Omnipotence

First published Tue May 21, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jan 12, 2012

Omnipotence is maximal power. Maximal greatness (or perfection) includes omnipotence. According to traditional Western theism, God is maximally great (or perfect), and therefore is omnipotent. Omnipotence seems puzzling, even paradoxical, to many philosophers. They wonder, for example, whether God can create a spherical cube, or make a stone so massive that he cannot move it. Is there a consistent analysis of omnipotence? What are the implications of such an analysis for the nature of God?


1. Introductory Preliminaries

Philosophical reflection upon the notion of omnipotence raises many puzzling questions about whether or not a consistent notion of omnipotence places limitations on the power of an omnipotent agent. Could an omnipotent agent create a stone so massive that that agent could not move it? Paradoxically, it appears that however this question is answered, an omnipotent agent turns out not to be all-powerful. Could such an agent have the power to create or overturn necessary truths of logic and mathematics? Could an agent of this kind bring about or alter the past? Is the notion of an omnipotent agent other than God an intelligible one? Could two omnipotent agents coexist? If there are states of affairs that an omnipotent agent is powerless to bring about, then how is the notion of omnipotence intelligibly to be defined? Moreover, an obstacle to traditional Western theism arises if it is impossible for God to be morally perfect and omnipotent. If an omnipotent God is powerless to do evil, then how can he be omnipotent? Rational theology seeks an analysis of the concept of omnipotence that resolves the puzzles and apparent paradoxes that surround this concept. If the notion of omnipotence were found to be unintelligible, or incompatible with moral perfection, then traditional Western theism would be false.

According to some philosophers, omnipotence should be understood in terms of the power to perform certain tasks, for instance, to kill oneself, to make 2+2=4, or to make oneself non-omniscient. However, in recent philosophical discussion, omnipotence has been analyzed in terms of the power to bring about certain possible states of affairs, understood as propositional entities which either obtain or fail to obtain (Rosenkrantz & Hoffman 1980; Flint & Freddoso 1983; and Wierenga 1989). Because we believe that it can yield an adequate analysis of omnipotence, we take this latter approach in what follows.

One sense of ‘omnipotence’ is, literally, that of having the power to bring about any state of affairs whatsoever, including necessary and impossible states of affairs. Descartes seems to have had such a notion (Meditations, Section 1). Yet, Aquinas and Maimonides held the view that this sense of ‘omnipotence’ is incoherent. Their view can be defended as follows. It is not possible for an agent to bring about an impossible state of affairs (e.g., that there is a shapeless cube), since if it were, it would be possible for an impossible state of affairs to obtain, which is a contradiction (see Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, Ia, 25, 3; and Maimonides, Guide for the Perplexed, Part I, Ch. 15). Nor is it possible for an agent to bring about a necessary state of affairs (e.g., that all cubes are shaped). It is possible for an agent, a, to bring about a necessary state of affairs, s, only if possibly, (1) a brings about s, and (2) if a had not acted, then s would have failed to obtain. Because a necessary state of affairs obtains whether or not anyone acts, (2) is false. As a consequence, it is impossible for an agent to bring about either a necessary or an impossible state of affairs. Many philosophers accept the principle that if an agent has the power to bring about a state of affairs, then this entails that, possibly, the agent brings about that state of affairs. If this principle is correct, then the foregoing absolute sense of ‘omnipotence’ is incoherent. Among contemporary philosophers, Earl Conee (1991) rejects this principle in order to defend the view that an omnipotent being would have the power to bring about any state of affairs whatsoever.

A second sense of ‘omnipotence’ is that of maximal power, meaning just that no being could exceed the overall power of an omnipotent being. It does not follow that a maximally powerful being can bring about any state of affairs, since, as observed above, bringing about some such states of affairs is impossible. Nor does it follow that a being with maximal power can bring about whatever any other agent can bring about. If a can bring about s, and b cannot, it does not follow that b is not overall more powerful than a, since it could be that b can bring about more states of affairs than a can, rather than the other way around. For the remainder of this entry the discussion concentrates on this comparative sense of ‘omnipotence’ as maximal power. Within the context of that discussion, it will be assumed that it is not possible for an agent to have the power to bring about any state of affairs whatsoever.

That a being is omnipotent just provided that its overall power is not possibly exceeded by any being may be adopted as the most general definition of omnipotence in this sense (Hoffman & Rosenkrantz 2010). Still, the availability of a more fine-grained and informative analysis, directly applicable to the full range of problem cases, is highly desirable. A number of prominent proposals for such a more fine-grained and informative analysis of omnipotence will be discussed later.

Power should be distinguished from ability. Power is ability plus opportunity: a being which has maximal ability but which is prevented by circumstances from exercising those abilities would not be omnipotent. Nothing could prevent an omnipotent agent from exercising its powers, if it were to endeavor to do so.

In the light of the foregoing, is it possible that there be a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents? Among contemporary philosophers of religion, Richard Swinburne (2008) holds that a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents is possible.

If a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents were even possible, then possibly, at a time, t, some omnipotent agent, x, while retaining its omnipotence, endeavors to move a feather, and at t, another omnipotent agent, y, while retaining its omnipotence, endeavors to keep that feather motionless. Intuitively, in this case, neither x nor y would affect the feather as to its motion or rest. Thus, in this case, at t, x would be powerless to move the feather, and at t, y would be powerless to keep the feather motionless! But it is absurd to suppose that an omnipotent agent could lack the power to move a feather or the power to keep it motionless. Therefore, neither x nor y is omnipotent. This line of reasoning appears to reduce the notion of a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents to absurdity. If such a reductio ad absurdum is sound, then a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents is impossible.

It might be replied that while neither of the omnipotent agents in question brings about what it endeavors to bring about, each of them can do so, since each of them has the ability to do so; they fail to bring about what they endeavor to bring about only because they lack the opportunity to do so. But earlier observations about the difference between power and ability and how each of them is related to omnipotence entail that omnipotence should be understood in terms of the ability plus opportunity sense of ‘can’. If those earlier observations are correct, then, since neither of the omnipotent agents under discussion can do [in the ability plus opportunity sense] what it endeavors to do, the possible reply under discussion does not succeed.

Or it might be replied that the possible pair(s) of coexistent omnipotent agents would necessarily avoid stalemates of the foregoing sort in virtue of the members of each pair resembling one another in some respect. This reply seems suspiciously ad hoc. It appears that the members of any possible pair of genetically identical human twins could be stalemated, e.g., in an arm-wrestling match. Why would not the same be true of a pair of similar coexistent omnipotent agents? It might be answered that each of the members of any possible pair of coexistent omnipotent agents would be necessarily omniscient and necessarily morally perfect. Moreover, if two omnipotent agents are necessarily omniscient, they won't disagree about any fact, and if they are necessarily morally perfect, they won't disagree about what is morally required or about whether they want so to act. It might then be inferred that any states of affairs that a pair of coexistent omnipotent agents would endeavor to bring about at a given time are compatible. In the literature, the controversial social trinitarianism of Richard Swinburne (2008), implies that the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit are a trio of coexistent omnipotent agents each of whom is necessarily omniscient and necessarily morally perfect.

However, one might object to the preceding reply on the grounds that if there is a pair of coexistent necessarily omniscient and necessarily morally perfect omnipotent agents, then there is a pair of incompatible contingent states of affairs each of which is morally optional for these agents, that is, neither morally prohibited nor morally required for them. The objection then proceeds as follows. It may be assumed that that the feather moves at t and that the feather remains motionless at t are a pair of states of affairs of the sort in question. Apparently, also, possibly, under such circumstances, the state of affairs that the omnipotent agents in question are stalemated in their endeavors to affect the feather as to its motion or rest at t is morally optional for those agents. Analogously, in an arm-wrestling match between A1 & A2, possibly, the states of affairs that A1 wins the match, that A2 wins the match, and that A1 & A2 are stalemated in the match are morally optional for A1 and A2. In the light of the foregoing observations, it appears that if it is possible that there are omnipotent agents of the sort in question, then possibly, one of them endeavors to make the feather move at t, while the other endeavors to keep it motionless at t, even given their hypothesized necessary areas of epistemic and moral agreement. The foregoing defense of the possibility of a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents is persuasive only if there is a cogent reply to this objection.

Would it strengthen such a defense to further require that the coexistent omnipotent agents are necessarily aesthetically perfect, and hence, won't disagree about what is aesthetically required or about whether they want so to act? It appears not. After all, there appear to be incompatible, contingent, aesthetically optional states of affairs, i.e., states of affairs which are neither aesthetically required nor aesthetically prohibited for some agent, and considerations parallel to those adduced above apply. Moreover, it is not clear that futile striving necessarily has negative aesthetic value, witness, e.g., Camus's The Myth of Sisyphus, and in any case, it can be argued plausibly that the equipoise of opposing forces possibly has positive aesthetic value, implying that opposed volitional activities of coexistent omnipotent beings would not necessarily be futile.

Further doubts about the possibility of a plurality of coexistent omnipotent beings are raised by considerations outlined below which seem to show that if some possible world is maximally good, in other words, is a best possible world, then no possible world is [uniquely] the best possible world, and likewise with respect to a possible world that is second best, third best, and so on.

Here it is assumed that if there is a best possible world, then there is at least one such possible world containing contingently existing individual substantial individuals. A parallel assumption is made about any possible world good enough to be actualized by an omnipotent, omniscient, morally perfect, aesthetically perfect being, e.g., by a maximally great divinity such as God. But, with respect to any possible world containing contingently existing substantial individuals, it appears that there is another possible world exactly resembling it but populated by different contingently existing substantial individuals. It further appears that the value of one of these worlds is equal to the value of another of these worlds. So, it appears that if one of these possible worlds is best, second best, third best, etc., then there is another possible world of the ordinal rank in question.

Moreover, different possible goods combined in different possible ways may constitute different, logically independent, possible total goods of the same value. The following simple example illustrates this point. Let it be assumed that the pleasure which would be produced by John's eating a mushroom pizza for dinner tonight and the pleasure that would be produced by John's eating a garlic pizza for dinner tonight are logically independent possible goods of the same value. All other things being equal, a possible world containing John's eating a mushroom pizza for dinner tonight and John's not eating a garlic pizza tonight, and a possible world containing John's eating a garlic pizza for dinner tonight and John's not eating a mushroom pizza for dinner tonight, constitute different possible goods of the same value. Generalizing from examples of this kind, it appears that if some possible world is best, second best, third best, and so on, then there are other possible worlds, not exactly resembling them, which are best, second best, third best, and so on.

So, for any possible pair of coexistent God-like omnipotent agents, it appears that one member of that pair could endeavor to actualize a different, equally good, world than the other member of that pair, even given their hypothesized necessary epistemic, moral, and aesthetic perfection. In the light of the reductio ad absurdum presented earlier, it appears to follow that such pairs are impossible.

Leibniz argued that there is a uniquely optimal possible world by appealing to the Principle of Sufficient Reason and the Identity of Indiscernibles, notoriously concluding that the actual world is the best of all possible worlds. Among contemporary philosophers, both the Principle of Sufficient Reason and the Identity of Indiscernibles are controversial.

Another possible defense of the possibility of a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents appeals to quantum mechanics. Quantum entanglement seems to be a unique physical phenomenon whereby concurrent activities of diverse contingently existing substantial individuals are directly coordinated in virtue of a necessary linkage of some sort between those substantial individuals. By drawing an analogy with this phenomenon, one might argue that there could be coexistent omnipotent agents who necessarily avoid stalemates. Quantum mechanics implies that there exist pairs of entangled micro-particles such that it is causally necessary that one member of the pair is spin up if and only if the other member of the pair is spin up, independently of the locations of those micro-particles. Albert Einstein skeptically described the theoretical phenomenon of entanglement as “spukhafte Fernwirkung,” that is, as “spooky action at a distance.” Nowadays, however, entanglement is an experimentally confirmed part of physics. Arguably, by analogy with entanglement, if a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents is possible, then there could be “entangled” omnipotent agents, A1 and A2, such that it is metaphysically necessary that A1 endeavors to bring about a certain state of affairs if and only if A2 endeavors to bring about the same state of affairs. But quantum mechanics further implies that there are entangled pairs of micro-particles such that it is causally necessary that one member of the pair is spin up if and only if the other member of the pair is spin down. The properties of being spin up and being spin down are contraries. Thus, if the analogy with quantum entanglement is taken seriously, then by parity of reasoning, one should conclude that if a plurality of necessarily cooperating coexistent omnipotent agents is possible, then possibly, there are “entangled” omnipotent agents, A1 and A2, such that it is metaphysically necessary that A1 endeavors to act in some way if and only if A2 endeavors to act in a contrary way. Given this conclusion, and in the light of the reductio ad absurdum of the possibility of a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents presented earlier, an argument in favor of such a possibility by analogy with quantum entanglement undermines itself, thereby reinforcing that reductio. So, one cannot credibly defend the metaphysical possibility of a plurality of coexistent omnipotent agents by drawing an analogy with the phenomenon of quantum entanglement.

Finally, could one credibly defend such a metaphysical possibility via the hypothesis that it is metaphysically possible for there to be a plurality of necessarily indiscernible omnipotent God-like beings (in the Leibnizian sense of indiscernible)? Because a plurality of necessarily indiscernible objects is of dubious intelligibility, such a defense would not be credible. Doubts about the intelligibility of such a plurality arise because of perplexities concerning the individuation and separation of any pair of necessarily indiscernible objects, and because positing the existence of a plurality of such objects is metaphysically extravagant and gratuitous. Indeed it seems that there is just as much reason to posit indefinitely many objects of the sort in question as there is to posit a pair of them, whereas the intelligibility of a necessarily self-indiscernible object is not in doubt. A representative example of a hypothetical plurality of necessarily indiscernible objects is a plurality of necessarily coincident geometrical points. In addition to the perplexities concerning the individuation and separation of any pair of such points, the assumption that it is metaphysically possible for there to be a plurality of necessarily coincident points is metaphysically frivolous. Post-Scholastic ridicule of the sort that was directed at the alleged ontological excesses of the Schoolmen, e.g., the query “How many angels may fit upon the point of a needle?”, is quite appropriately directed at metaphysical hypotheses of this sort. For these reasons, the intelligibility of a plurality of necessarily coincident geometrical points is suspect; the same is true of the intelligibility of a plurality of necessarily indiscernible omnipotent God-like beings.

Could an agent be accidentally omnipotent? At first glance, this appears possible, but there is the following argument for the opposite view. On the assumption that God exists, he has necessary existence, is essentially not temporally limited, and is essentially omnipotent. But there could not be two coexistent omnipotent agents. Thus, on the assumption that God exists, an accidentally omnipotent being is impossible.

This argument against the possibility of accidental omnipotence presupposes traditional Western theism. However, traditional Western theism is highly controversial, and neutrality about whether God exists has some advantages. If one is neutral about whether God exists, then omnipotence should not be assumed to be attributable only to the God of traditional Western theism or only to an essentially omnipotent being.

2. The Scope of Omnipotence

The intelligibility of the notion of omnipotence has been challenged by the so-called paradox or riddle of the stone. Can an omnipotent agent, Jane, bring it about that there is a stone of some mass, m, which Jane cannot move? If the answer is ‘yes’, then there is a state of affairs that Jane cannot bring about, namely, (S1) that a stone of mass m moves. On the other hand, if the answer is ‘no’, then there is another state of affairs that Jane cannot bring about, namely, (S2) that there is a stone of mass m which Jane cannot move. Thus, it seems that whether or not Jane can make the stone in question, there is some possible state of affairs that an omnipotent agent cannot bring about. And this appears to be paradoxical.

A first resolution of the paradox comes into play when Jane is an essentially omnipotent agent. In that case, the state of affairs of Jane's being non-omnipotent is impossible. Therefore, Jane cannot bring it about that she is not omnipotent. Since, necessarily, an omnipotent agent can move any stone, no matter how massive, (S2) is impossible. But, as we have seen, an omnipotent agent is not required to be able to bring about an impossible state of affairs.

If, on the other hand, Jane is an accidentally omnipotent agent, both (S1) and (S2) are possible, and it is possible for some omnipotent agent to bring it about that (S1) obtains at one time, and that (S2) obtains at a different time. Thus, there is a second solution to the paradox. In this case, Jane's being non-omnipotent is a possible state of affairs; thus, we may assume that it is possible for Jane to bring it about that she is non-omnipotent. So, Jane can create and move a stone, s, of mass, m, while omnipotent, and subsequently bring it about that she is not omnipotent and powerless to move s. As a consequence, Jane can bring about both (S1) and (S2), but only if they obtain at different times.

It might now be conjectured that omnipotence can be analyzed simply as the power to bring it about that any contingent state of affairs obtains. However, the following list of contingent states of affairs shows that there can be contingent states of affairs that an omnipotent agent is powerless to bring about, and hence that this simple analysis is inadequate:

  1. that a raindrop fell;
  2. that a raindrop falls at t (where t is a past time);
  3. that Parmenides lectures for the first time;
  4. that the Amazon River floods an odd number of times less than four;
  5. that a snowflake falls and no omnipotent agent ever exists; and
  6. that Plato freely decides to write a dialogue.

Note that (a) is a past state of affairs. Presumably, it is not possible for an efficient cause to occur later than its effect. However, an agent's bringing about a state of affairs is a kind of efficient causation. Therefore, it is not possible for an agent to bring about anything that is in the past. In other words, it is impossible for any agent to have power over what is past. Hence, no agent, not even an omnipotent one, can bring it about that (a) obtains. Likewise, despite the fact that (b) can be brought about prior to t, the impossibility of an agent's having power over what is past implies that after t even an omnipotent agent cannot bring it about that (b) obtains. In the case of (c), prior to Parmenides's first lecture, an omnipotent agent can bring about (c). But once Parmenides has lectured, even an omnipotent agent cannot bring it about that (c) obtains. As for (d), prior to the Amazon's third flooding, an omnipotent agent can bring it about that (d) obtains, while after the Amazon's third flooding, even an omnipotent agent cannot bring it about that (d) obtains. (e) introduces a special difficulty. Although it is obvious that (e) could not be brought about by an omnipotent agent, it can be argued plausibly that it is possible for a non-omnipotent agent to bring about (e) by causing a snowflake to fall, provided that no omnipotent agent ever exists.[1] But, as we argued earlier, a maximally powerful being need not have the power to bring about every state of affairs that any other being could. Lastly, while if the libertarian theory of free will is correct, an omnipotent agent (who is, of course, other than Plato) cannot bring about (f), apparently a non-omnipotent agent, namely, Plato, can bring it about that (f) obtains.

Consequently, a satisfactory analysis of omnipotence ought not to require that an omnipotent agent have the power to bring about (a), (b), (c), (d), (e), or (f), if it is assumed, arguendo, in the case of (f), that libertarianism is true.

Because of the wide disparity among contingent states of affairs, (a)-(f), one might despair of finding an analysis of omnipotence that both deals satisfactorily with all of these states of affairs and implies that an omnipotent being has, intuitively speaking, sufficient power. Is such pessimism warranted, or is omnipotence analyzable?

There are at least two approaches to analyzing omnipotence that hold out some hope of success. The first utilizes the notion of an unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs, and the second utilizes the notion of two worlds sharing their histories up to a time. Although these approaches to analyzing omnipotence differ in important ways, they are in broad agreement on the leading idea that maximal power has logical and temporal limitiations, including the limitation that an omnipotent agent cannot bring about, i.e., cause, another agent's free decision in the libertarian sense. In the following two sections, some recent instances of these approaches are set forth and compared.

3. Omnipotence and Unrestricted Repeatability

One attempt to analyze omnipotence in terms of unrestricted repeatability is the account of Hoffman and Rosenkrantz. According to their approach, by identifying certain features of (a)–(f), we can find a feature that none of them possesses, and in terms of which an analysis of omnipotence can be stated. To begin, unless it is possible for some agent to bring about a given state of affairs, an omnipotent agent ought not to be required to be able to bring about that state of affairs. But (a) is not possibly brought about by any agent.

Next, while (b) and (c) are possibly brought about by some agent, they are not repeatable: it is not possible for either one of them to obtain, subsequently fail to obtain, and then obtain again. Note that if, because (a) is not possibly brought about by someone, an omnipotent agent is not required to be able to bring about (a), then for the same reason, that agent is also not required to be able to bring about impossible or necessary states of affairs. Moreover, if, because (b) and (c) are not repeatable, an omnipotent agent is not required to bring about (b) or (c), then for the same reason, that agent is also not required to be able to bring about impossible or necessary states of affairs. These reasons for not requiring an omnipotent agent to have the power to bring about impossible or necessary states of affairs cohere with our earlier independent arguments for these restrictions.

Third, while (d) is repeatable, it is not unrestrictedly repeatable, that is, it cannot obtain, then fail to obtain, then obtain again, and so on, eternally.

Fourth, while (e) is unrestrictedly repeatable, it is a complex state of affairs, namely, a conjunctive state of affairs whose second conjunct is not repeatable. These examples suggest a hypothesis about repeatability and its relation to power, namely, that an omnipotent agent should not be required to have the power to bring about either a state of affairs that is not unrestrictedly repeatable, or a conjunctive state of affairs one of whose conjuncts is not unrestrictedly repeatable.

Lastly, although (f) is unrestrictedly repeatable, (f) is another type of complex state of affairs. In particular, it is identifiable with or analyzable as a conjunctive state of affairs. This state of affairs has three conjuncts, the second of which is not possibly brought about by anyone. The conjunctive state of affairs in question can be informally expressed as follows: Plato decides to write a dialogue; and there is no antecedent sufficient causal condition of Plato's deciding to write a dialogue; and there is no concurrent sufficient causal condition of Plato's deciding to write a dialogue. Because it is impossible for an agent to have power over what is past, the second conjunct of this state of affairs is not possibly brought about by anyone. Thus, an omnipotent agent ought not to be required to have the power to bring about a state of affairs that is identifiable with or analyzable as a conjunctive state of affairs one of whose conjuncts is not possibly brought about by anyone.

According to the account of Hoffman and Rosenkrantz, incoporating these ideas, omnipotence can be analyzed in terms of the following three definitions.

(D1) The period of time t is a sufficient interval for s =df s is a state of affairs such that: it is possible that s obtains at a time-period which has the duration of t.

For example, any period of time with a duration of 7 seconds is a sufficient interval for the state of affairs that a ball rolls for 7 seconds.

(D2) A state of affairs, s, is unrestrictedly repeatable =df s is possibly such that: ∀nt1t2t3…∃tn[(t1 < t2 < t3 < … < tn are periods of time which are sufficient intervals for s & s obtains at t1 & s doesn't obtain at t2 & s obtains at t3 & … & s obtains at tn) if and only if n is odd].[2]

For instance, the state of affairs that a ball rolls for 7 seconds is unrestrictedly repeatable.

(D3) x is omnipotent at t =dfs(if it is possible for some agent to bring about s then at t x has it within his power to bring about s).

In D3, x ranges over agents, and s over states of affairs that satisfy the following condition:

(C) (i) s is unrestrictedly repeatable, and of the form ‘in n minutes, p’, & (p is a complex state of affairs → (each of the parts of p is unrestrictedly repeatable & possibly brought about by someone)), or (ii) s is of the form ‘q forever after’, where q is a state of affairs which satisfies (i).[3]

In applying D3 to states of affairs like (e) and (f) it should be observed that a conjunct of a conjunctive state of affairs is a part of such a complex state of affairs.[4]

(C) (ii) refers to a state of affairs of the form ‘ q forever after ’, where q is a state of affairs satisfying (i). An example of a state of affairs of this kind is in two minutes, a ball rolls forever after. Two situations in which this state of affairs may obtain are, first, that the ball will start rolling in two minutes, and then continue to roll forever after, and second, that the ball will start rolling earlier than that, for instance, two minutes earlier, will be rolling in two minutes, and will continue to roll forever after.

As intended, D3 does not require an omnipotent agent to have the power to bring about either impossible or necessary states of affairs, or states of affairs such as (a)-(f). Furthermore, D3 does not unduly limit the power of an omnipotent agent, since an agent's bringing about a state of affairs can always be “cashed out” in terms of that agent's bringing about an unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs that it is possible for some agent to bring about. That is, necessarily, for any state of affairs, s, if an agent, a, brings about s, then either s is an unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs which it is possible for some agent to bring about, or else a brings about s by bringing about q, where q is an unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs which it is possible for some agent to bring about. For instance, an omnipotent agent can bring about the state of affairs, that in one hour, Parmenides lectures for the first time, by bringing about the state of affairs, that in one hour, Parmenides lectures, when this lecture is Parmenides's first. And although the former state of affairs is a nonrepeatable one that D3 does not require an omnipotent agent to be able to bring about, the latter state of affairs is an unrestrictedly repeatable state of affairs that D3 does require an omnipotent agent to be able to bring about.

4. Omnipotence and the Shared Histories Approach

The alternative approach to analyzing omnipotence in terms of two worlds sharing their histories up to a time is exemplified by the accounts of Flint and Freddoso, and Wierenga. As we shall see, although these two accounts are similar, they differ in certain significant respects.

Flint and Freddoso's account of what it is for an agent S at a time t to be omnipotent in a possible world W is formulated as follows.

S is omnipotent at t in W if and only if for any state of affairs p and world-type-for-S Ls such that p is not a member of Ls, if there is a world W* such that
  1. Ls is true in both W and W*, and
  2. W* shares the same history with W at t, and
  3. at t in W* someone actualizes p, then S has the power at t in W to actualize p (Flint & Freddoso 1983, p. 99).

The notion of a world-type-for-S Ls is to be understood in the following way. A world-type is “a set which is such that for any counterfactual of freedom, i.e., any proposition which can be expressed by a sentence of the form ‘If individual essence P were instantiated in circumstances C at time t and its instantiation were left free with respect to action A, the instantiation of P would freely do A’ — either that counterfactual or its negation is a member of the set” (Flint & Freddoso 1983, p. 96). It may also be stipulated “that for any two members of the set, the conjunction of those two members is a member of the set as well” (Flint & Freddoso 1983, pp. 96–97). Moreover, “a world-type is true just in case every proposition which is a member of it is true” (Flint & Freddoso 1983, p. 97). In addition, it is presupposed that “for any free agent x, there will be a set of all and only those true counterfactuals of freedom (or true negations of such counterfactuals) over whose truth-value x has no control” (Flint & Freddoso 1983, p. 97). A set of this kind is referred to as the world-type-for-x. Finally, ‘Lx’ designates the true-world-type-for-x.

The notion of actualization employed in this account of omnipotence calls for some explanation. If an agent, S, brings about a state of affairs, p, then S actualizes p. However, this account presupposes that an agent may [weakly] actualize another agent's making a free decision without bringing about or causing that decision. In particular, it is assumed that an agent may weakly actualize a decision that is free in the libertarian sense by bringing about the antecedent of a true “counterfactual of freedom.”

The basic idea of this account of omnipotence is that an agent is omnipotent just when he can actualize any state of affairs that it is possible for someone to actualize, except for certain “counterfactuals of freedom”, their consequents, and certain states of affairs that are “accidentally impossible” because of the past.

With respect to so-called counterfactuals of freedom, this account presupposes that some of them, for example,

If Jessica were offered the grant, then she would freely decide to accept it,

are true. Some philosophers hold the contrary view that a subjunctive conditional of this kind is necessarily false. Why do these philosophers reject the claim that some “counterfactuals of freedom” are true? Presumably, what distinguishes a subjunctive conditional from a corresponding material conditional is that only the former expresses a strong or necessary connection of some sort between the conditions specified by the antecedent and the consequent. Seemingly, the only kinds of strong or necessary connections available in this case are relations [broadly speaking] of either causation or entailment. Consequently, it appears that the subjunctive conditional under discussion is necessarily false, since if Jessica freely decides to accept the grant [in the relevant libertarian sense], then her making that decision is neither caused nor entailed by her being offered the grant. If the foregoing line of reasoning is correct, then the notion of a true “counterfactual of freedom” is incoherent. Since Flint and Freddoso's account of omnipotence presupposes that there are such “counterfactuals of freedom,” it can be argued that this account is incoherent.

Moreover, it can be argued that a state of affairs discussed earlier provides a counter-example to Flint and Freddoso's account of omnipotence, namely:

(e) A snowflake falls and no omnipotent agent ever exists.

A non-omnipotent agent can bring about or actualize (e) by bringing it about that a snowflake falls when in fact no omnipotent agent ever exists. But, it is clear that an omnipotent agent cannot bring about or actualize (e). For although an omnipotent agent can bring it about that a snowflake falls, surely, an omnipotent agent cannot bring it about that no omnipotent ever exists, nor would this conjunct of (e) obtain if there were an omnipotent agent. Moreover, we may assume that there are possible worlds, W and W*, such that W and W* share the same history up to a time t, no omnipotent agent ever exists in W*, and a contingently omnipotent agent, Oscar, is omnipotent for the first time at t in W. We may also assume that W* is a world in which at t some non-omnipotent agent actualizes (e). On the other hand, evidently, if in W, Oscar is omnipotent at t, then at t Oscar cannot actualize (e). Note that since the second conjunct of (e) is not unrestrictedly repeatable, this is consistent with Hoffman and Rosenkrantz's account of omnipotence; their account does not require an omnipotent agent to be able to bring about a conjunctive state of affairs one of whose conjuncts is not unrestrictedly repeatable. On the other hand, Flint and Freddoso's account of omnipotence implies that in W, at t Oscar has the power to actualize (e). This implication holds for the following reasons. First, (e) is not a member of a world-type-for-Oscar, inasmuch as (e) is neither a “counterfactual of freedom,” the negation of one, nor a conjunction of such “counterfactuals of freedom.” Second, we may assume that a world-type-for-Oscar is true in both W* and W, since the assumption that an agent is not omnipotent in one possible world, and is omnipotent for a time in another possible world, does not necessitate any difference in the world-type for that agent which is true in those worlds. Third, it is possible for someone at t to actualize (e) in a world, W*, that has the same history up to t as W.[5] Thus, arguably, Flint and Freddoso's account of omnipotence requires that in W an omnipotent agent, Oscar, at t has the power to actualize (e), when Oscar lacks this power. If this is right, then their account does not provide a logically necessary condition on omnipotence.[6]

A counter-example of this kind assumes that an analysis of omnipotence should allow for the possibility of an omnipotent agent other than God. Given this assumption, (e) seems to provide a counter-example to Flint and Freddoso's account of omnipotence, but not to the account of Hoffman and Rosenkrantz.

Let us now turn to Wierenga's account of omnipotence. The basic idea of Wierenga's account of omnipotence is that an agent is omnipotent if and only if he can do anything that it is possible for him to do, given the past. According to this account, we can analyze what it is for an agent, A, to be omnipotent at t in a world W in terms of what it is possible for A to strongly actualize at t in worlds having the same history as W up to t.

Wierenga's account of omnipotence, like Flint and Freddoso's, relies on the intuitive idea that two possible worlds can share the same past or history up to a certain point in time, and then diverge. According to Wierenga's account, two worlds of this kind share an initial segment, where S (W, t) is an initial segment of a possible world W up to a time t (Wierenga 1989, pp. 18–20). Unlike Flint and Freddoso's account, Wierenga's account is not stated in terms of what an agent can actualize, but rather in terms of the narrower notion of what an agent can strongly actualize. An agent, A, strongly actualizes just those states of affairs that A brings about directly or those actions that A does not do by doing something else (Wierenga 1989, pp. 20–23). Of course, an agent may actualize a state of affairs indirectly by strongly actualizing another state of affairs. Wierenga's account of omnipotence is formulated as follows.

A being x is omnipotent in a world W at a time t =df In W it is true both that (i) for every state of affairs A, if it is possible that both S (W, t) obtains and that x strongly actualizes A at t, then at t, x can strongly actualize A, and (ii) there is some state of affairs which x can strongly actualize at t. (Wierenga 1989, p. 25)

This account of omnipotence may be vulnerable to a counter-example of the following kind. Arguably, there could be an agent, x, such that: x has a wide range of powers, x is essentially limited to these powers, and x essentially lacks a power, P, which an omnipotent agent ought to possess. Of course, x would not be omnipotent. Yet, Wierenga's account of omnipotence paradoxically implies that x would be omnipotent. Hence, it can be argued that Wierenga's account does not provide a logically sufficient condition for omnipotence. The assumption that there could be a non-omnipotent agent that is essentially limited in its powers can be defended as follows. An omnipotent agent has the power to overrule (or supersede) any law of nature (a mere physical necessity). For example, God has the power to overrule the law of gravity by bringing it about that a mountain floats in midair without any physical cause. Yet, arguably, it is possible for there to be a non-omnipotent agent who essentially lacks the power to overrule any law of nature. For example, it can be argued that there could be a physical or material agent who is essentially subject to certain laws of nature. Surely, such an agent would lack the power to overrule any law of nature, and so would not be omnipotent.

A similar, though weaker, sort of objection concerns McEar, a hypothetical agent who essentially has the power to do only one thing, namely, scratch his ear. It may be objected that Wierenga's analysis of omnipotence falsely implies that McEar would be omnipotent. But it might be replied that an agent such as McEar is impossible. It can be cogently argued that, necessarily, if McEar has the power to scratch his ear, then he also has the power to move a part of his body to scratch his ear, for instance, his arm (Wierenga 1989, pp. 28–29). So, it appears that there could not be an agent that has the power to do only one thing. In reply to the stronger sort of objection discussed earlier, it may be suggested that, necessarily, for any power, if an agent lacks that power, then an omnipotent being could give that agent that power (Wierenga 1989, p. 29). The difficulty with such a reply is that there could be a non-omnipotent agent who essentially lacks the power to overrule any law of nature, and hence that not even an omnipotent agent could give this non-omnipotent agent that power.

5. Omnipotence and Divine Moral Perfection

It has been argued that the traditional God has incompatible attributes, namely, necessary existence, essential omnipotence, essential omniscience, and essential moral perfection (Pike 1969).[7] The contention has been that it is impossible for God to have the power to bring about evil, while non-omnipotent (and morally imperfect) beings may have this power. The precise form of such an argument varies depending on what precisely the relation between God and evil is assumed to be. However, generally speaking, it is argued that divine moral perfection and omnipotence are incompatible because divine omnipotence entails that God has the power to bring about evil, whereas divine moral perfection entails that God is powerless to bring about evil.

One can respond to arguments of this kind as follows. Assume that if God exists, then this is a best possible world.[8] In that case, if God exists, there could not be an evil unless it were necessary for some greater good, in which case any state of affairs containing evil incompatible with there being a maximally good world is impossible. But it be may be assumed that it is not possible for any agent to bring about an impossible state of affairs. Thus, if God exists, any moral evil, that is, any evil brought about by anyone, and any natural evil, or any evil which has an impersonal, natural cause, must be necessary for some greater good.

Suppose that God exists and that some other person, for example, Cain, brings it about that an evil, E, exists. There are two possibilities that need to be considered here. The first is that Cain's decisions and actions are causally determined, as are all occurrences in the created universe. Then, given our assumptions, since Cain's bringing it about that E exists is necessary for some good which more than compensates for E's existence, it is consistent with God's moral perfection that God [remotely] brings it about that Cain brings it about that E exists.

The second possibility is that Cain's decision to do evil is uncaused by anything other than Cain and free in the libertarian sense. In that case, God did not [remotely cause Cain freely to] bring it about that E exists, while [let us assume] Cain did freely bring it about that E exists. If so, then it must be the case that God's creating Cain and permitting Cain freely to do what he chooses to do [in the context of the entire creation] brings about more good than his not creating Cain and thus not permitting him freely to do what he chooses to do. It might be objected that if Cain can bring about a state of affairs that God cannot, namely, that E exists, then God is not omnipotent. But, as we have seen, an agent's being omnipotent does not require of that agent that it be able to bring about every state of affairs which any other agent can bring about. It does, of course, require that an omnipotent agent have more power than any other agent. And God, of course, would have more power than Cain, even though Cain could bring about something that God could not. For there are many more states of affairs that God could bring about and that Cain could not, than vice versa. At this point, it might further be objected that an omnipotent agent, one that was morally imperfect, who could bring it about that E exists, as well as all the other states of affairs that God could bring about, would be more powerful than God. But recall that if God exists, then he exists eternally in every possible world. Recall, too, that apparently there cannot be more than one omnipotent agent. Thus, it appears that if God exists, then an omnipotent agent who is morally imperfect is impossible. Thus, this second objection is based on an assumption that seems to be impossible, namely, that if God exists there could exist another omnipotent agent who is morally imperfect and who is therefore more powerful than God.

Of course, if God exists, then any evil state of affairs, s, which is incompatible with a maximally good world is impossible. And if s is impossible, then neither God nor any other agent has the power to bring it about that s obtains. God would lack the power to bring it about that s obtains because of his moral perfection, and any created agent would lack the power to bring it about that s obtains either because (i) God would not create an agent who had the power to bring it about that s obtains, or (ii) God would not permit any created agent to bring it about that s obtains. Thus, to the extent indicated, if God's attributes impose moral restrictions on the nature of the universe and on what he can bring about, then they impose parallel restrictions on what any other agents can bring about.

The foregoing line of reasoning implies that God's moral perfection and omnipotence are not incompatible.[9]

This argument about God and the possibility of evil has been disputed by theists such as Alvin Plantinga, who do not hold that God's existence implies the existence of a maximally good world, but do hold that God seeks to create as good a world as he can.[10] Theists such as Plantinga allow for there to be evil that is unnecessary for any greater good that outweighs it. An evil of this kind involves free decisions of non-divine agents, which God does not prevent, but which these other agents can prevent. Plantinga contends that God is not wrong to permit an evil of this kind, since God cannot bring about a vital good, the existence of free human agents, without there being such an evil. Alternatively, it might be argued that God does no wrong in this sort of case, because he does not know how to do better (knowledge of the future free actions of created agents being impossible). However, as an omnipotent God is not required to have power over the free decisions of non-divine agents, it follows that on these views, his omnipotence and moral perfection are compatible, roughly to the extent indicated earlier in our discussion of the view that God's existence implies a maximally good world. Of course, nothing that has been said here answers the question of how much, if any, evil is compatible with the existence of the traditional God. This question is central to the problem of evil for theism.

Bibliography

  • Aquinas, T., Summa Theologiae, New York: Benziger Brothers, 1948.
  • Conee, E., 1991, “The Possibility of Power Beyond Possibility,” Philosophical Perspectives, 5: 447–73.
  • Curley, E. M., 1984, “Descartes On the Creation of the Eternal Truths,” Philosophical Review, 93: 569–97.
  • Descartes, R., Meditations on First Philosophy, trans. John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch, in The Philosophical Writings of Descartes (Volume 2), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Flint, T. and Freddoso, A., 1983, “Maximal Power,” in The Existence and Nature of God, A. Freddoso (ed.), Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, pp. 81–113. [Preprint available online.]
  • Frankfurt, H., 1977, “Descartes on the Creation of the Eternal Truths,” Philosophical Review, 86: 36–57.
  • Hill, D. J., 2005, Divinity and Maximal Greatness, London: Routledge.
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  • Hoffman, J., and Rosenkrantz, G. S., 1988, “Omnipotence Redux,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 49: 283–301.
  • –––, 2002, The Divine Attributes, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • –––, 2010, “Omnipotence” in A Companion to Philosophy of Religion, 2nd. edition, C. Taliaferro, P. Draper, and P. L. Quinn (eds.), Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, pp. 243–50.
  • Kenny, A., 1979, The God of the Philosophers, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Maimonides, Guide for the Perplexed, trans. M. Friedlander, London: George Routledge and Sons, 1904.
  • Pike, N., 1969, “Omnipotence and God's Ability to Sin,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 6: 208–16.
  • Plantinga, A., 1974, God, Freedom, and Evil, New York: Harper and Row.
  • Rosenkrantz, G. S. and Hoffman, J., 1980, “The Omnipotence Paradox, Modality, and Time,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 18: 473–9.
  • –––, 1980, “What An Omnipotent Agent Can Do,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 11: 1–19.
  • Rowe, W., 2004, Can God be Free?, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Swinburne, R., 2008, Was Jesus God?, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wierenga, E., 1989, The Nature of God: An Inquiry into Divine Attributes, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.

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Joshua Hoffman <j_hoffma@uncg.edu>
Gary Rosenkrantz <g_rosenk@uncg.edu>

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