Notes to Reichenbach's Common Cause Principle

1. Reichenbach's common cause principle is a time-asymmetric principle. One could make this asymmetry more explicit by adding the claim that, typically, there are no later events E conditional upon which A and B are uncorrelated. As with all time-asymmetric principles, one might wonder whether nature really does exhibit such an asymmetry, and if indeed it does, what its origin is, and how it relates to other temporal asymmetries. Reichenbach himself wanted to use the common cause asymmetry as part of a definition of the distinction between the future and the past. On his view, then, it is not interesting to ask why a common cause C occurs before its effects A and B; for that is true by definition of the direction of time. But on his view it remains an interesting question as to why all common causes are always placed in the same direction of time relative to their effects, and how this asymmetry relates to other temporal asymmetries such as thermodynamic asymmetries.

2. One might wish to understand the probabilistic relations stated in this principle as a definition of what a common cause is. However, this is not a plausible idea. For, consider a case in which A1 is a common cause of A2 and A3, while A2 in its turn causes A4, and A3 in its turn causes A5, where A4 and A5 are simultaneous. In this case A4 and A5 will typically be uncorrelated conditional upon A2 (assuming that A2 is the only cause of A4). Moreover, an occurrence of A2 will typically make an occurrence of A4 more likely, and, typically, it will make an occurrence of A5 more likely. Thus A2 would count as a common cause of A4 and A5 if the above probabilistic relations were a definition of what it is to be a common cause. But by assumption A2 is not a cause of A5, and thus not a common cause of A4 and A5. Thus the probabilistic relations that are used to state Reichenbach's principle of the common cause should not be regarded as a definition of what a common cause is.

3. Qk is an indirect cause of Qp exactly when there is a chain of direct causes starting at Qk and ending at Qp. Qp is an effect of Qk iff Qk is a cause of Qp iff Qk is a direct or indirect cause of Qp.

4. Let me explain how this follows from the Markov condition using terminology and theorems from Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines 1993, chapter 3. Let us call a quantity Qc a ‘forking path common cause’ of quantities Qa and Qb if and only if there exists a path that always goes causally downstream from Qc to Qa, a path that always goes causally downstream from Qc to Qb, and these paths do not have any vertices other than Qc in common. Let us now conditionalize on all the forking path common causes of Qa and Qb. Claim: Every path from Qa to Qb will then be inactive. (Paths here are assumed not to contain any vertex more than once.) Let me indicate how to prove this claim.

If such a path P starts at Qa going causally downstream, then it will at some point have to switch to going causally upstream, since Qa is not a cause of Qb. It will thus contain a collider. This collider will be inactive since we are not conditionalizing on it nor on any quantity that is a descendent of it, since we are conditionalizing only on quantities that are causally upstream from Qa. (I am assuming that the graphs are not cyclical.) Thus such a path P will be inactive. Now consider any path P from Qa to Qb that starts at Qa going causally upstream. There must be some point Qc at which point P first starts going causally downstream (since Qb is not a cause of Qa). There are two possibilities: P keeps going causally downstream all the way until it reaches Qb, or it reaches a collider Qd where P switches back to going causally upstream again. In the first case, Qc is a common cause of Qa and Qb. So we have conditionalized on it, so P is inactive. In the second case, Qd is a collider. There are then 2 subcases: Qd does not lie causally upstream from a forking path common cause of Qa and Qb, or it does. If Qd does not lie causally upstream from a common cause, then it does not lie upstream from a quantity that is conditionalized upon, so the collider is inactive, so P is inactive. If Qd does lie causally upstream from a forking path common cause of Qa and Qb, then there must be a downstream path P′ from Qd to Qb. There are now 2 sub-subcases to consider.

Sub-subcase i: P′ has no vertices in common with the part of path P that lies between Qa and Qc. In that case, Qc is a forking path common cause of Qa and Qb: to go downstream from Qc to Qa, follow the part of P that lies between Qc and Qa;to go downstream from Qc to Qb (without intersecting the path to Qa), first take the part of P that lies between Qc and Qd, and then follow P′ to Qb. So in this case we have conditionalized upon Qc on P, so P is inactive.

Sub-subcase ii: every downstream path P′ from Qd to Qb intersects somewhere with the part of P that lies between Qa and Qc. Take some such P′, and consider the furthest point Qe downstream along P′ at which P′ intersects with P between Qa and Qc. Such a Qe must be a forking path common cause of Qa and Qb: follow P to get to Qa, follow P′ to get to Qb. Thus we have conditionalized upon Qe which lies on P. Thus P is inactive.

Thus any path P from Qa to Qb must be inactive once we have conditionalized upon all forking path common causes. Thus Qa and Qb are independent conditional upon a subset of all common causes of Qa and Qb.

5. The law of conditional independence is not violated by this type of case.

6. Let me sketch a proof. Any probability distribution that is allowed by the independence condition can be generated as follows. Assign some probability distribution over all the determinants outside S. By assumption this must be a probability distribution that is jointly independent, i.e. a product of distributions for each such determinant. Now first look at the set S1 of quantities in S that have no direct causes in S. The probability distribution over these quantities will be determined by the distribution of their determinants outside S, and hence be a jointly independent distribution. Now look at the set S2 of quantities all of whose direct causes in S are in S1. The probability distribution over any quantity S2 is obtained by multiplying the probability distributions of its direct causes in S1 with the probability distribution of its determinant outside S. (At least, this is so if all distinct values of direct causes of Q in S and determinants of Q outside S, determine distinct values of Q. This may not be so, but this does not affect the independence claims that I am making here.) And let us continue in this way with S3, .... until we have a distribution over all quantities in S. The only correlations in the joint distribution over quantities in S that will now occur will be between causes and their effects, and between the effects of a common cause. For consider any quantities Q1 and Q2 that are not so related. They will have no ‘ultimate inputs’ (the determinants outside S that determine the values of these quantities) in common, so the sets of ‘ultimate inputs’ for Q1 and ‘ultimate inputs’ for Q2 are independent, which entails that Q1 and Q2 are themselves independent. Moreover, the correlations between any two quantities Q1 and Q2 that are not related as cause and effect will disappear when one conditionalizes upon the direct causes of one of them, say Q1. For the only remaining input into Q1 is independent of anything other than effects of Q1. So Q1 is independent of anything other than effects of Q1 conditional upon the direct causes of Q1. Hence, the causal Markov condition holds.

Copyright © 2010 by
Frank Arntzenius <frank.arntzenius@philosophy.ox.ac.uk>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free