Supplement to Peirce's Deductive Logic

Peirce's Three-Valued Logic

In three unnumbered pages from his unpublished notes written before 1910, Peirce developed what amounts to a semantics for three-valued logic. This is at least ten years before Emil Post's dissertation, which is usually cited as the origin of three-valued logic. A good source of information about these three pages is Fisch and Turquette (1966), which also includes reproductions of the three pages from Peirce's notes.

In his notes, Peirce experiments with three symbols representing truth values: V, L, and F. He associates V with “1” and “T”, indicating truth. He associates F with “0” and “F”, indicating falsehood. He associates L with “1/2” and “N”, indicating perhaps an intermediate or unknown value.

Peirce defines a large number of unary and binary operators on these three truth values. The semantics for the operators is indicated by truth tables. Two examples are given here. First, the bar operator (indicated here by a minus sign) is defined as follows:

x V L F
x F L V

Applied to truth the bar operator yields falsehood, applied to unknown it yields unknown and applied to falsehood it yields truth.

The Z operator is a binary operator which Peirce defines as follows:

  V L F

Thus, the Z operator applied to a falsehood and anything else yields a falsehood. The Z operator applied to an unknown and anything but a falsehood yields an unknown. And the Z operator applied to a truth and some other value yields the other value.

The bar operator and the Z operator provide the essentials of a truth-functionally complete strong Kleene semantics for three-valued logic. In addition to these two strong Kleene operators, Peirce defines several other forms of negation, conjunction, and disjunction. The notes also provide some basic properties of some of the operators, such as being symmetric and being associative.

Copyright © 2013 by
Sun-Joo Shin <>
Eric Hammer

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