus” would get replaced by a definite description like “the Greek god who lived on Mt. Olympus and who …”. Thus, the above true sentence would get analyzed in terms of the following false one: “There exists one and only one Greek god who lived on Mt. Olympus and who … and who was such that the ancient Greeks worshipped him.” There are numerous other true sentences like this, such as “Sherlock Holmes is more famous than any real detective”, etc., all of which appear to involve real relations between existent objects and nonexistent ones, but all of which would get analyzed as apparent falsehoods. Third, the use of the anaphoric pronoun “it” in “Teams of scientists have searched for the Loch Ness monster, but since it doesn't exist, no one will ever find it” seems problematic. The pronoun in both of its occurrences in this sentence seems to pick up its meaning/denotation from the definite description “the Loch Ness monster”—which is not easy to explain given Russell's theory of definite descriptions.
There might be ways to defend the theory of definite descriptions, but they will not be pursued here. In the context of this article, the relevant point is that Russell's theory does not provide a generally accepted solution to the problem of negative existence sentences.
The appeal to nonexistent objects provides a very simple solution to the problem of negative singular existentials. It consists in rejecting the premise
- If a singular term “b” denotes something, then “b does not exist” is false.
If there are nonexistent objects, then “b” may denote an object that does not exist.
The idea here is that whereas the quantifiers “there is” and “something” range over everything whatsoever, the objects that exist constitute only a portion of that domain. Therefore, it would be fallacious to derive from “‘b’ denotes something” that “‘b’ denotes something that exists”. According to this picture, “Pegasus does not exist” simply expresses that Pegasus is a nonexistent object. Premises 1–3 from above can be accepted without restriction. “Pegasus” denotes a nonexistent flying horse and thus is meaningful. Thus, the whole sentence “Pegasus does not exist” is meaningful as well. And since it is true that Pegasus does not belong to the class of existent objects, “Pegasus does not exist” is true. Of course, this solution can be generalized to all negative singular existence statements. The appeal to nonexistent objects thus supplies an elegant solution to the problem of negative singular existentials.
By “fictional discourse” we mean here and in what follows discourse about fictitious objects. Sometimes, the term “fictitious object” is used as synonymous with “nonexistent object”. Here, the term is used in a different sense, namely for objects (characters, things, events etc.) which occur in fictions, i.e., in myths or fairy tales, in fictional novels, movies, operas etc. Pegasus is a fictitious object in this sense (as are Sherlock Holmes and Hamlet) but Vulcan is not.
Consider, for instance, the sentence
(1) Pegasus is a flying horse.
Like many other sentences of fictional discourse, it appears to fulfill the following three conditions:
- It has the grammatical structure of a predication, i.e., the structure that is rendered in logical notation by “Fb” (where “F” stands for a predicate expression—here: “is a flying horse”—and “b” stands for a singular term—here: “Pegasus”).
- The singular term in subject position is a name for a fictitious object.
- It is commonly, and with good reason, taken to be true.
The problem of fictional discourse is closely connected to two logical principles. The first one is well known as “the principle of existential generalization”:
Existential Generalization (EG):
Fb → ∃x(Fx), i.e.,
If b is F, then there is something that is F.
The second principle is less prominent, rather seldom explicitly stated, but often tacitly assumed. We call it “the predication principle”:
Predication Principle (PP):
Fb → ∃x(x = b).
(PP) may be read in two ways:
(PPa) If b is F, then there is something that is identical with b.
(PPb) If b is F, then b exists.
Both principles are prima facie extremely plausible: If it is true of some individual that the predicate “F” applies to it, then the predicate “F” applies to something. If some predicate “F” applies to an individual, then the individual has to exist (for if it were otherwise, how could the predicate apply to it?).
Yet, when applied to fictional discourse, these two principles lead to consequences that seem to contradict hard empirical facts on the one hand and trivial truths about the ontological status of fictitious objects on the other. According to (EG), the sentence
(1) Pegasus is a flying horse.
(2) There are flying horses.
Yet, as we all know, there are no flying horses.
According to (PP),
(1) Pegasus is a flying horse.
(3) Pegasus exists.
But Pegasus is a fictitious object; and it seems that to call an object fictitious is just to say that it does not exist.
The problem is that obviously true sentences of fictional discourse seem to lead into outright contradictions. Of course, there are several ways to avoid the contradictions. One of them consists in rejecting the principles (EG) and (PP). By this move, one blocks the inference from “Pegasus is a flying horse” to “There are flying horses” and “Pegasus exists”. Indeed, some logicians, notably proponents of Free Logics, take this path. (See Hintikka 1959, Lambert 1983 and 1991, Leonard 1956.)
Another way to avoid the contradictions would be simply to reject the sentence “Pegasus is a flying horse” (and, in general, all alleged predications about fictitious objects) as false. This radical solution, however, fails to do justice to the widespread intuition that there is a difference in truth-value between “Pegasus is a flying horse” and, say, “Pegasus is a flying dog”.
A third attempt to resolve the problem is what may be called “the story-operator strategy”. According to the story-operator strategy, we have to interpret sentences of fictional discourse as incomplete. A complete rendition of, for instance,
(1) Pegasus is a flying horse.
would be as follows:
(1′) According to the story S (where “S” here and in what follows stands for the story of Greek mythology): Pegasus is a flying horse.
The expression “according to the story S” is the so-called “story operator”, which is a sentence operator (that is, it is the sentence as a whole that is in its scope, not just a part of the sentence, for instance the predicate). While the sentence within the scope of the story operator (here: “Pegasus is a flying horse”) may be false when taken in isolation, the complete sentence may be true. (This strategy is developed in detail in Künne 1990.)
Sentence (1′) does not imply that there are flying horses; neither does it imply that Pegasus exists. Thus, the contradictions are avoided. This looks like an elegant solution, at least as long as we confine ourselves to a particular kind of example. Unfortunately, however, it does not work equally well for all kinds of sentences of fictional discourse. Consider, for instance:
(4) Pegasus is a character from Greek mythology.
This sentence seems to be straightforwardly true; but if we put a story operator in front of it, we get a straightforward falsehood:
(4′) According to the story S: Pegasus is a character from Greek mythology.
It is not true that according to the relevant story, Pegasus is a character. Rather, according to this story, Pegasus is a living being of flesh and blood.
One may call sentences like “Pegasus is a flying horse” or “Hamlet hates his stepfather” “internal sentences of fictional discourse”, in distinction from external sentences of fictional discourse, like “Pegasus is a character from Greek mythology” or “Hamlet has fascinated many psychoanalysts”. The story operator strategy can be applied to internal sentences only and thus fails as a general solution to the problem of fictional discourse.
The claim that there are nonexistent objects provides a solution that can be applied uniformly both to internal and external sentences of fictional discourse. It allows us to admit that fictitious objects do not exist but at the same time to acknowledge that there are fictitious objects. According to this position, fictitious objects are just a species of nonexistent objects.
In order to see how this assumption is supposed to avoid the contradictions spelled out above, consider:
- Pegasus is a flying horse.
- There are flying horses. (1, EG)
- There are no flying horses.
According to the Meinongian solution, premise 3 has to be rejected as false. The Meinongian grants that flying horses do not exist, but this does not imply that there are no flying horses. According to the Meinongian, there are flying horses, and they belong to the class of nonexistent objects, and Pegasus is one of them. Premise 3 may be replaced by
3′. Flying horses do not exist.
But this does not contradict
2. There are flying horses.
Thus, the problem is solved.
- Pegasus is a flying horse.
- Pegasus exists. (1, PP)
- Pegasus is a fictitious object.
- Fictitious objects do not exist.
- Pegasus doesn't exist. (3, 4)
In this case, the Meinongian solution consists in rejecting premise 2. The Meinongian cannot accept 2, since Pegasus is supposed to be a nonexistent object.
What, then, about the predication principle? Does the Meinongian have to reject it?—Not necessarily. Remember that (PP) can be read in (at least) two ways:
(PPa) If b is F, then there is something that is identical with b.
(PPb) If b is F, then b exists.
Within the Meinongian framework, these two readings are not equivalent. According to the Meinongian, certainly there is something that is identical with Pegasus, although Pegasus does not exist. Thus, the Meinongian must reject the reading (PPb), but she can (and does) accept the reading (PPa).
Since the Meinongian accepts only the weaker version (PPa) of the predication principle, the inference from premise 1 (“Pegasus is a flying horse”) to “Pegasus exists” is blocked. All that can be derived from premise 1 is the weaker claim
2′. There is something that is identical with Pegasus.
But this is not in conflict with “Pegasus does not exist”. Thus, the problem is resolved.
The structure of the problem of discourse about the past and the future is very similar to the structure of the problem of fictional discourse. Consider the following sentences:
(1) Socrates was a philosopher.
(2) The first female pope will be black.
Given that the sentences (1) and (2) have the logical structure of predications, i.e., the structure “Fb”, and given that (PP) is valid, (1) implies that Socrates exists and (2) implies that the first female pope exists.
Indeed, the sentences (1) and (2) look like predications. Grammatically speaking, they consist of a subject term (“Socrates”, “the first female pope”) and a predicate term (“was a philosopher”, “will be black”.) But while it is certainly true now (in the third millennium C.E.) that Socrates was a philosopher, it is also certainly true now that Socrates does not exist anymore.
Second, let's assume, for the sake of argument, that indeed there will be a female pope (and exactly one first female pope) at some time in the far future and that she will be black and that she has not even been fathered yet. Given these assumptions, it is certainly true now that the first female pope does not yet exist.
Again, there are several attempts to resolve this problem. One possible strategy is to deny that sentences like (1) and (2) really have the logical structure of predications. One might suggest the following alternative interpretations, using “P” (read: “It has been the case”) and “F” (read: “It will be the case”) as “tense operators”:
(1′) P(Socrates is a philosopher).
(2′) F(The first female pope is black).
Note that the tense operators “P” and “F” are sentence operators, like the story operator from above. Just as the story operator blocks the inference to existence claims about fictitious objects, the tense operators block the inference from (1′) to
(3) Socrates exists.
and from (2′) to
(4) The first female pope exists. (For a tense operator strategy see Prior 1968.)
There is a lot to be said in favor of this logical interpretation of tenses. Yet, it leaves some problems unresolved. One of them is the problem of tensed plural quantifiers. Consider, for instance:
(5) There have been two kings named Charles.
The standard tense operator interpretation of (5) yields:
(5′) P(There are two kings named Charles).
However, while (5) is true, (5′) is false, since at no time in the past there have been two kings named Charles simultaneously. (See Lewis 2004.) Thus, the standard tense operator strategy seems to fail in cases like this one.
Another problem that the tense operator strategy leaves unresolved is the problem of relations between present and non-present objects. Given the principle that a real (two-place) relation can obtain only if both terms of the relation exist, and given that past and future objects do not (now) exist, relations between present and past or future objects are impossible. Yet it seems that there are plenty of relations between present and past (or future) objects. For instance, I stand in the relation of being one of six granddaughters of to my grandmother. Likewise, perhaps I stand in the relation of being the grandmother of to a future child.
Here is a Meinongian solution: Suppose objects pop in and out of existence but thereby do not gain or loose their being. According to this picture, “Socrates” now denotes the nonexistent Socrates and “the first female pope” now denotes the nonexistent first female pope. Accordingly, although we cannot allow for the inference from
(1) Socrates was a philosopher.
(2) The first female pope will be black.
(3) Socrates exists.
(4) The first female pope exists.
we can allow for the inference from (1) and (2) to
(3′) There is something that is identical with Socrates.
(4′) There is something that is identical with the first female pope.
This result does justice to two otherwise incompatible intuitions, namely (i) the intuition that neither Socrates nor the first female pope exist right now, and (ii) the intuition that it is nevertheless possible to refer to Socrates and to the first female pope (or, to put it another way: the intuition that the name “Socrates” and the description “the first female pope” are not empty).
Tensed plural quantifiers do not pose a problem for a Meinongian. Tensed quantifiers in general may be interpreted as restricted quantifiers that range over a particular subdomain of nonexistent objects: “there was” may be interpreted as a quantifier that ranges over the subdomain of past objects (i.e., objects that have existed but do not exist anymore); analogously, “there will be” may be interpreted as a quantifier that ranges over the subdomain of future objects (i.e., objects that will exist but do not exist yet).
Furthermore, from a Meinongian point of view, relations between existent and nonexistent objects are ubiquitous. Remember the Meinongian solution to the problem of intentionality: People fear, admire, dream of, hope for or imagine nonexistent objects. Thus, relations between present and non-present objects do not pose a particular problem for a Meinongian.
(1) The round square is round and a square.
seem to be logically true (at least according to the intuitions of some logicians—see Lambert 1983). Furthermore, they seem to have the logical structure of predications. According to (PP) and (EG), (1) implies
(2) There is something that is identical with the round square.
(3) There is something that is both round and a square.
If “there is” means the same as “exist”, these are, of course, unacceptable consequences.
There are two obvious ways out: (i) One could simply reject (1) as false (or truth-valueless). (ii) One could try to find an adequate paraphrase for (1) which accounts for the intuition that (1) is “in some sense” true. Such a paraphrase might be
(1′) If there were such a thing as the round square, it would be round and a square.
But according to the Meinongian picture, (2) and (3) are acceptable consequences, since they do not entail the existence of something that is both round and square. Something that is both round and square is an impossible object, according to Meinong, which means that it cannot exist, but this does not entail that there is no such thing. Therefore, the Meinongian can accept (1) as true, without resorting to any kind of paraphrase.
We have seen that there are alternative solutions for every single one of the abovementioned problems. But, for all we know, the assertion that there are nonexistent objects is the only way to resolve all these diverse problems in a uniform way.
The foregoing considerations suggested that the claim that there are nonexistent objects has considerable explanatory force. Why, then, is this claim not generally accepted but, rather to the contrary, so controversial? Is the reason just, as Meinong has put it, “a prejudice in favor of the actual”? — Although ontological prejudices may play a role, there are also some good reasons for reservations (to put it very carefully).
Even in Meinong's own writings, there are (roughly) two versions of the theory, the original one and a later, revised one. In what follows, we will refer to the original Meinongian object theory by means of the abbreviation “MOTo”.
Perhaps the most basic principle of MOTo is the so-called “principle of independence”, which says, literally: So-being is independent from being (see Meinong 1959). Ignoring, for the sake of simplicity, Meinong's particular use of the term “being”, we can paraphrase this principle as: So-being is independent from existence.
The “so-being” of an object is the totality of the object's properties apart from the object's existence or non-existence. The principle of independence says, thus, that an object may have any properties whatsoever, independently of whether the object exists or not. For instance, the (nonexistent) golden mountain literally is golden and a mountain; the round square literally is round and a square.
To every single property and to every set of properties, there is a corresponding object, either an existent or a nonexistent one. Thus, there is, for instance, an object that has the property of being round as its sole property; one might call it “the object round”, or simply “round”. There is also an object that has the property of being blue as its sole property (the object blue, or blue, for short). Furthermore, there is an object that has the property of being round and the property of being blue, and no other properties (the object round and blue). And so forth.
In the notation of classical logic extended with definite descriptions of the form ιxφ(x), the object that has the property of being blue as its sole property may be represented by “ιx∀F(Fx ≡ F = B)” (where “B” stands for “is blue”), the object that has the property of being blue and the property of being round as its sole properties by “ιx∀F(Fx ≡ F = B ∨ F = R)” (where “R” stands for “is round”), and so forth.
The object blue is not identical with the property of being blue; neither is it identical with the set that contains the property of being blue as its sole member. Neither is the object round and blue identical with the set of the property of being blue and the property of being round. The property of being blue is not itself blue, the property of being round is not itself round. Analogous considerations hold for sets of properties: Sets have neither colors nor shapes. But the object blue is blue, and the object round is round, and so forth.
One might wish to ask: Isn't it impossible that there exists an object that has the property of being blue as its sole property? Isn't it necessarily the case that every colored object also has some particular shape, some particular size, is made of some particular material, and so forth?
The Meinongian answer to this question is as follows: It is indeed impossible that such an object exists! Therefore, the object blue is not only nonexistent but even necessarily nonexistent. Of course, the same holds for the object round, the object red and round, and infinitely many other objects as well. Every existing object has infinitely many properties. Every existing object is a completely determined (or, in short: a complete) object. Objects like blue and round and blue are incompletely determined (or, in short: incomplete) objects.
Incomplete objects are necessarily nonexistent. They are, in this sense, impossible objects (even though their properties may not be contradictory). It should be noted, however, that not every complete object exists. Consider, for instance, the object that looks exactly like me except that it has green eyes instead of blue ones. Let's assume that this object (my nonexistent green-eyed counterpart) has all the properties that I have except for those that are entailed by the difference in eye color, given the actual laws of nature. My nonexistent green-eyed counterpart is completely determined and nevertheless does not exist. But, in contrast to blue, this counterpart could exist, i.e., it is a possible nonexistent object.
Unfortunately, however, MOTo has a number of paradoxical consequences. Bertrand Russell, Meinong's most famous critic, put forward two objections against MOTo. The first objection goes as follows: According to MOTo, there is an object that is both round and square, but such an object is “apt to infringe the law of contradiction”, since it would be both round and not round (Russell 1973c, 107).
Meinong perhaps could have replied to this objection that the object called “the round square” has the properties of being round and being square, but not the property of being not round, and thus the round square does not infringe the law of contradiction (but only the geometrical law that everything that is square is not round). Such a reply, however, would have been a bit beside the point, since it is clear that, according to the principles of MOTo, there is an object that is both round and not round (and evidently the object that Russell had in mind was of this sort). Indeed, Meinong did not deny that the round square infringes the law of contradiction. Instead, he replied to Russell's first objection that the law of contradiction holds for existent objects only. Objects that are both round and not round, however, are necessarily nonexistent.
Russell accepted this reply but forged a second objection that could not be dismissed in the same vein: Since it is a principle of MOTo that to every set of properties there is a corresponding object and since existence is treated as a property within MOTo, there must be an object that has exactly the following three properties: being golden, being a mountain, and being existent. If “G” stands for “is golden”, “M” stands for “is a mountain” and “E!” stands for “is existent”, this object is denoted by “ιx∀F(Fx ≡ F = G ∨ F = M ∨ F = E!)”. Thus, it follows from the principles of MOTo that there is an existent object that is golden and a mountain. But it is an empirical fact that no golden mountain exists. Given the (apparently trivial) assumption that “b is existent” is equivalent with “b exists”, this is a contradiction.
A further paradox seems to arise from the incompleteness of many Meinongian objects:
- The object blue (i.e., ιx∀F(Fx ≡ F = B), according to MOTo) has the property of being blue as its sole property. (Theorem of MOTo)
- The object blue has exactly one property. (1)
- The object blue has the property of having exactly one property. (2)
- The property of being blue is not identical with the property of having exactly one property.
- Thus, blue has (at least) two properties, namely the property of being blue and the property of having exactly one property. (1, 3, 4)
- Thus, blue has exactly one property and blue has (at least) two properties. (2, 5)
Furthermore, it seems that many Meinongian objects do not only infringe laws of logic and geometry, but also intuitively plausible principles like “If something is round, it occupies some region in space” and “If something is a mountain, it is accessible to the senses”. It seems that having a particular shape entails occupying a region in space and that being a mountain entails accessibility to the senses (in principle). According to MOTo, the round square is round and the golden mountain is a mountain, but obviously neither the round square nor the golden mountain occupies any region in space and neither of them is accessible to the senses.
Another strange consequence of MOTo is the following: If an object comes into existence, all that happens is that the object turns from a nonexistent into an existent one. Analogously, if an object goes out of existence, all that happens is that the object turns from an existent again into a nonexistent one. Apart from this, neither the object in question nor the world as a whole changes in any way. For instance, when I cease to exist, all that happens is that I will again be nonexistent (as it was from the beginning of time to 1966). In all other respects, I will stay just the same. Maybe such a thought is potentially comforting for those who love me, but it is surely at odds with our normal understanding of coming into existence and passing away.
Contemporary theories of nonexistent objects have amended MOTo in such a way as to avoid at least some of the abovementioned paradoxes. Most “Neo-Meinongians” (as one could call them) adopt one of the following three strategies in order to free Meinongian object theory from inconsistencies and counterintuitive consequences:
- The other worlds strategy makes use of the assumption of merely possible (and even impossible) worlds. (See Priest 2005.)
- The nuclear-extranuclear strategy consists in a distinction between two kinds of properties.
- The dual copula strategy consists in a distinction between two relations between properties and individuals.
The other worlds strategy has been proposed by Priest (2005). Priest calls his theory “noneism”. The term “noneism” has been coined by Richard Routley, and Priest does not only take over the name but also essential features of Routley's theory (among other things the assumption that basic principles of standard logics, like the principle of contradiction, do not hold without restriction—without, of course, accepting that everything is true).
Priest rejects both the nuclear-extranuclear strategy and the dual copula strategy. Instead, he assumes merely possible and even impossible worlds. All worlds (possible as well as impossible ones) share the same “domain of discourse”. But not all objects of the domain exist in all worlds. Thus, Pegasus does not exist in the actual world, but it exists in a variety of merely possible worlds (namely in those which are such as represented by the Greek mythology).
Priest claims that nonexistent objects literally have the properties through which they are “characterized”—but they have these properties not in the actual world but only in those worlds in which they exist.
With the paradox of contradiction, Priest deals as follows: The round square exists only in impossible worlds. In impossible worlds, however, the principle of contradiction does not hold. Therefore, the round square's being both round and not round does not infringe the laws of logic which hold in those worlds in which the round square exists.
In the actual world, however, the round square is neither round nor square, since roundness and squareness are “existence-entailing properties”, i.e., “b is round/square” entails “b exists”. Therefore, even if in the actual world (and in all other possible worlds) the law of contradiction holds, the round square does not infringe this law, since in these worlds the round square is neither round nor not round.
In the light of this theory, it is easy to explain why nobody has ever seen the round square or a golden mountain and why obviously the round square is not located in space: since the round square is neither round nor square in the actual world, there is no reason to assume that it occupies space or is accessible to the senses. Similar considerations hold for the golden mountain.
It is worth noting that Priest's postulation of existence-entailing properties is an implicit rejection of Meinong's principle of independence, which is one of the cornerstones of Meinongian object theory.
Priest rejects the nuclear-extranuclear distinction because he finds it “difficult to avoid the feeling that the class [of nuclear predicates] has been gerrymandered simply to avoid problems” (Priest 2005, 83).
But Priest's proposal has difficulties of its own. To mention some of them, Priest does not give a principled characterization of which properties are existence-entailing and which are not (which looks quite similar to the problem with the nuclear-extranuclear distinction which Priest points out in the above quotation). Second, it remains unclear which properties nonexistent objects have in the actual world (apart from logical properties like being self-identical and intentional properties like being thought of by Priest). Furthermore, Priest's noneism raises difficult questions about cross-world identity and the ontological status of non-actual worlds.
According to the nuclear-extranuclear strategy, there are two kinds of properties: nuclear and extranuclear ones. (Meinong 1972, §25) An object's nuclear properties are supposed to constitute the object's “nature”, while its extranuclear properties are supposed to be external to the object's nature. Nuclear properties are, for instance: being blue, being tall, kicking Socrates, having been kicked by Socrates, kicking somebody, being golden, being a mountain (Parsons 1980, 23).
Which properties are extranuclear? Terence Parsons distinguishes four categories of “extranuclear predicates” (i.e., predicates that stand for extranuclear properties): ontological (“exists”, “is mythical”, “is fictional”), modal (“is possible”, “is impossible”), intentional (“is thought about by Meinong”, “is worshipped by someone”), technical (“is complete”) (Parsons 1980, 23).
Nuclear properties are either constitutive or consecutive, in Meinong's terms (Meinong 1972, 176). An object's constitutive properties are those properties that are mentioned explicitly in a description that is used to pick out the object. Thus, the constitutive properties of the golden mountain are being golden and being a mountain. An object's consecutive properties are those properties that are somehow included or implied by the object's constitutive properties. Thus, among the consecutive properties of the golden mountain are probably the properties of being a material thing and of being extended.
According to MOTo the object called “the golden mountain” was ιx∀F(Fx ≡ F = G ∨ F = M), i.e., the object that has the property of being golden and the property of being a mountain (and no other properties). According to the revised version of object theory, the object called “the golden mountain” is the object that has all the nuclear properties that are implied by the nuclear property of being golden and the nuclear property of being a mountain, i.e., ιx∀Fn(Fnx ≡ Gn ⇒ Fn ∨ Mn ⇒ Fn).
How does the nuclear-extranuclear distinction help to avoid the paradoxes mentioned in the section above? — Consider again the paradox from incompleteness: According to MOTo, there is an object that has the property of being blue as its sole property (we've called it “the object blue”, for short), in logical notation: ιx∀F(Fx ≡ F = B). It seems to be true of the object blue, qua definition, that it has exactly one property. Yet, the property of having exactly one property is clearly distinct from the property of being blue. Thus, it seems that the object blue has at least two properties.
According to the revised version of object theory with the nuclear-extranuclear distinction (MOTne, for short), this paradox is avoided in the following way: The property of being blue is a nuclear (constitutive) property, the property of having exactly one property, however, is an extranuclear property. There aren't any objects that have exactly one property. There are only objects that have exactly one constitutive (nuclear) property. Objects that have only a limited number of constitutive properties may (and necessarily do) have additional extranuclear properties—like the property of having exactly n constitutive properties or the property of being incomplete. The object called “blue” is ιx∀Fn(Fnx ≡ Bn ⇒ Fn), i.e., the object that has the property of being blue as its sole constitutive property. This does not rule out that the object blue may have additional extranuclear properties. Thus, the paradox from incompleteness does not arise in MOTne.
To Russell's objection that the existent golden mountain infringes the law of contradiction (since it is both existent and nonexistent), advocates of MOTne may reply as follows: Existence is an extranuclear property, but only nuclear properties can be constitutive properties of an object. Therefore, according to MOTne, there simply is no such object as ιx∀F(Fx ≡ F = G ∨ F = M ∨ F = E!) (i.e., the existent golden mountain). (This route is taken by Dale Jacquette and Richard Routley. See Jacquette 1996, 81 and Routley 1980, 496.)
This solution, however, imposes quite a heavy restriction on the theory of objects. Probably this was the reason why Meinong himself did not even mention it as a possible solution. Instead, he introduced in addition to the nuclear-extranuclear distinction the doctrine of watered-down extranuclear properties: At least some extranuclear properties (existence, possibility) have nuclear counterparts, i.e., “watered-down” versions of extranuclear properties (Meinong 1972, §37).
If the extranuclear property of existence has a watered-down nuclear counterpart, the following answer to Russell's objection is available: “The existent golden mountain exists” is ambiguous. It may be read as “The existent golden mountain exemplifies extranuclear existence” (which is false) or it may be read as “The existent golden mountain exemplifies nuclear existence” (which is true). There is no contradiction between “The existent golden mountain exemplifies nuclear existence” and “The existent golden mountain does not exist” (in the proper, extranuclear sense).
Do other extranuclear properties (besides existence) also have nuclear counterparts? Do perhaps all extranuclear properties have nuclear counterparts? Meinong himself is not explicit about this point, but it seems very natural to extend the theory in this way. Terence Parsons has adopted this extension (Parsons 1980, 68), while Dale Jacquette rejects the doctrine of watered-down extranuclear properties altogether, even for existence and possibility (Jacquette 1996, 85–87).
There are several paradoxes for which MOTne does not supply a solution (even if it is supplemented with the doctrine of watered-down extranuclear properties). It still seems that the round square infringes the law of contradiction; one still may wonder why it is impossible to discover round squares and golden mountains; and one still may be baffled by the doctrine that nonexistent objects differ from existent ones only in that the former lack existence.
According to the dual copula strategy, there are two kinds of relations between properties and individuals. Different advocates of this strategy use different terminologies for it. Here are some of them:
The golden mountain is determined by the property of being golden and by the property of being a mountain. The golden mountain satisfies the property of being incompletely determined. (Mally 1912) The golden mountain is consociated with the property of being golden and the property of being a mountain. The golden mountain is consubstantiated with the property of being incompletely determined. (Castañeda 1972) The property of being golden and the property of being a mountain are ascribed to the golden mountain. The golden mountain has the property of being incompletely determined. (van Inwagen 1977) The golden mountain is constituted by the properties of being golden and being a mountain. The golden mountain exemplifies the property of being incompletely determined. (Rapaport 1978) The golden mountain encodes the property of being golden and the property of being a mountain. The golden mountain exemplifies the property of being incompletely determined. (Zalta 1983)
The various versions of the dual copula strategy share the assumption that the copula “is” is ambiguous. In what follows, we will use the exemplification-encoding terminology. In addition, we will borrow from Zalta the following notational convention: “Fb” stands for “b exemplifies the property of being F”. “bF” stands for “b encodes the property of being F”. Furthermore, we will use MOTdc as an abbreviation for “the revised version of Meinongian object theory which makes use of a dual copula distinction”.
According to MOTdc, the object called “the round square” is the object that encodes the property of being round and the property of being square (and all of the properties that are implied by these properties) and no other properties. Thus, according to MOTdc, the object called “the round square” is ιx∀F(xF ≡ R ⇒ F ∨ S ⇒ F).
Thus, according to MOTdc, the object called “the round square” encodes exactly two constitutive properties (being round and being square). However, over and above this, there are many (indeed infinitely many) properties that are exemplified by this object, for instance: the property of not being red, the property of not encoding the property of being red, the property of not being determined with respect to its side length, the property of having thought of by Bertrand Russell, the property of encoding exactly two constitutive properties, the property of being incompletely determined.
To mention another popular example, consider Pegasus: Among other things, Pegasus encodes the properties of being a horse, of having wings, of having been tamed by Bellerophon. But there are also infinitely many properties that Pegasus exemplifies, for instance: the property of not being determined with respect to the number of hairs in its tail, the property of being a character of Greek mythology, the property of being a fictitious object.
It must be emphasized that something that encodes the property of being a horse is not a horse (in the usual predicative sense of “is”). Analogously, something that encodes the properties of being round and square is neither round nor square. That is to say, something that encodes the property of being a horse does not belong to the class of horses, and something that encodes the properties of being round and square does neither belong to the class of round things nor to the class of square things. Rather, things that encode the properties of being a horse or being a square or being a Danish prince are abstract objects—abstract in the sense that they are neither mental nor spatio-temporal things. In general, everything which encodes at least one property is an abstract object in this sense.
Let's see how MOTdc avoids the alleged paradoxes mentioned in section 4. The first objection was that objects like the round square infringe the law of contradiction, since such objects would be both round and not round. According to MOTdc, however, the object called “the round square”—ιx∀F(xF ≡ R ⇒ F ∨ S ⇒ F)—is not round (i.e., does not exemplify the property of being round). Thus, no contradiction arises.
The second objection was that the existent golden mountain would infringe the law of contradiction, since, if there were such an object, it would be both existent and nonexistent. According to MOTdc, one could answer to this objection as follows: The object called “the existent golden mountain” is ιx∀F(xF ≡ G ⇒ F ∨ M ⇒ F ∨ E! ⇒ F). This object encodes the property of being existent, but it does not exemplify it. Since “b encodes F” does not imply “b exemplifies F”, there is no contradiction involved here.
According to MOTdc, the object blue is ιx∀F(xF ≡ B ⇒ F), i.e., the object that encodes exclusively the properties that are implied by being blue. Thus, the object blue exemplifies the property of encoding only the properties that are implied by being blue. It is not the case that the object blue has exactly one property and at the same time has at least two properties, at least not, if “has” is used in the same sense in both occurrences. In this way, the apparent contradiction disappears.
Furthermore, according to MOTdc, the object called “the round square”, i.e., ιx∀F(xF ≡ R ⇒ F ∨ S ⇒ F), does not occupy any region in space. More exactly, it does not exemplify the property of occupying some region in space (though, perhaps it encodes this property, if being round implies occupying some region in space).
Analogously, according to MOTdc, the object called “the golden mountain”, i.e., ιx∀F(xF ≡ G ⇒ F ∨ M ⇒ F), does not exemplify the property of being accessible to the senses (at best, it encodes this property). Therefore, there is nothing paradoxical in the fact that nobody has ever seen a golden mountain and that it is impossible to determine the location of the round square.
Finally, MOTdc does not have the counterintuitive consequence that the only difference between existent and nonexistent objects is that the latter lack the property of being existent, such that if an object goes out of existence, the vast majority of its properties (like being human, loving pancakes, being violent-tempered, and so forth) stay exactly the same. Consider again my nonexistent green-eyed counterpart. According to MOTdc, this object encodes being human, being female, being a philosopher, and so forth, but does not exemplify these properties; therefore, it does not belong to the class of female philosophers, not even to the class of humans or to the class of living beings. Thus, it is clear that my green-eyed counterpart's nonexistence is by far not the only difference between it and myself. In general, nonexistent objects are a particular kind of objects, according to MOTdc—very different from ordinary existent objects. In what follows, we'll call them “Meinongian objects”.
MOTdc is very remote from MOTo. Recall that according to MOTo, the object called “the golden mountain” is not an abstract object but something as concrete as every existent mountain in the world. Secondly, and related to this, the idea that some objects do not exist is one of the cornerstones of MOTo—but it is not an essential feature of MOTdc, i.e., it doesn't play an essential role within MOTdc. Within MOTdc, Meinongian objects are defined as a particular kind of abstract objects (namely abstract objects to which two kinds of predicates apply). Of course, one can decide to say that these objects are “nonexistent”; but nothing hinges upon this decision. According to MOTo, the only difference between Meinongian objects and normal objects consists in the alleged nonexistence of the former. However, in MOTdc, Meinongian objects are distinct from normal objects because only the former are abstract objects which encode properties. This suffices to distinguish Meinongian objects from normal objects. Thus, there is no need to assume that existence is a property of individuals and that there is a difference between “There are objects that are such-and-such” and “Objects that are such-and-such exist”.
If MOTdc is essentially different from MOTo, the question arises to what extent MOTdc can fulfill the tasks MOTo was supposed to fulfill. It seems that MOTdc cannot do everything MOTo was supposed to do. First, consider the problem of intentionality: if somebody fears the devil, does he fear an abstract object? — This seems to be psychologically impossible, for an abstract object cannot do any harm to anybody. Second, recall the problem of negative singular existence sentences: Astronomers claim that Vulcan does not exist. Do they thereby intend to deny the existence of an abstract object that only encodes being such-and-such a planet? — Probably not. They rather deny the existence of something that is a planet, i.e., a concrete material thing. Finally, consider the problem of discourse about the past and the future: When a teacher in a history of philosophy class talks about Socrates, does she then intend to talk about an abstract object that only encodes all of the properties that Socrates (the “real” one) once exemplified? — Presumably not. If there is an object which she is intentionally directed at, then it is probably the “real” Socrates, not its abstract counterpart.
It may be that proponents of MOTdc find ways to meet these objections such that their theories provide solutions for the problem of intentionality, the problem of singular existence sentences, and the problem of reference to past and future objects. But even if they don't, it is beyound doubt that Neo-Meinongian theories can be and indeed are fruitful in many ways. In particular, they provide the basis for a consistent realist ontology of fictitious objects. (For a variety of further applications see in particular the writings of Jacquette, Parsons, and Zalta.)
There are several ways in which Meinongian object theory can be developed further. Here are some of them:
1. Both MOTne and MOTdc could perhaps benefit from a clarification of their basic distinctions, namely the nuclear-extranuclear distinction and the dual copula distinction, respectively.
2. One feature of Meinong's mature object theory not mentioned so far is the “doctrine of implexion”. Implexion is a relation between incomplete and complete objects which seems to be very close to what is often called “instantiation”, i.e., a relation between universals and particulars. Incomplete objects are “implected” in complete ones. (See Meinong 1972, §29.) Meinong himself eventually came to interpret incomplete objects as universals (see Meinong 1972, 739f). Meinongian object theory may thus be interpreted as a sophisticated theory of universals, in particular as a theory of types (as opposed to properties), which might open further fields of application.
3. Throughout this entry, we have presupposed realism with respect to properties. However, it is doubtful whether a theory of Meinongian objects necessarily is ontologically committed to properties. An ontologically neutral quantifier and the use of non-objectual variables for predicates (not for names of predicates or properties) may help to avoid this commitment and thus could make Meinongian object theory much more parsimonious.
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This article is an outcome of the project “Philosophie et histoire de la logique. Les concepts formels” at the University of Geneva, in which I was involved from January to September 2004. I am indebted to the University of Geneva for financial support. I also wish to thank Gideon Rosen and Edward N. Zalta for constructive criticism and helpful advice.