Notes to Experiment in Physics

1 As the late Richard Feynman, one of the leading theoretical physicists of the twentieth century, wrote:

The principle of science, the definition, almost, is the following: The test of all knowledge is experiment. Experiment is the sole judge of scientific ‘truth’.
(Feynman, Leighton and Sands 1963, p. 1-1)

In these postmodern times this might seem to be an old-fashioned view, but it is, I believe, correct. Not everyone would agree. As Andy Pickering has remarked,

...there is no obligation upon anyone framing a view of the world to take account of what twentieth-century science has to say.
(Pickering 1984a, p. 413)

2. By valid, I mean that the experimental result has been argued for in the correct way, by use of epistemological strategies such as those discussed below.

3. See Franklin (1986, Ch. 6; and, 1990, Ch. 6) and Franklin and Howson (1984; 1988) for details of these strategies, along with a discussion of how they fit into a Bayesian philosophy of science

4. As Holmes remarked to Watson, “How often have I said to you that when you have eliminated the impossible, whatever remains, however improbable, must be the truth.” (Conan Doyle 1967, p. 638)

5. It might be useful here to distinguish between the theory of the apparatus and the theory of the phenomenon. Ackermann is talking primarily about the later. It may not always be possible to separate these two theories. The analysis of the data obtained from an instrument may very well involve the theory of the phenomenon, but that doesn't necessarily cast doubt on the validity of the experimental result.

6. For another episode in which the elimination of background was crucial see the discussion of the measurement of the K+e2 branching ratio in (Franklin 1990, pp. 115-31).

7. Collins offers two arguments concerning the difficulty, if not the virtual impossibility of replication. The first is philosophical. What does it mean to replicate an experiment? In what way is the replication similar to the original experiment? A rough and ready answer is that the replication measures the same physical quantity. Whether or not it, in fact, does so can, I believe, be argued for on reasonable grounds, as discussed earlier.

Collins' second argument is pragmatic. This is the fact that in practice it is often difficult to get an experimental apparatus, even one known to be similar to another, to work properly. Collins illustrates this with his account of Harrison's attempts to construct two versions of a TEA laser (Transverse Excited Atmospheric) (Collins 1985, pp. 51-78). Despite the fact that Harrison had previous experience with such lasers, and had excellent contacts with experts in the field, he had great difficulty in building the lasers. Hence the difficulty of replication.

Ultimately Harrison found errors in his apparatus and once these were corrected the lasers operated properly. As Collins admits, “...in the case of the TEA laser the circle was readily broken. The ability of the laser to vaporize concrete, or whatever, comprised a universally agreed criterion of experimental quality. There was never any doubt that the laser ought to be able to work and never any doubt about when one was working and when it was not.” (Collins 1985, p. 84)

Although Collins seems to regard Harrison's problems with replication as casting light on the episode of gravity waves, as support for the experimenters' regress, and as casting doubt on experimental evidence in general, it really doesn't work. As Collins admits (see quote in last paragraph), the replication was clearly demonstrable. One may wonder what role Collins thinks this episode plays in his argument.

8. In more detailed discussions of this episode, Franklin (1994, 1997a), I argued that the gravity wave experiment is not at all typical of physics experiments. In most experiments, as illustrated in those essays, the adequacy of the surrogate signal used in the calibration of the experimental apparatus is clear and unproblematical. In cases where it is questionable considerable effort is devoted to establishing the adequacy of that surrogate signal. Although Collins has chosen an atypical example I believe that the questions he raises about calibration in general and about this particular episode of gravity wave experiments should be answered.

9. Weber had suggested that the actual gravity wave pulses were longer that expected, and that the nonlinear analysis algorithm was more efficient at detecting such pulses.

10. The K1o and K2o mesons were elementary particles with the same charge, mass, and intrinsic spin. They did, however, differ with respect to the CP operator. The K1o and K2o mesons were eigenstates of the CP operator with eigenvalues CP = +1 and -1, respectively.

11. Bose's paper had originally been rejected by the Philosophical Magazine. He then sent it, in English, to Einstein with a request that if Einstein thought the paper merited publication that he would arrange for publication in the Zeitschrift fur Physik. Einstein personally translated the paper and submitted it to the Zeitschrift fur Physik, adding a translator's note, “In my opinion, Bose's derivation of the Planck formula constitutes an important advance. The method used here also yields the quantum theory of the ideal gas, as I shall discuss elsewhere in more detail” (Pais 1982, p. 423). This discussion appeared in Einstein's own papers of 1924 and 1925. For details see Pais (1982, Ch. 23).

12. This section is based on the accounts given by Weinert (1995) and by Mehra and Rechenberg (1982). Translations from the German were provided by these authors and are indicated by initials in the text.

Notes to Appendix 2

1. I surveyed eighty such theoretical papers. Sixty accepted the Princeton result as evidence for either CP violation or apparent CP violation. Even those that offered alternative explanations of the result were not necessarily indications that the authors did not accept CP violation. One should distinguish between interesting speculations and serious suggestions. The latter are characterized by a commitment to their truth. I note that T.D. Lee was author, or co-author, of three of these theoretical papers. Two offered alternative explanations of the Princeton result and one proposed a model that avoided CP violation. Lee was not seriously committed to the truth of any of them. Bell and Perring, authors of one of the alternatives, remarked, “Before a more mundane explanation is found it is amusing to speculate that it might be a local effect due to the dysymmetry of the environment, namely the local preponderance of matter over antimatter” (Bell and Perring 1964, p. 348, emphasis added).

2. In the modus tollens if h entails e then “not e” entails not h. Duhem and Quine pointed out that it is really h and b, where b is background knowledge and auxiliary hypotheses, that entails e. Thus “not e” entails “h” or “b” and one doesn't know where to place the blame.

Notes to Appendix 3

1. Bose's paper had originally been rejected by the Philosophical Magazine. He then sent it, in English, to Einstein with a request that if Einstein thought the paper merited publication that he would arrange for publication in the Zeitschrift fur Physik. Einstein personally translated the paper and submitted it to the Zeitschrift fur Physik, adding a translator's note, “In my opinion, Bose's derivation of the Planck formula constitutes an important advance. The method used here also yields the quantum theory of the ideal gas, as I shall discuss elsewhere in more detail” (Pais 1982, p. 423). This discussion appeared in Einstein's own papers of 1924 and 1925. For details see Pais (1982, Ch. 23).

2. One difficulty with using rubidium is that at very low temperatures rubidium should be a solid. (In fact, rubidium is a solid at room temperature). Wieman, Cornell and their collaborators avoided this difficulty by creating a system that does not reach a true equilibrium. The vapor sample created equilibrates to a thermal distribution as a spin polarized gas, but takes a very long time to reach its true equilibrium state as a solid. At the low temperatures and density of the experiment the rubidium remains as a metastable super-saturated vapor for a long time.

Notes to Appendix 4

1. The original Eötvös experiment was designed to measure the ratio of the gravitational mass to the inertial mass of different substances. Eötvös found the ratio to be one, to within approximately one part in a million. Fischbach and his collaborators reanalyzed Eötvös' data and found a composition dependent effect, which they interpreted as evidence for a Fifth Force.

2. It is a fact of experimental life that experiments rarely work when they are initially turned on and that experimental results can be wrong, even if there is no apparent error. It is not necessary to know the exact source of an error in order to discount or to distrust a particular experimental result. Its disagreement with numerous other results can, I believe, be sufficient.

Notes to Appendix 6

1. Rupp's withdrawal included a note from a psychiatrist stating that Rupp had suffered from a mental illness and could not distinguish between fantasy and reality.

2. The problem with the hydrogen spectrum was not solved until the later discovery of the anomalous magnetic moment of the electron in the 1950s.

Notes to Appendix 7

1. Morrison (1990) has argued that manipulability is not sufficient to establish belief in an entity. She discusses particle physics experiments in which particle beams were viewed not only as particles, but also as beams of quarks, the constituents of the particles, even though the physicists involved had no belief in the existence of quarks. Although I believe that Morrison's argument is correct in this particular case, I do think that manipulability can, and often does, give us good reason to believe in an entity. See, for example, the discussion of the microscope in Hacking (1983).

2. Millikan, for example, used the properties of electrons emitted in the photoelectric effect to measure h, Planck's constant. Stern and Gerlach, as discussed below, used the properties of the electron to investigate spatial quantization, and also discovered evidence for electron spin.

3. For more details of this episode, including a discussion of other early twentieth century experiments, see (Franklin 1997c).

4. In Cartwright's discussion of the electron track in the cloud chamber, for example, she can identify the track as an electron track rather than as a proton track only because she has made an implicit commitment to the law of ionization for charged particles, and it's dependence on the mass and velocity of the particles.

5. Thomson also demonstrated the magnetic deflection of cathode rays in a separate experiment.

6. Thomson actually investigated the conductivity of the gas in the tube under varying pressure conditions. See Thomson (1897, pp. 298-300).

7. I shall return to this when I discuss Thomson's measurement of e/m for the electron.

8. Thomson's argument is the “duck argument.” If it looks like a duck, quacks like a duck, and waddles like a duck, then we have good reason to believe that it is a duck. One need only reconstitute the argument using “it” as cathode rays and negatively charged particles as ducks.

9. Thomson actually used two different methods to determine the charge to mass ratio. The other method used the total charge carried by a beam of cathode rays in a fixed period of time, the total energy carried by the beam in that sane time, and the radius of curvature of the particles in a known magnetic field. Thomson regarded the method discussed in the text as more reliable and this is the method shown in most modern physics textbooks.

10. Not everything Thomson concluded is in agreement with modern views. Although he believed that the electron was a constituent of atoms, he thought that it was the primordial atom from which all atoms were constructed, similar to Prout's view that all atoms were constructed from hydrogen atoms. He also suggested that the charge on the electron might be larger than that of the hydrogen ion.

Notes to Appendix 8

1. The conservation of momentum also requires that the electron and proton have equal and opposite momenta, for a neutron decay at rest. They will be emitted in opposite directions.

2. Pauli's suggestion was first made in a December 4, 1930 letter to the radioactive group at a regional meeting in Tuebingen.

Dear Radioactive Ladies and Gentlemen:

I beg you to receive graciously the bearer of this letter who will report to you in detail how I have hit on a desperate was to escape from the problems of the “wrong” statistics of the N and Li6 nuclei and of the continuous beta spectrum in order to save the “even-odd” rule of statistics and the law of conservation of energy. Namely the possibility that electrically neutral particles, which I would like to call neutrons [the particle we call the neutron, which is about the same mass as the proton, was discovered in 1932 by Chadwick. Pauli's “neutron” is our “neutrino.”] might exist inside nuclei; these would have spin 1/2, would obey the exclusion principle, and would in addition duffer from photons through the fact that they would not travel at the speed of light. The mass of the neutron ought to be about the same order of magnitude as the electron mass, and in any case could not be greater than 0.01 proton masses. The continuous beta spectrum would then become understandable by assuming that in beta decay a neutron is always emitted along with the electron, in such a way that the sum of the energies of the neutron and electron is a constant.

Now, the question is, what forces act on the neutron? The most likely model for the neutron seems to me, on wave mechanical grounds, to be the assumption that the motionless neutron is a magnetic dipole with a certain magnetic moment µ (the bearer of this letter can supply details). The experiments demand that the ionizing power of such a neutron cannot exceed that of a gamma ray, and therefore µ probably cannot be greater than e(10-13cm). [e is the charge of the electron].

At the moment I do not dare to publish anything about this idea, so I first turn trustingly to you, dear radioactive friends, with the question: how could such a neutron be experimentally identified if it possessed about the same penetrating power as a gamma ray or perhaps 10 times greater penetrating power?

I admit that my way out may look rather improbable at first since if the neutron existed it would have been seen long ago. But nothing ventured, nothing gained. The gravity of the situation with the continuous beta spectrum was illuminated by a remark by my distinguished predecessor in office, Mr. DeBye, who recently said to me in Brussels, “Oh, that's a problem like the new taxes; one had best not think about it at all.” So one ought to discuss seriously any way that may lead to salvation. Well, dear radioactive friends, weigh it and pass sentence! Unfortunately, I cannot appear personally in Tubingen, for I cannot get away from Zurich on account of a ball which is held here on the night of December 6-7. With best regards to you and to Mr. Baek,

Your most obedient servant,
    W. Pauli

(Quoted in Ford 1968, p. 849.)

This was a serious suggestion and although Pauli did not get all the properties of the neutrino right his suggestion was the basis of further work.

3. With a three-body decay the electron and the proton also didn't have to come off back to back. This observation was not made until the late 1930s. Assigning the neutrino a spin, intrinsic angular momentum, of h/4 also preserved the law of conservation of angular momentum.

4. The actual history is more complex. For a time, an alternative theory of decay, proposed by Konopinski and Uhlenbeck (1935) was better supported by the experimental evidence than was Fermi's theory. It was subsequently shown that both the experimental results and the theoretical calculations were wrong and that Fermi's theory was , in fact, supported by the evidence. For details see (Franklin 1990).

5. Allowed transitions are those for which both the electron and neutrino wavefunctions could be considered constant over nuclear dimensions. Forbidden transitions are those that included higher order terms in the perturbation series expansion of the matrix element.

6. I have been unable to find a published reference to this measurement. It is cited as a private communication in the literature.

7. In a post-deadline paper presented at the January 1958 meeting of the American Physical Society, Rustad and Ruby suggested that their earlier result might be wrong. There are no abstracts of post-deadline papers, but the talk was cited in the literature. Ruby remembers the tone of the paper as mea culpa (private communication).

Copyright © 2012 by
Allan Franklin <allan.franklin@colorado.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free