Notes to Pleasure

Advice to the Reader: These notes provide greater depth of treatment, for those who wish it, and often cite further references. They will often be of interest only to minorities of readers. Single notes may cover up to a paragraph in the main entry text and may address different topics in different paragraphs. Readers who do not at first find what they are seeking are therefore advised to skim down before giving up, to see whether this is provided later. Further discussion of references is sometimes provided in the remarks continuing alphabetized Bibliography entries in the main entry file. This will gradually be supplemented by a linked list of suggested readings divided by subject.

1. This long note (by far this entry's longest) defends its inclusive usage of “pleasure” and “pain” and also the naturalness of the prima facie distinction thus drawn. It also distinguishes these usages from some others. This usage of “pain” is discussed in the first paragraph below, the related distinction between sensation and affect in the second, and the substantive contrast between pain and pleasure in the third and fourth. The remainder of the note (flagged by another brief introductory paragraph) discusses the wide cultural and historical currency of inclusive usage of “pleasure” (and of semantically similar terms), distinguishes different uses, and ends with three paragraphs discussing the rejection of the inclusive usage and conception by some ‘ordinary language philosophers’ of the midtwentieth century. Throughout a broader linguistic and cultural perspective is attempted, in contrast to their practice of drawing universal conclusions about pleasure exclusively from intuitions about current English usage, in keeping with then-current British philosophical fashion, although they typically had broader linguistic evidence ready to hand.

Inclusive affective use of “pain”, contrasting with inclusive use of “pleasure”, is old in English (probably as old as the narrow use for pain sensation [OED, ad loc.]), however metaphorical it may seem to some now. No alternative has enduringly replaced “pain” in this everyday use; it is, however, often helpful to alternate “suffering” or “distress” with it, to make clear the shared meaning one intends. As Locke's similar supplementary use of “uneasiness” (n. 3 below) shows, this problem is nothing new. (It has led some to prefer Hobbes' now-obsolete use of “displeasure” [e.g., Schroeder 2004] — or even the nineteenth century coinage “unpleasure”, imitating the use of “Unlust” since Kant in academic German [defended as the only English opposite of “pleasure” in Rachels 2004]. Both uses are unidiomatic in living English and further seem to controversially [see two paragraphs down] prejudge that affective pain is really related to pleasure as its contrary or polar opposite.) Common speech aside, there is a history of similarly inclusive usage in a longstanding and continuing theoretical discourse, beginning in ancient Greek and Latin. “Pleasure” and “pain” have long been the established English translations used in continuing this. Aquinas is clear and explicit in flagging the similar distinction between two uses of the Latin “dolor”, a narrow one for bodily pain and a more inclusive generic one covering thought-mediated sorrow (“tristitia”) as well (ST 1a 2æ 35,2). In ancient Greek philosophy the most standard term for inclusive affective pain, “lupê”, has associations with the grief of bereavement more than with bodily pain. (Stoics, accordingly, used a different term when contrasting bodily pain with pleasant sensory experiences [Long and Sedley 1987, Vol. 1, p. 421; Cooper 1996a/1999, p. 245/415; 1998/1999, pp. 75, 401n13/454]. They, however, used “hêdonê” ambiguously to contrast with both, meaning sometimes pleasure but sometimes pleasant sensory experiences (similarly to uses 2 and 4 of six paragraphs below). Cicero notes this and disambiguates when translating into Latin [de finibus III, 35].)

Despite a long-term trend toward greater interest in affect leading to Kant's making Feeling a separate faculty alongside Cognition and Desire (Kant 1790/2000; see the Bibliography note on this), the distinction between pain sensation and affective distress was sometimes obscured in the associationist psychology and dawning neurology of the eighteenth to nineteenth centuries. The distinction between affective feelings and sensations became a subject of controversy among introspectionist experimental psychologists of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. Some classified affective feelings with sensations or even identified them with specific bodily sensations (Gardiner, Metcalf, and Beebe-Center 1937, pp. 337-39; Titchener 1924, Lectures II and III; see n. 3, ¶3 below for more). But a distinction between affective distress and pain sensation is recovered already in Bertrand Russell 1921, pp. 69-72, following the neurologist Henry Head (cf. Trigg 1970, pp. 2ff.; Aydede 2000). A similar distinction is now well established in science, although some resistance from philosophers remains (e.g., Helm 2002). The dissociable sensory and affective components normally associated in bodily pain seem each to have their own psychological and physiological reality. For further discussion, see Aydede 2005, §5.1, ¶¶ 2 and 3, which also links to his comprehensive pain bibliography at its end. For a recent review of progress on the central neural bases of pain affect, see Rainville 2002. For further discussion of the sensory/affective distinction, focused more on pleasure, see §1.1, ¶5 and n. 3 ad loc.

Contemporary psychologists' contrast of ‘positive affect’ with ‘negative affect’ allows that these may not be magnitudes that can be added together or represented as in opposite directions along a single natural dimension. Indeed, David Watson and his collaborators, from whom this usage's currency in the past two decades seems to derive, have throughout argued that they are not. He believes himself to be indicating two orthogonal (separable and independent in mathematical analysis) dimensions of affect. (See Watson 2000, pp. 26-33 and 44-54, for his reasons and for references to the psychological literature.) The use of “positive” and “negative” to partition affective states is decades older; the idea of such partition is ancient and so is recognition of its difficulties and subtleties. Plato argues that many emotions typically involve feelings of both pleasure and pain (Philebus 47E1-50C9) and Aristotle (likewise quoting Homer's Achilles, Iliad xviii:108-10) allows that this is the case at least for anger (because it typically involves taking pleasure in thoughts of conspicuous revenge, and not only pain at the thought of an undeserved conspicuous slight, Rhetoric II,2:1378a31-b9) and also that some of what intuitively count as passions or emotions (pathê) need not involve occurrent pleasure or pain (Cooper 1996a/1999). The basic distinction between feeling good and feeling bad is, so far, a very well supported and almost universally recognized one. (An isolated recent claim, in a paper written jointly by a senior philosopher and a social psychology graduate student, that no single distinction in this area is central to affect, seems uninformed on the relevant harder science; see the Bibliography note on Solomon and Stone 2002.) “Valence” is also used in psychological literature to mark the same contrast between affective pleasure and affective pain, or distress.

Once pleasure and pain are thought of as independent realities, neither of which consists in the mere absence of the other, and which may be based in different biological states or neural systems, Watson's position should not be that surprising — even to a hedonist who supposes that pleasure is the only thing intrinsically good and pain the only thing intrinsically bad. The appearance that pleasure, or feeling good, must be the contrary of pain, or feeling bad, and so must pro tanto (i.e., to the extent it is present) exclude pain, may derive from the semantic opposition of good and bad. But even if this semantic opposition enters into the analysis of the concepts pleasure and pain, that would not imply that feeling or experience that is (or seems) intrinsically good must exclude feeling or experience that is (or seems) intrinsically bad, any more than it follows merely from this same semantic opposition that good music and bad cannot simultaneously fill the same space or affect the same person. Whether and how a person can have mixed good and bad feelings is an old empirical question. From Plato's discussion of the pain of hunger's correlation with pleasure in eating (Gorgias 495D2-497D7) to contemporary discussions of temperament and mood, it has been argued that the correlations between pleasure and suffering do not support their absolutely or even pro tanto excluding each other, as someone's sitting and standing or something's speed and slowness do. The cumulative psychological evidence, both on occurrent feeling and temperament, that they do not always (even pro tanto) exclude each other is plausible (Thayer 1989, 1996; Watson 2000), although decisive evidence of their being organized in distinct and compatible neurophysiological processes is yet absent. (But cf. J.A. Russell 1991 and J.A. Russell and Barrett 1999, opponents of Watson and Thayer on this question.) Such localizations may be forthcoming. See §3 below on pleasure and Rainville 2002 on negative affect in pain. But we seem to be dealing with phenomena ‘rerepresented’ at successive levels of brain organization (Berridge 2003a) rather than simply localized in one area, as is sometimes suggested (e.g., Schroeder 2004). (For additional historical perspective and references on the dimensional structure of affect, see n. 39.)

The remainder of this note defends the inclusive usage of “pleasure” and the like adopted here and distinguishes such uses from some others. This may be unneeded by readers untroubled by the philosophical literature of 1949-1973 referenced in this note's last three paragraphs. Those willing to provisionally accept the inclusive usage without evidence that it is widespread and grounded in natural ways of categorizing experience (and thus not to be dismisssed out of hand as a mere philosophers' confusion or tendentious invention) may wish to skip now to this note's last paragraph.

The inclusive usage seems to mark a natural attractor in human semantic or conceptual space. Inclusive uses of terms such as “pleasure” run through an historically connected discourse in European languages from ancient Greece to the present, often using Greek “hêdonê” and “chara”, Latin “voluptas”, “laetitia”, and “delectatio”, and their descendants and translations in modern languages. Similar uses occur in Indic languages. Thus in Sanskrit the contrast of “sukha” with “duhkha uses prefixes for good and bad congruently with the English contrast of “feeling good” with “feeling bad”. The linguist Anna Wierzbicka suggests, on the basis of the available linguistic evidence, that all languages can express feeling good, with those lacking a special lexical item using the apparently universal presence of ones for good and feeling together for this (Wierzbicka 1999, pp. 279-82, 292-93). Broader crosscultural evidence on the categorization of emotions, summarized in J.A. Russell 1991, also tends to support a culturally universal category of positive affect. Such inclusive or generic usage is thus not easily dismissed as a mere philosophers' invention. (To what extent it is a true guide to something deeper in our nature than our possession of such a category or concept is the larger question that is a principal subject of §§ 2 and 3 below.) Inclusive uses are not restricted to high theory. Ordinary speech, song, and lyric poetry use them freely as well.

Many terms used for (1) inclusive or generic pleasure have related uses in which they denote (2) pleasant, or at least typically pleasant, experiences, sometimes especially sensory experiences or to (3) someone's being placated or pleased by, or pleased or satisfied with, someone or at least something. Latin origins in verbs tied to (3) may leave traces in nonaffective uses of “pleasure” and cognate terms. (For example, the placita of Roman law and medieval decrees were agreeable only in that they were things agreed to by the parties or authorities concerned; they were thus marked as expressions of decision or consent, rather than as expressions of merriment. Later and current nonaffective uses of cognates are noted four paragraphs below.) “Pleasure” and its cognates displaced from common speech, in their inclusive usage, older English words that were becoming tainted by impolite associations; e.g., “lust” (see OED, ad loc.).

Beyond these uses involving mental states, acts, or processes involving positive affect, there are related uses in which (4) the particular or typical occasions, causes, or objects on which instances of these psychological phenomena depend may be called “pleasures” and the like. (On the parallel Greek usage of “ hêdonai”, see Owen 1971-72, a landmark paper applying this distinction to the interpretation of Aristotle's two discussions of pleasure in the Nicomachean Ethics. Analogous English usage permits an annoying person, job, fact, or circumstance to be called “a pain”.) For discussion of various uses of “pleasure” and overlapping terms in English, see Perry 1967, pp. 41-73. For usages in other languages, see, besides standard dictionaries and lexicons, such as those listed in the Bibliography, the discussion of various uses of “sukha” in Pali Buddhist texts by Buddhaghosa, 1920-21, I, i, pp. 52-54.

“Physical pleasure”, “bodily pleasure”, “sensory pleasure”, and “pleasures of sensation” may be used for the sensory part of the range of (2) or for restrictions of either (1) or (4) to cases depending on that. For many ancient and medieval writers and for their modern followers such as Descartes and Brentano, such uses involve an implied contrast with pleasure in or caused by thinking, judging, or willing. (Notes 25-27 below provide citations.) Differences in higher cognitive involvement also lie behind joy being often classified as an emotion, involving more explicit positive evaluation of something (e.g., Duncker 1941, pp. 401-2), rather than with pleasure as a mere feeling. Thomas Aquinas uses the cognate “gaudium” for the intellectually-caused species of pleasure (delectatio): Summa Theologiæ 1a 2æ 31,3, following a distinction transmitted through translation from the Arabic of ibn Sina (‘Avicenna’), citing his De Anima IV, 5, 2iva. (This is the psychological part, al-Nafs, of Kitab al-Shifa’, the chief philosophical work of this important Islamic physician and philosopher who lived in Central Asia and Persia, 980-1037.) Cf. the similar distinction in Buddhist texts discussed in § 3.3, ¶4. For Hobbes also joy is pleasure of the mind (Leviathan I,vi,¶12; 1651/1994, p. 30). Aquinas (ST 1a 2æ 35,2 and 36,1) similarly distinguishes between the genus, inclusive pain (dolor), and its intellectually caused species, sorrow (tristitia). However, from a contemporary scientific perspective, difference in cognitive involvement or processing seems a matter of degree, rather than the absolute distinction that an assumed metaphysical dualism of intellect and body seemed to many, in the past, to require.

Ordinary language serves many human concerns. Affect terms respond, for example, to needs to distinguish causes and contexts, predict actions, and respect current moral distinctions. Differentiation between terms sharing a natural region in semantic space in usage and idioms is to be expected, but even where stable it may not always mark any theoretically important divide. Plato and Aristotle rejected Prodicus' attempt to find ready-made theoretical distinctions within pleasure in the diversity of Greek ordinary language expressions and to regiment usage accordingly (Plato: Protagoras 337C1-4, 358A5-B2, Taylor commentary; pp. 437-439. Aristotle: Topica, II, 6:112b22-24). Despite their insistence on the diversity of pleasure and their use elsewhere of the distinction between pleasure of the body and of the mind that Plato's Prodicus introduces (Protagoras 337C1-4), they still treat pleasure as a single subject and use ordinary terms inclusively when discussing it (§2.2).

However, during the vogue of ‘ordinary language philosophy’, between 1949 and 1973, some philosophers writing in English rejected the inclusive conception of pleasure on the basis of claims about the disparate usage of relevant expressions in contemporary English, often emphasizing differences between “enjoying (activities and experiences)” and “being pleased” (by states of affairs or the like). See, for example, Kenny 1963, p. 55; Perry 1967, especially pp. 214-17; and contrast Gosling 1969 on “being pleased” with Taylor 1963, pp. 8-9 on uses of “being pleased with ...” signifying dispositional contentment that may obtain absent any occurrent positive affect. (Fred Feldman's account of pleasure as a pure propositional attitude that need involve no affect may respond in part to this use; Feldman 2004, discussed in §2.3.2 below.) Ockham, in discussing a similar ambiguity in the Latin cognate “complacens”, notes a sense in which someone might be said to be pleased (complacens) without taking pleasure (delectat, cognate with “delight”) (2001, Q. 3, 3b ii, pp. 379/411-12). See four paragraphs above for the likely roots of these behavioral (signifying acquiescence or, minimally, absence of open protest or resistance) and affect-absent (signifying absence of negative affect toward the content concerned) uses in their shared linguistic history. See Goldstein 1985 for critical discussion of the 1949-1973 literature and its method, Aydede 2000 for a longer, more general and sympathetic discussion, and Trigg 1970 for its most substantial contribution, of which only Ch. VI focuses on pleasure (as discussed briefly in n. 3, ¶4, below).

Whatever the details of such usages may be, a longstanding human theme and concern should not be dismissed solely on the basis of local usage — and still less on the basis of linguistic intuitions about this produced as needed by philosophers engaged in arguing a point. Writing from a broader linguistic perspective, Wierzbicka and Harkins (2001, p. 17) have noted modern spoken English's unusual scarcity of ‘active’ intransitive verbs for feeling and emotion and its preference for using ‘passive’ adjectives instead for these. In this linguistic climate, ‘enjoying activities’ and ‘being pleased by something’ may seem to exhaustively divide pleasure's territory and thus to show that some ulterior activity, content, or object is logically required in every case (e.g., Perry 1967, pp. 214-17). But as Gosling observed looking back over this literature, that “feel pleased” requires a complement seems nothing deeper than an English grammatical demand (1969, p. 153), perhaps in this case connected with the etymology of “pleasure” noted five paragraphs above. Others had put much weight on such grammatical matters; for example, Ryle had concluded from “enjoy” being a transitive verb, requiring an object, that enjoyment cannot exist on its own, as a matter of conceptual necessity (1954a, p. 61). But it had not always been so with commonly used English terms occupying much the same semantic space. Jolly English hosts of centuries past who bade their guests ‘rejoice, make merry, and be of good cheer’ were not, by grammatical necessity, also inviting them to find suitable objects to do these toward, since there is in each case an established intransitive use. Neither need the “wine that maketh glad the heart of man” (Psalms, 104:15, King James Version) provide an object or content in so doing, either in ancient Hebrew, the King's English, or that of psychopharmacology. These points are worth noting, since while the mid-twentieth-century philosophical literature is fading from memory, it is still sometimes assumed that it showed all inclusive usage artificial and illegitimate, “enjoyment” a more philosophically respectable substitute for “pleasure”, or pleasure to always consist in an ‘attitude’ like belief and desire, necessarily taking an intentional or even a propositional object, as a matter of something deeper than parochial grammatical necessity. (The question of whether pleasure has intentional structure will come up again, briefly, later in this section and throughout §2.3.)

Following inclusive usage, “pleasure”, “joy”, their cognates, and near synonyms will often be used freely and almost interchangeably here, guided by idiomatic usage — while leaving open how much deeper psychological unity and diversity such inclusive usage and its narrower cousins conceal or reveal. We shall in §§3.2 and 3.3 consider scientific evidence bearing on this substantive question, on which ordinary language provides only a small part of the total evidence — and any single term's or language's use over an historically short time a very small part indeed.

2. LeDoux 1996; Frijda 2001; Frijda and Zellenberg 2001 pp. 146-7, 154-5; Ellsworth and Scherer 2003; Scherer 2003; Musch and Klauer 2003 passim.

3. Locke, An Essay concerning Human Understanding, II, xx, 1. Locke allows that pleasure varies at least in quantity (II, xx, 41) and perhaps also in quality, as Hume does explicitly (A Treatise of Human Nature iii, i, 2). Kant like Locke regards pleasure (Lust) as admitting of no precise intrinsic verbal definition, but offers indirect causal and functional characterizations (1790/2000, p. 33/Ak. 20:231; see Bibliography note for more on Kant). Locke, in contrast, often omits pleasure's traditional direct connection with motivation, but only because he believes that pleasure's equally conceptually primitive evil twin, ‘uneasiness' (i.e., pain, II, xx,15), plays the predominant or even sole direct role there, with pleasure motivating mainly or solely by way of the painfulness of its represented lack (II, xx,6; II, xxi, 31-47,59,64), at least in our needy earthly state (II,xxi,46). (The simple picture of pleasure [see this entry's second introductory paragraph and the main entry text following here], which Locke seems to use, had ancient antecedents. Epicurus’ ancient hedonism, atomism in physics, and empiricism about knowledge were revived and Christianized in the Renaissance (see text translations in Kraye, 1997, Part VI) and then promoted by Gassendi (1592-1655), who through his writings and followers in the Netherlands influenced Locke during his stay there while writing the Essay. The Epicureans may not have explicitly distinguished between sensory states and affective ones, although a similar distinction may be presupposed on some interpretations of their fragmentary literary remains; e.g., Cooper 1999a; for more references, see n. 40.)  Locke thus seems not to identify pleasure with any bodily sensation proper and the same may well be predominantly true of his tradition, despite textually unsupported attributions of ‘the sensation view’. Some who use such language and rhetoric, however, intend in doing so to include (and perhaps to ridicule by this characterization and association) feeling views such as Locke's and to reject the simple picture of pleasure and its experiential core generally (e.g., Anscombe 1957/1963, p. 77, discussed in §1.2 and n. 5 below).

Descartes, despite his varying and sometimes misleading use of terms, seems consistently to distinguish mere pleasant sensation from the soul's contingent and variable affective reaction to it, even when he is well translated as calling the former “pleasure” (in a use close to use 2 of n. 1, ¶8) and the latter delight or joy of the soul. Descartes thus approximates to the point credited to Ryle in the text, but in a Stoic-influenced psychology and dualist metaphysics for which sensory, appetitive, and many affective processes (all on his view involving union of immaterial mind and material body) present special difficulties. Relevant short passages include: Treatise on Man (CSM I, p. 103; AT XI, p. 144). Discourse on Method (CSM I, p. 141; AT VI, p. 59). Meditation VI (CSM II, pp. 52, 53; AT VII, pp. 74, 76). Principles of Philosophy I, §48 (CSM I, p. 209; AT VIII-I, p. 23) and IV, §§190-91 (CSM I, pp. 281-82; AT VIII-I, pp. 317-18). Letter to Princess Elisabeth, 6 Oct. 1645 (CSM III, pp. 270-71; AT IV-II, pp. 309-12). And, most especially, Passions of the Soul II, §§91 and 94 (CSM I, pp. 360-62; AT XI, pp. 396-400) and also II, §137 (CSM, I, p. 376; AT, XI, p. 430). Since Descartes (CSM III, p. 271; AT IV, p. 312 and Passions II, 94, cited above), philosophers have been accusing others of confusing tickles and other sensations proper with pleasure, although it is not easy to find theorists who explicitly did, except in the late introspectionist psychology discussed in the next paragraph. Ordinary language often uses the same terms on both sides of this divide; see uses (1) and (2) of n. 1, ¶8 above. And philosophers, including Descartes himself, do, too. (In trying to make Descartes' usage, in translation, more consistent than his French usage, in their passage last cited, CSM translate “plaisir” [used there, unlike in some other places, to mark the affect side of the divide, and explicitly as interchangeable with “joie”, joy] as “enjoyment”, rather than by the cognate “pleasure”.)

However, in the heyday of the neurology-influenced introspectionist experimental psychology of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, when the reduction of affects to proper sensations with specific transducers and nerve tracts seemed a reasonable scientific project (e.g., Nichols 1892, pp. 404-5), the empiricist philosopher and introspectionist psychologist Karl Stumpf classified sensory pleasure with sensations (Chisholm 1987; Titchener 1908, pp. 82-121, provides lengthy quotations, discussion, and criticism), Bourdon identified ‘sensations of pleasure’ (supposedly analogous to sensations of pain) with nonlocalized faint tickling involving special receptors in the skin (Titchener 1908, pp. 81-82; Bourdon 1893), and, finally, the early twentieth century introspectionist psychologist Nafe identified pleasure wholly with bodily sensations of specific kinds (Beebe-Center 1951, p. 257; Gardiner, Metcalf and Beebe-Center, 1937, p. 339; Beebe-Center 1932, pp. 74-5, 347-9 and more generally for discussion of the relevant literature of late introspectionist psychology, pp. 67-89). Bright, light, or warm feelings in the chest have been reported by others as well, most recently by the social psychologist Jonathan Haidt and his collaborators interviewing subjects said to be experiencing a positive affect of moral elevation (Haidt 2003, p. 864). These are presumably autonomic symptoms, like the sinking feelings in the gut that may accompany distress. But those suffering autonomic failure experience affect despite this loss (although without the amplification somatic feedback may bring), thus refuting purely autonomic theories of affect. Ryle's (or Descartes', preceding paragraph) point in the text, so far, seems correct: any sensation proper may be enjoyed or not, and might even become an annoying nuisance during an otherwise enjoyable experience, and is thereby shown not to be pleasure. Such sensations may be ‘sensations (symptomatic) of pleasure’ on a par with feelings (symptomatic) of indigestion. But just as those feelings are not one's indigestion, these sensations are not the pleasure itself. While this seems right at least to a first approximation, an appreciation of how science may change our psychological categories bars our sharing Ryle's complete confidence in them. Arthur Craig (2002) provides new evidence for scientifically distinguishing interoceptive bodily feeling from garden variety outwardly directed sensations that might, perhaps, be used to make a case against a sharp sensory/affective distinction. He, however, seems to identify affective feeling with motivation and to regard these as depending on brain areas different from, although related to, those for interoceptive bodily feeling. One may wonder, however, whether the sensory and affective/motivational aspects of nausea, for example, are always dissociable, as seems the case for sensory and affective pain (suffering).

Affective pleasure may, in whole or part, be regarded as representing bodily states, by virtue of responding to the fulfillment of needs or to good bodily conditions, as such, if only in an austere functional and information-processing sense (but not involving such information being accessible to a subject as such), as warranted by studies of the relevant physiological systems, their connections, and likely functions. Hypotheses of Plato (§2.2.1) and Descartes (see, additionally and especially Passions of the Soul, II, 93 & 95 (CSM pp. 361 & 362; AT pp. 398 & 400) may be thus understood. This would be a minimalist way of understanding the recent suggestions of Antonio Damasio (1994, chs. 8 & 9; 1999 passim; 2003, pp. 85-90, 105-8, 111-12, 137-38; Adolphs and Damasio 2001, pp. 28-30), on which the relevant information-bearing affective states may be unlike the states we standardly count as bodily sensations in that their bodily informational content is typically beyond the ability of human subjects to report. Even on this minimalist reading, however, Damasio's interpretations of affective neuroscience remain of interest for intentional accounts of pleasure (§2.3 below) and representational theories of mind (e.g., Tye 1995, pp. 128-30). The areas important in affect do not include the primary somatosensory cortex. Still, their being able to produce chills and shivers of pleasure (Damasio 2003, pp. 102-3) gives one pause. However, if these are, as it seems, somatic symptoms that may be either liked or disliked, Ryle's point and our distinction between sensation proper and affect would still apply. (See Trigg 1970, Ch. VI, pp. 102-24 for a clear statement of the case for there not being sensations of pleasure on a par with sensations of pain; also Aydede 2000.) It is, however, possible that the distinction between sensation proper and affect, defended so far above, is like much else in the brain (including cognitive processing) a matter of degree. Feelings of hot and cold, as A.D. Craig (2002) points out, seem to have especially close connections both with affect and with homeostatic need or drive states. And feelings of nausea, again, seem especially hard to like, however generally persuasive Ryle's claim and the possibilities of distinguishing affect/motivation from bodily sensation in the brain discussed by Craig may be.

4. Ryle: 1949, Ch. IV, esp. pp. 107-10, followed in the text; cf. 1954a, especially pp. 58-61 and 1954b, especially pp. 136-38. The view accorded qualified praise in his 1954a, p. 60, ¶1 may be Aristotle's. Further discussion is provided in the Bibliography notes to these. A possible explanation for the difficulty of introspecting pleasure, which had earlier led to the rejection of experiential views of pleasure in psychology which lies behind the views of Ryle and his followers, is offered in §1.3, last two paragraphs.

The view that pleasure is not a conscious experience had become fairly standard in psychology classrooms and literature during the increasingly behaviorist 1920s, '30s, and '40s, in the wake of the collapse of the introspectionist project described in the preceding paragraph of the text. The prevalent methodology emphasized that the concepts of psychology, as of other sciences, are constructed, rather than given in experience. See Beebe-Center 1951, pp. 258-59 and 295-96, which parades these views as proud achievements of the past decades, with quotations and references. That subjective experience might even so contribute something to this construction and be part of a psychological concept's reference seems not to have been considered, owing to the further positivist methodological requirement that scientific concepts be defined operationally, by objective procedures, also stated there. Presumably these constructs were supposed to have no reference beyond their objective (not depending on subjects' reports of experience) methods of verification.

5. G.E.M. Anscombe, Intention, 1963/1957, pp. 77-78. A shorter version appears in the seventh paragraph of her widely reprinted “Modern Moral Philosophy”, 1981b/1958, which appears in her 1981a, Vol. 3, at p. 27. There her moral animus against utilitarianism and its relation to her dismissive treatment of pleasure are explicit. Others of the same era also put much emphasis on the concept's ordinary language explanatory role, sometimes to the point of seeming to reduce the term's meaning to its conversation-stopping force, as when the answer, “For pleasure,” blocks the further question, “What for?” E.g., Nowell-Smith 1954, pp. 111-115 127-32. (Contrast Moran 2004, discussed toward this section's end, who takes the same answer to commit one to being able to specify, on demand, exactly what one finds pleasant and how.) Cf. Kenny, 1963, pp. 34-45, where the point is made but its overemphasis criticized (at pp. 140-41), as also in Gosling (1969). The observation that we never ask for a further motive beyond pleasure goes back to Aristotle's account of an argument of Eudoxus, NE X,1:1172b20-23.

Anscombe explicitly draws on Wittgenstein's views of mind, drawing a parallel between Wittgenstein's attack on a simple internalist picture of meaning in his Philosophical Investigations and her own on the simple picture of pleasure. Wittgenstein's work on meaning, however, is not without its own own obscurity and problems, both in itself and as concerns its application to affect. For a taste of Wittgenstein's tentative late work in this area, see his Philosophical Investigations, §244 and p. 189 and, from his notebooks, Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Vol. 1, ed. G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright (Oxford: Blackwell, 1980) §§449-453, 807 and 896.

Anscombe's strongly but sparsely stated dismissal of hedonism and of pleasure was influentially accepted by John Rawls, A Theory of Justice, 2nd ed., 1999 [passage unchanged from 1st ed., 1971]), pp. 489-90, n. 28 [1st ed., p. 559, n. 27]). Rawls' main argument in this section (§84. Hedonism as a Method of Choice), for the conclusion that hedonistic utilitarianism provides no general decision procedure for ethics that removes the need for deliberative judgment, does not depend on Wittgenstein's views, but as Rawls notes may be supported on premises seemingly granted by the hedonistic utilitarian Henry Sidgwick (1907) just as well. The upshot of Rawls' discussion is that granting that pleasure is no introspectible homogeneous magnitude, as Sidgwick does, removes what Sidgwick elsewhere regards as hedonistic utilitarianism's decisive advantage over pluralistic moral common sense — its specifying a single end (maximizing total pleasure) that, in principle, determines what ought or may be done in each case, epistemic difficulties aside. (Cf. III, xi with III, xiv of Sidgwick 1907.)

Sidgwick, having failed to find any special introspectible quality distinguishing his experiences of pleasure (1907, pp. 127-31), characterized pleasure as “Desirable Consciousness or Feeling of whatever kind” (p. 402). His hedonistic methods come down to judging comparative desirability using affective memory, and this seems to Rawls less to track an independent truth about value than to deliberatively construct one. Cf. Sidgwick: “[E]thical Hedonism has chiefly a negative significance; for the statement that ‘Pleasure is the Ultimate Good’ will only mean that nothing is ultmately desirable except desirable feeling, apprehended as desirable by the sentient individual at the time of feeling it” (p. 129). Sidgwick thus intended momentary perspectives to constrain the correctness of judgments of value made at remote times. And he took the risks of error in comparisons of pleasure experienced at different times seriously (1907, II, iii), as he could not have done had his method given deliberation a more autonomous good-constitutive role, as Rawls came to do. What are aggregated are not quantities of a homogeneous felt quality (which Sidgwick doubts) but experiences' momentarily apprehended degrees of desirability. Deliberation is limited to the role of a hypothetical transtemporal (and ‘transworld’, across possible situations) ideal observer-and-desirer, choosing so as to maximize the aggregate of desirabiliity, as apprehended from momentary perspectives (from which hedonic experience is, presumably, thought of as inseparable). Sidgwick 1907, I, ix, 3, pp. 109-13 and pp. 127-31, on which see Christiano 1992.

Nowadays the social psychologist Daniel Kahneman is similarly realist about magnitudes of momentary pleasure and has a similar project of establishing ‘objective utility’ on the basis of momentary hedonic experience. And he moves the definition of pleasure (“instant utility”) in a similar motivational direction (1999, p. 4), however without the subtlety of Sidgwick's normatively constrained dispositional formulation. Kahneman has advanced his project by experimentally demonstrating errors in hedonic memories, using third person observations and self-reports at the time to test these. He also attempts to explain such errors systematically (1999, 2000).

Supplementing memory by more objective methods may thus increase our confidence that there is a real difference between determinate intrinsic features of momentary experience and the reflective and comparative hedonic judgment and deliberation that discover and use evidence about these. Observing facial expression, posture, and behavior provide some objective evidence and connections with neuroscience and behavioral science may provide more — without abandoning the epistemic primacy of the judgment of the experiencer at the time of experiencing on which Sidgwick insists. (See, generally, his Methods 1907, I , iv, 4; II, ii, iii and vi, which last is most relevant for deciding how Sidgwick would regard this response to Rawls.) NeoSidgwickian responses to Rawls also might use hedonic deliberation and even introspective access to pleasure only to help fix the reference of “pleasure” — rather than as definitive of its presence, magnitude, or nature. Such approaches would fit well with allowing pleasure without awareness, as in n. 32 and the accompanying text at the end of §2.3.4.

6. Prominent early proponents included: for life plans, deliberation and interpersonal justifiability, Rawls, 1999/1971, §§63 & 64, pp. 407ff./358 ff; for projects and agents' perspectives, Bernard Williams, in Smart and Williams 1973, especially pp. 93-101; for outside-in functionalism, David Armstrong 1968 and Hilary Putnam in papers of the same period, reprinted in Putnam 1975, especially chs. 18 and 21.

7. Helm 1994, 2001a, 2001b, 2002. Helm's larger view may have relativist consequences (Hursthouse 2002) that Anscombe would reject. And John McDowell, not Anscombe, seems to have been the formative influence on his work. Helm's views seem more at home as an account of the more cognitively implicated and culturally embedded human emotions, which presumably suggested the view. Anscombe, moreover, wished to distinguish concept-involving emotions from pleasure (but perhaps only from pleasure not caused by thought, if her views were here, as in some other matters, close to those of Kenny [1963, p. 55] and Aquinas [ST 1a 2æ 31,3]). With Helm, all emotion counts as pleasure or pain (as in large part, but not in all cases, for Aristotle; see Cooper 1996a/1999) and is treated similarly.

8. Walther von der Vogelweide, “Elegie”, from the middle of the second stanza. The Middle High German text of lines 21-23, 26-29 and my own verse translation, which omits line 23 to facilitate verse translation, follows. (Lines should be read across the break, which marks a caesural pause.)

swar ich zer werlte kêre                dâ ist nieman frô:
tanzen, lachen, singen                  zergât mit sorgen gar:
nie kristenman gesach sô                jæmerlîche schar....
uns sint unsenften brieve               her von Rôme komen,
uns ist erloubet trûren                 und fröide gar benomen.
daz müet mich inneclîchen               (wir lebten ie viel wol!),
daz ich nû für mîn lachen               weinen kiesen sol.

Wherever in the world I turn            no one's joyous there:
Dancing, laughing, singing              are quite collapsed from cares... 
Letters without charity                 for us from Rome arrive:
Sorrow is allowed us                    but all joy is denied,
So that (we always lived so well!)      I'm troubled so inside,
That I now must choose                  not to laugh but cry.

Textual Note: The complete poem, a very famous one, is available in many editions and anthologies. I follow a version widely printed at least from the nineteenth century until the late twentieth. Recent editions may diverge, notably in omitting “lachen” in line 22 (but not in line 29), which, however, has some manuscript support.

Historical Note: The ‘letters from Rome’ concern the Papal excommunication of the Holy Roman Emperor Frederick II Hohenstaufen in 1227. The cause was his delay in joining the Sixth Crusade —, in which he in time negotiated the peaceful transfer of most of Jerusalem with its Christian shrines to Western Christian rule, while Muslim rule continued over the Sanctuary precinct with al-Aqsa Mosque. This brought peace for a time, despite protests from religious authorities on both sides.

9. Darwin 1998, p. 210. While talking is not pleasure, it is especially facilitated by pleasure, perhaps through spreading activation in the left cerebral cortex, activity in which is implicated in both (see Bartolic et al. 2001 and §3.3, last paragraph, below). For an informed proposal that a category for smiling/laughing is a linguistic/cultural universal, see Wierzbicka, 1999, pp. 282-3, 305. For a book on laughter by a scientist aimed at a general audience, see Provine 2000. For a scientific paper announcing the discovery of laughter in the ultrasonic vocalizations of laboratory rats, see Panksepp 2000b.

10. Darwin (1998), p. 211. Darwin's evolutionary account of emotional expression as in large part “innate and instinctive” (p. 22) is in this edition brought up to date by Paul Ekman, a major contributor to its scientific revival, with references to recent scientific literature and commentary informed by this throughout and especially in his Afterword. The literature to that date, and also Ekman until then, had mainly supported a single positive basic affect but several negative ones, sadness, anger, fear, and disgust. That consensus is now vanished: see Izard 1991, especially Chapter 4, for a division with two basic positive emotions, joy and interest, following Tomkins 1962; neuroscience that may underly such a distinction is discussed in §3.3 below. For conjectures and evidence that there may be more basic positive affects than these see Panksepp 1998 and 2000a; Fredrickson 1998; Ekman 1999a, p. 55; Haidt 2003; Prinz 2004, pp. 155-56; and Tracy and Robins 2004. Still any distinctions between positive affects do not seem as strongly marked as those between plausibly discrete negative emotions such as sadness, anger, fear, and disgust. While cross-culturally validating short lists of discrete basic emotions by translating subjects' identifications of emotions from photographs in their own emotion terms into English, as practiced by Ekman and others in his tradition, has been methodologically criticized (see Ekman 1999b for some summary accounts with his replies), such criticism even if correct would not invalidate the category of positive affect, which is strongly supported crossculturally and uncontroversial, even if there is differentiation within it. See Wierzbicka 1999 (pp. 279-82, 292-3, 305-7) and Harkins and Wierzbicka 2001 for a taste of some of the relevant ethnographic and linguistic literature, which is but a very small part of the relevant evidence. (The precise nature of the distinction between positive and negative affect is not yet resolved; see n. 1, ¶¶4 and 5 above and n. 39 below.)

11. For an entry to the relevant scientific literature, see Preston and de Waal 2002. Some research reviewed there suggests that perception or representation of emotion in others requires evoking the affect, to some degree, in oneself, because of overlap among the responsible neural systems. Emotional contagion, as when an infant is distressed by another's distress, without fully distinguishing self from other, may, with the addition of cognitive resources for making this distinction, result in the development of empathy. And so it may be with contagious laughter and the acquisition of a concept of pleasure applicable both to others and to oneself as one among others. Studies of autism, in which deficiencies in labeling one's own emotions seem connected with problems in precise attributions to others, may support such a view. For references, see Preston and de Waal 2002.

12. “[W]e cannot be occupied objectively and subjectively at the same instant ....” Bain, 1876, pp. 437-8. Cf. J.S. Mill's report of William Hamilton's view that sensory knowledge and sensory pleasure are inversely proportional (1872/1879, p. 435). This line of thought may go back at least to the mideighteenth century work of Johan Georg Sulzer (Gardiner, Metcalf, and Beebe-Center 1937, p. 260). While the efficacy of distraction in relieving suffering may be no news, still it is good to see it neuroscientifically confirmed (Drevets and Raichle 1998). That a similar effect holds for positive affect (which facilitates some cognitive tasks in the longer term; Fredrickson 1998, Isen 2002, Bartolic et al. 2001) has not been so clear. The work of Raichle and collaborators may make it so and seems of great theoretical importance besides (Gusnard et al. 2001, Fox et al. 2005). It may also explain the seeming paradox that focusing one's attention on one's pain (like distraction from it) lessens one's affective suffering, by showing how these similarly engage tasks that turn down the brain's default network, which includes systems more directly monitoring and representing one's bodily and affective condition that are in part responsible for the affective experience of pain or at least for its cognitive awareness (§2.3.4, ¶3). (But this is new science, and both it and especially its interpretation, here and in the main text, should be flagged as tentative and subject to change.)

13. See Larue, 1991, p. 31 for ancient Mesopotamia, p. 35 for ancient Egypt, and Lieh-tzu, 1960, for the Taoist classic's account of the ancient Chinese libertine hedonist Yang-chu in Ch. 7. The Cârvâka school material anthologized in Radhakrishnan and Moore, 1957, Sourcebook, Ch. 7, pp. 227-49, is the surviving philosophical material growing out of a largely lost apparently quite ancient hedonist and materialist tradition. Later libertine literary traditions abound. On the influential one of eighteenth century Europe, see Hundert 1994.

14. III, 6. This may be found in Radhakrishnan and Moore, 1957, Sourcebook, at p. 63. Such seeming identities in early Indian thought became the subjects of later interpretation. This bliss (the traditional translation of the Sanskrit ânanda) was later interpreted as a nondual, objectless state.

15. Philótês (love, friendship, affection) identified with gêthosúnê (pleasure, joy — the word is cognate with “joy”), Empedocles, Fragment 17, lines 20-24. These may be found in Kirk, Raven, and Schofield 1983, pp. 289-90, and also in other collections of presocratic Greek philosophy and in editions of Empedocles. Aphrodite is here understood as immanent in nature. However, what survives in Lucretius as mere poetic personification of pleasure (contrast this in the opening lines of his de rerum natura with the naturalist debunking of a Divine role in reproduction late in its Book IV) may in Empedocles signify more.

Compare with the Christian Bible's “God is love” (agápê, translating Hebrew ahabha; Latin Vulgate caritas), at 1 John 4:16 (cf. John 13:34 and 15:9-12) in its context, 4:7-21, of expansive interpretation of the Hebrew Bible's commandments of love, Leviticus 19:18 and Deuteronomy 6:5, emphasized at Matthew 22:36-40, Mark 12:28-31 and Luke 10:25-28. Early Christians might thus view their mutual love as participating in God's. Augustine interpreted the first text as literally identifying love with the Holy Spirit, the third person of the Christian Trinity (De Trinitate, VI, 5, p. 207). The Augustinian tradition of thinking of pleasure as willing and of all willing as love lies behind later Christian philosophical accounts of pleasure, such as Ockham's and Brentano's, discussed in §2.3.1 below.

Empedocles' linking pleasure with love reflects Indo-European etymology: the root prî- figures in words for both pleasure and love (Watkins 2000, ad loc., Monier-Williams 1899, Rhys Davids 1922-1925). Modern German “Freude” (joy) and “Freund” (friend), English “friend” derive from this root; so do Germanic and Sanskrit words for wife. On the possibilities and problems for deriving from prî- Greek phília (liking, friendship, affection, love) and cognates such as the first word of this note, see Landfester 1996, pp. 35-38. That love is a positive affect (or even consists mainly of such), however, goes against the self-reports and conceptualizations of some non-Western cultures (e.g., China) — as also against some current in the West when romantic love was typically thwarted by social constraints.

16. Philebus 51A-52C.

17. Philebus 31D-32E, Republic 585B-586B, Timaeus 64A-65B. Van Riel 1999 and 2000 have very useful accounts of Plato's view and the relation of Aristotle's to it that I have in part followed here. The affective neuroscientist Jaak Panksepp, in the first textbook on that subject, makes a proposal similar to Plato's and discusses relevant science (1998, pp. 181-86).

Plato may be interpreted as taking all pleasure to be intentional (§2.3), but perhaps only because it always perceptually representing events that fulfill needs in the same way as perception generally is about what it presents. Daniel Russell (2004), in interpreting Plato, goes further, by applying a distinction explicit in the later ancient and medieval tradition, and again nowadays (see n. 27, below), between pleasure as a feeling (or ‘sensation’) and pleasure as an emotional attitude, which is for Russell always directed toward something being the case (D. Russell, 2004, p. 4), as in the account discussed in §2.3.2 below. But Plato may have regarded these as belonging to the same affective natural continuum, perhaps always intentional (whether about things, features of perceptual experience, or states of affairs), but not regimented by construing all their intentionality as toward propositions (which may lead to problems, as we shall see in §2.3.2). (Such accounts presumably do not count moods, some of which seem contentless, in pleasure, which they presumably construe as always a response to something rather than more inclusively [n. 1 and accompanying text]). For Russell, as for Helm and Moran (§1.2), (emotional) pleasure is holistically value- and concern-laden. This seems to be no part of Plato's general account of pleasure (and it seems to be a general, not a disjunctive, account that he offers). Neither does it hold for all the ‘pure pleasure’ allowed into the good life in the Philebus (51B-52B, 63E), as this includes pleasure in simple sights, sounds, and smells, in which infants and animals free of virtue- and evaluative-thought-involving projects can share. (The distinction between pure and impure pleasure thus cuts across any bodily-or-sensory pleasure versus intellectual-or-emotional pleasure divide.) With these tentative caveats, Russell's recent book is an excellent place to look for further citations and creative interpretation of Plato's many treatments of pleasure, of varying date, with an eye to their connections with his moral views and to developments in later Platonist thought, beyond the summary account of a supposed single mature Platonic view offered here.

18. For references to Descartes' sketchy and perhaps only partial functional view of pleasure, on which Spinoza presumably built, see n. 3, ¶3, above (and especially CSM II, p. 57; AT VII, p. 83 from Meditation VI and the Passions passage cited there).

Spinoza: 1677, III, Proposition 11, Scholium; cf. III, Definition II following Proposition 59. (Spinoza's Latin term is “laetitia”. This is explicitly used inclusively. Two recent translators into English, Parkinson and Shirley, translate by “pleasure”, but Curley by “joy”, following Descartes' predominant usage of French cognates.)

Kant: 1800, 1974 translation, p. 100; Academy edition, VII, pp. 231-32. For further citations of Kant's views, see the Kant 1790/2000 entry in the Bibliography.

19. Protrepticus B87, 1984, p. 2414; Nicomachean Ethics VII, 11-14 and X, 1-6.

20. Late antiquity: See Emilsson 1998, van Riel 2000, and Knuuttila 2004.

Recent Philosophy: Ryle, 1949, 1954a, 1954b; his view is that pleasure is not an episode but, at least in the cases of enjoyment he emphasizes, a kind of dispositional interest or attention in one's activities or experiences. For more, see n. 4 with its corresponding text and the Bibliography notes to his works.

Welfare Economics: Amartya Sen, e.g., 1985, develops a nearly Aristotelian view of human well-being, based in functionings of capacities, mainly for the purpose of discussing distributive justice.

21. Csikszentmihalyi, however, unlike Aristotle, distinguishes enjoyment (his subject, supposedly experienced in ‘flow’) from pleasure, which he regards as a passive state often connected with Platonic restorations (1990, pp. 45-48). Flow experiences are ones in which one loses one's sense of self, engaged in one's use of skills that are proportionate to the challenges they meet, which absorb one's full concentration and reward it with immediate feedback. (1996, pp. 111-13, lists nine comditions.) Csikszentmihalyi, in his wise books, overplays his hand, by connecting flow to both enjoyment and to the perfecting of skills (e.g., 1990, p. 65), whereas exercising already perfected skills seems often more enjoyable than perfecting them, which may be hard work — and also by suggesting at times that achievement in the presence of concentration is better correlated with positive affect or a species of it (enjoyment of activities) than it is, although he at times acknowledges that quite simple and unskilled activities may give moments of flow, too. In his 1997 he acknowledges that self-ratings of happiness are higher for eating and socializing than for activities he more approves of (USA ed., pp. 36-37 [UK ed., pp. 34-35]; see also pp. 101 [98] and 117-122 [115-119]). Csikszentmihalyi says that the self-report method, on which his research program has been based, is unsatisfactory; but that is the evidence he has, and it seems to indicate that flow correlates with self-reports of concentration best, with those of enjoyment fairly well, but with self-ratings of happiness not that well at all. (However, since the exercise and development of skills he recommends often brings deferred benefits, including ones for affect, his advice may still often be good from a long-term hedonic point of view, even when the required training and practice are not enjoyable at the time.) The distinction between flow and happiness may relate to that between dopaminergic engagement and opioid bliss discussed in §3.3 below.

22. For the criticism of Aristotle: Mill 1872/1979, pp. 430-36 . I have in the text supplied much of the explanation of Aristotle's views and of the force and historical context of Mill's criticism, which in the original is directed largely at quotations from his book's target, William Hamilton, whom Mill took to represent Aristotle's view of pleasure. (Hamilton's philosophical reputation did not long survive Mill's criticisms, with the delayed result that this major philosophical work of Mill's followed its target into obscurity.) A very similar counterexample about a smell is given by Anthony Kenny, followed by an Aristotelian response (1963, pp. 146-50).

For similar objections to the effect that excellence of music and of the listener's auditory and musical capacity are neither necessary nor sufficient for the pleasure of listening to music, see Brentano 1921/1969, 26a, p. 156 and 1929/1981, I,iii,5/p. 14 (not even with attention added) and van Riel 1999 and 2000a. The case of listening to music, while mentioned by Aristotle, seems to be an especially difficult one for his theory and to be well suited to making Mill's point. Musical and auditory excellence in a listener combined with excellence of work and performance need not yield great pleasure, for all the excellence of the faculties and objects concerned, unless these are defined in terms of affective expressiveness and its successful communication. See Madell 2002 for a different account of pleasure in music and a general account of pleasure discussed critically in §3.1, ¶5, below. To turn to the different case of pleasure in musical performance, orchestra members are often bored during well-practiced and technically near-flawless performances of familiar works. (As van Riel points out in another context, Aristotle's attempts to address loss of pleasure with repetition and practice [NE X,4:1175a3-10] are unconvincing.) Audiences similarly find such performances less pleasant than those the conductor has managed to vary and thus make new and appealing to the performers. (I draw here on a presentation by Ellen Langer of her empirical research.)

For the normative agreement with Aristotle: Mill 1871, Ch. 2, ¶¶5ff. The evaluative argument aims to prove only the higher ‘quality’ (by which Mill means excellence in rank and choiceworthiness of the ‘higher pleasures’; see the OED, ad loc. quality, 8), rather than, as in Plato and Aristotle, also their greater pleasantness — but on the same ground of the authoritative choice of intellectuals who are supposedly uniquely qualified to judge by virtue of their past acquaintance with experiences of both kinds. Systematic errors in affective memory (Kahneman 1999 and 2000), however, would provide grounds for skepticism about the adequacy of any actual hedonic memory representations relied on in such judging, even if the intellectuals' impartiality and freedom from self-deception were is granted. While Mill also believes pleasure is experientially heterogeneous, he marks that as a separate point. Presumably, like Aristotle, he believe that all pleasure nevertheless is, in some way, similar, despite specific and evaluative differences. He seems not to doubt that comparisons of quantity can be made and that these differ in principle from comparisons in terms of choiceworthiness. His position is thus different from Rawls' discussed in n. 5.

23. Sidgwick 1907, I, ix, 3, pp. 109-13 and pp. 127-31, on which see Christiano 1992. For more on the interpretation, influence, and development of Sidgwick's views, see n. 5 above. Broad, 1930, pp. 237-38. Derek Parfit apparently adopts the view that Broad only suggests: pleasure is experience wanted or liked at the time (1984, p. 493). Cf. Edwards 1979, pp. 73-74 and Warner 1987, p. 129.

24.See, e.g., Emilsson 1998 and Knuuttila 2004, pp. 98-100, on Plotinus, an extreme case of this; on the more moderate and medievally influential Ibn Sina (Avicenna), see Knuuttila 2004, pp. 218-22.

25. William of Ockham 2001 (c. 1317-26), especially pp. 384-86 (420-22) and Question 3, pp. 373-90 (403-28), generally; McGrade 1981, 1987. This last provides a very useful brief account also of some other fourteenth century views, with further references. Those referred to unnamed in the text are, first, Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham, and then Robert Holkot (spelled Holcot occasionally, as in the Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy entry), on all of whom I rely wholly on McGrade 1987, especially pp. 77-78. I owe thanks to Professor McGrade also for much generous early help in revising this note and the accompanying text; he is innocent, however, of the final result. Knuuttila observes that Ockham largely follows John Duns Scotus (2004, pp. 268-73; for Scotus's examples used similarly to distinguish pleasure from the loving on which it depends as a quality, see pp. 270-71). However, for two differences between Scotus and Ockham, see Hirvonen 2004, pp. 127 and 149; Ch. 4, pp. 107-70 is relevant more generally.

The picture of affective states as involving assent of the rational mind to presentation of something as good or bad goes back to the Stoics (see n. 40 for references). Ockham has a more complicated picture. Following Augustine, the will's acceptance or rejection may go against the evaluative judgment of the intellect. And like Scotus, he makes pleasure a natural but not an exceptionless result of loving acceptance, it seems for a combination of empirical, theological, and Aristotelian reasons. (Pain, or distress, may block pleasure in an act. In his interpretation and appropriation of Aristotle, pleasure is not an act but presumably can be blocked by the act on which it depends being impeded, and pain presumably blocks pleasure in this way. And this allows that the devil in his damnation gets no pleasure from lovingly accepting any fulfillment of his desire, following the theological tradition that includes Scotus.)

The Western medieval controversy often takes off from passages in Augustine where “fruitio” is defined as clinging to something with love for its own sake (De Doctrina Christiana [On Christian Instruction/Doctrine], I,4) and discussed further as the attitude we should have only toward God, De Trinitate X, 10; cf. Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiæ 1a 2æ 11. Augustine defines pleasure as assent toward what we will when cherishing/enjoying/possessing (“fruendo”) it (City of God XIV, 6). Ockham's and others' views seem to have emerged in theological debate centrally concerned with loving acceptance (appropriately, only of God) as the supremely ultimate object of one's love (“fruitio”, traditionally translated “enjoyment”) and pleasure in this. The view seems to apply also to the relation of pleasure to other acts of will on which it may depend (including Ockham's ‘middle acts’ that merely take their objects to be noninstrumentally or intrinsically good, without taking them to be, or not to be, most supremely and ultimately good and desirable).

Ockham observes, in passing, that pleasure may be said, strictly speaking, not to have an object (since it is not an act), as the act of loving on which it depends does (2001, p. 401 (445). Kant's discussion of the relations of aesthetic pleasure and judgment (e.g., Kant 1790/2000, §9) has recently provoked similar philosophical discussion about its proper interpretation, on whether this involves such pleasure itself having intentionality or else its being distinct from judgments that alone have this. See Ginsborg 2005, §§ 2.31 and 2.33. Kant's intentions aside, some of the differing causal accounts proposed by his interpreters should be scientifically testable, as some of the claims of the medievals also may be. While the substance-attribute-like distinction between acts and their qualities (such as pleasure is explicitly in Scotus, Knuuttila 2004, p. 272; Ockham also emphasizes that pleasure is not, strictly speaking, an act) may seem pointless, like that between psychic elements and theirs (e.g., hedonic tones) in introspectionist psychology (§1.1, last ¶). However, differing models of intentional and causal, including recursive, structure may lie behind some medievals' use of such distinctions, which may suggest different models of neural processing with testable predictions.

26. Mulligan 2004, pp. 83-86 summarizes Brentano's earlier views as well as the later ones discussed here. a Chisholm 1986, 1987 and Katkov 1940, pp. 178-87 provide clear exposition and complementary interpretations (see the Bibliography note on Katkov comparing these; Mulligan 2004 is compatible with Katkov's reading) of Brentano's later views, easier to read than Brentano's late dictated works. Brentano 1929/1981: Part I, iii, 5 and 7, pp. 14 and 16; Part II, 1, 28; p. 59. Brentano 1921/1969, §§25-26a, pp. 154-56, for the treatment of intellectually caused pleasure interpreted in Chisholm 1987, pp. 61-63. The untranslated German of Brentano 1907/1979, n. 39, pp. 35-40, is also important; see the Bibliography note on this.

Brentano presumably draws, however indirectly, on medieval Aristotelian scholastic sources, such as those mentioned in n. 25, just above, for his view of reflexive loving. He had a thorough grounding in scholastic philosophy and aspired to found a modern Christian philosophy on this model. He was strongly influenced by Descartes and by the British empiricists as well.

27. Feldman 1997c/1988, 2002. Cf. Sumner 1996, pp. 88-91, 106-110, who however consistently uses “enjoyment” for the attitude, reserving “pleasure” for ‘sensations' that are supposed to be among enjoyment's objects, while Feldman distinguishes between ‘propositional’ or ‘attitudinal pleasure’ (which in his 2002 he identifies with enjoyment) and the ‘sensory pleasures’ that figure among its objects. Recent philosophers' explicit classification of pleasure as an attitude seems to begin with Nowell-Smith (1954), pp. 111-15, on which see the Bibliography annotation and Perry 1967, pp. 204-14. Nowell-Smith's ‘pro-attitudes’ seem to be all conative, and thus such as analytic philosophers of following decades typically lump together as desire.

28. Attribution of propositional attitudes is no philosophically agreed-upon and clear-cut affair and at least sometimes may be only a pragmatic way of speaking innocent of any substantive claims for an ontology of facts or propositions or any attribution of combinatorial representational powers of mind. Cf.; e.g., Churchland 1979, pp. 100-107, on which abstract objects are used to conveniently index psychological events, as numbers are used in science, without any commitment to these abstract objects being involved substantively in either physical or psychological structure.

29. For reports of experiments showing affect coming loose from what under normal conditions would have been its object, see Berridge and Winkielman 2003, pp. 185-87; Murphy and Zajonc 1993; Murphy, Monahan, and Zajonc, 1995. For a later perspective on the two latter, see Zajonc 2000; for the theoretical view that inspired them, see Zajonc 1980 and 1984. For a warning about the use of “nonconscious” and the like in writings of Zajonc and his collaborators, see the Bibliography annotation to Zajonc 1994. For a current cognitive perspective on affect applied to the interpretation of these experiments, see Clore and Colcombe 2003 or Clore, Gasper, and Garvin 2001.

30. Cf. Empedocles, n. 15 and corresponding text at end of 2.1 above; Plato (more likely, a compilation of his school), Definitions 413b10 (on agápêsis, which bridges the semantic space between loving, wanting, welcoming, affection, enjoying, and contentment with); Augustine, CD XIV, 6, where pleasure is said to be possessing/cherishing/enjoying (fruendo) assent to what we will; Augustine, De Trinitate VIII, 8, love loving others and itself; Sidgwick, 1907, pp. 110-11, 127-31, discussed in n. 5 above; Brentano, §2.3.1, ¶2 and n. 25 above, loving one's experiencing of something; Bertrand Russell 1930/1980, pp. 155-57/110-111 (end of Ch. X), friendly interest in persons and things; Feldman, 1997b/1988, especially p. 97, welcoming; Frijda, 2001, pp. 76-78, accepting a stimulus.

31. On Nyâya and Vaisesika criticisms of views defended by Buddhists, see Matilal 1986, ch. 9, “Pleasure and Pain” and Halbfass 1997. A relevant passage from Jayanta Bhatta's Nyâyamañjarî is translated in Potter 1977, p. 356, ¶56. (I thank Arindam Chakrabarti for introducing me to this literature.)

Moore 1903, pp. 87-89. While Moore followed Brentano in adopting an intentional (act/object or attitude/content) analysis of conscious states generally, in this case he intends to be directly following Plato. The possibility of such separation of bare affect from cognitive awareness may arise in Plato, who although he at Timaeus 64A-65B seems to take conscious feeling to be required for pleasure, in the passage cited by Moore writes of pleasure as though it is separable from full cognitive awareness — but valueless to the subject then (Philebus 21BC, 60DE). Aristotle seems to take a similar view of pleasure during sleep (Rhetoric I,11:1370a15-16; EE I,5:1216a2-5; Politics, VIII, 4:1339a16-18), although it is unclear whether or how this can be accommodated to his views of pleasure discussed in §2.2.2. But Locke seems to deny the very possibility of pleasure during sleep (Essay II,i,11). The sometimes peaceful appearance of sleepers, that sleep is often desired and the process of falling asleep welcomed, and that sleep typically leaves one refreshed, as pleasure does, pull toward allowing that sleep is pleasant. Perhaps the difficulty of thinking of sleep experiences as owned by subjects, when they neither are cognitively aware of them at the time nor remember them later, counts decisively for Locke against such pleasure in sleep being anyone's pleasure and therefore against its being pleasure at all. However, perhaps taking place in an organism is ownership enough. And on a neoBuddhist or neoHumean view that requires no subject beyond particular experiences, even an isolated experience of the right kind might unproblematically be pleasure on its own, however unowned by any continuant subject of experience.

32. Berridge and Winkielman 2003. That affective processes underlying pleasure may proceed without awareness is widely allowed in recent scientific literature; e.g., LeDoux 1996; Berridge 1996; pp. 19-21; Berridge 1999; pp. 525-37; Winkielman and Berridge 2003; Berridge 2004; Winkielman, Berridge and Wilbarger 2005; Damasio 1999; Shizgal 1999; Frijda 2001, pp. 75-78; Davidson 2003. However, usually no distinction such as Block's is intended, but only that neural, cognitive or behavioral components of emotional response, without any consciousness, may thus occur. (Lane 2000 is an exception; he seems to be working with a distinction and vocabulary similar to, although not drawn from, Block's.) Contrast Locke, for whom such “[t]hings in their present enjoyment are what they seem; the apparent and real good are, in this case, always the same. For the Pain or Pleasure being just so great, and no greater, than it is felt, the present Good or Evil is really so much as it appears” (Essay, II, xxi, 58). “Therefore, as to present Pleasure and Pain the Mind, as has been said, never mistakes that which is really good and evil; that which is the greater Pleasure, or the lesser Pain, is really as it appears” (II, xxi, 63). Cf. the similar Epicurean view as reported in Cicero, de finibus I, 33 and 55. But cognitive processing is a matter of degree and there may be room for pleasure or pain to be felt and matter to our well- or ill-being without any cognitively sophisticated appearing or seeming. There seem to be distinct verbal, psychological, and practical questions at issue here: whether the word “pleasure” is to be tied to full conscious awareness, whether immediate feeling of some kind may be present unnoticed in various ways, and, if so, what rational or moral claims our own (or is it unowned?) unnoticed pleasure and pain, and similarly unnoticed fetal or animal pleasure and pain, have on our prudence, obligation, compassion, and care. See Ekman and Davidson, 1994, Question 8: “Can Emotions Be Nonconscious”, pp. 283-318, for discussion of that issue and also the Bibliography note to Zajonc 1994, which appears in that section. Gerald Clore's contribution there takes the view that emotion is (as a conceptual matter) conscious; “feeling” is used with a similar implication by Damasio (1999, 2003) and now by Berridge and his collaborators. But scientists generally agree that conscious affects include or involve component processes that may exist in the absence of consciousness or at least of full awareness; the view that pleasure's nature is exhausted by its being perceived as such seems unrepresented, at least among scientists, nowadays. But again, the difference with Locke may be in large part verbal; emotion and pleasure, for the scientists, include totally nonconscious processes.

33. Sidgwick, 1907, pp. 125-27. Sidgwick's quotations are, respectively, from Herbert Spencer and Alexander Bain. Daniel Kahneman's (1999, p. 4) definition, in terms of strength of a disposition to continue, faces similar problems — as also do Richard Brandt's (1979, pp. 40-41) and Derek Parfit's (1984, p. 493). Excitement certainly seems not reducible to pleasure; someone excited can be either happy or having a panic attack. Alternative accounts of activation or arousal exist. One is that this is a single psychologically basic dimension independent of pleasure (J.A. Russell; e.g., in his 1991 and in Russell and Barrett 1999). On another, its magnitude derives from those of positive affect and negative affect summed together (David Watson; e.g., in his 2000). But there that may well be multiple ‘arousal’ or ‘activation’ systems in the brain, some often closely connected with affect or motivation but others not. For further references and discussion, see n. 39 below and the accompanying text in §3.3.

Vasubandhu, the Kashmiri-educated Buddhist from Peshawar (c. 400 C.E.), whose Abhidharmakosa (1923-31) is a foundational psychological text for Northern Buddhists, avoided defining pleasure (sukha) in terms of current desire by defining it instead through desire for it arising after it has stopped (1984, p. 66). This allows calm, desireless pleasure, but remains relational and is silent about states that are unending or otherwise not followed by others. And it may be falsified by Plato's example of a fragrance that we enjoy but do not miss once it is gone. (But perhaps there is a very short-term desire in such cases that goes unnoticed especially when we have other things to experience or do. And if only a typical functional connection or causal tendency were intended, the earlier counterexamples might be handled as well. However, such a characterization would not provide a real definition of an intrinsic state, such as pleasure would be on the simple picture and, it seems, on some Buddhist views as well.)

Bertrand Russell, in his behaviorist-influenced 1921, also accomodates inactive pleasure by analyzing pleasure relationally and negatively, as the property of mental occurrences consisting in their stimulating no reflex or voluntary movements that do not tend to prolong the stimulating occurrences themselves (1921, pp. 71-72). This seems too broad, if it includes states of freezing in fright and of motionless depression. It seems also too narrow, if it excludes anything that causes a consummatory act that ends the appetitive motivation that formerly sustained it, as eating, drinking, and male sexual activity typically do. Swallowing may be caused by tasting, but that does not show that the taste was not pleasant, although more prolonged savoring may show that someone enjoys it more —and similarly for the other cases. (Since events in a complex system typically have many effects, and these effects will as well, doubly negative analyses such as Russell's seem especially unpromising.) Purely behavioral or motivational analyses, it seems, will not do. To the extent that ones in terms of accepting or attending to a stimulus come closer to the mark (Frijda 2001, pp.76-78), this may be because they build pleasure into the account rather than analyzing it in other terms. Russell came close to this in his 1930/1968, pp. 155-57/110-111, as detailed in n. 30 alongside similar views. The text accompanying that note is also relevant.

34. Alston 1967, pp. 345-46; Findlay 1961, pp. 175-78; McDougall, 1911, pp. 324-25.

35. Katz 1982; Katz 1986, pp. 47-48, 135-36; Morillo 1992, Morillo 1995. The first cited passage from Katz 1986 suggests that pleasure is immediately appreciated, or liked, in its experiential moment; the second that pleasure figures as a proper part of (full) desire (better: of some kind or kinds of desire or motivation) although it is also able to exist on its own, as in the stance views of §2.3.3 above.

That first passage's view of pleasure, its value, and their relations to desire is elaborated and discussed in Kagan 1992, §II and contrasted with some others. In Kagan's terms, Katz's view of pleasure was nonreductionist (p. 174-75; not regarding an experience's being pleasant as just a matter of its being desired) and his view of hedonic goodness objective (p. 175; i.e., as not consisting in its being desired but in something less relational and more intrinsic). The same first passage from Katz 1986, along with some others, is quoted in Sobel 1999, but with some misreading of Katz's intentions, which were (as Kagan suggests in his elaboration, pp. 173-74) more to show how pleasure may be identified or indicated than to offer a substantive alternative to an experiential view of pleasure's nature (which Katz thought part of the truth about it) or to Sidgwick's view, which he sought to interpret (or to amend in a hedonism-friendly way). Doing so (as in the passage first cited above) avoids the unintuitiveness that some (e.g., Feldman 1997a) see in interpretations of Sidgwick's views that make pleasure intrinsically valuable but itself constituted by its relation to desire. A similar response, of having pleasure constitutively include a self-referential liking intrinsic to itself, was suggested by David Bengtsson, “The Intrinsic Value of Pleasure Experiences”, Lund Phlosophy Reports, 2003:1, pp. 29-61, at pp. 35, 43, 45 (http://www.fil.lu.se/files/prodok54.pdf [if this fails, do a Google search and follow the link to this web page]). Medievals, as mentioned in §2.3.1, also considered such possibilities of reflexive structure. The more minimal such immediate liking is, while still having the causal power to extend to (full) desire in appropriate contexts, the closer to the simple picture of pleasure and of its functional place in the mind.

Sidgwick's official account seems to allow that pleasure's relation to desire may be variable and sometimes only counterfactual even in higher animals, rather than such a relation being constitutive of pleasure, as is sometimes supposed to be his view: “I ... propose to define Pleasure — when we are considering its “strict value” for purposes of quantitative comparison — as a feeling which, when experienced by intelligent beings, is at least implicitly apprehended as desirable or — in cases of comparison — preferable” (Sidgwick 1907, p. 127). This seems more an account of the use of the term in the practical ‘empirical method’ of ethics that gives that chapter its name than an account of pleasure's nature. Thomas Christiano (1992) discusses some tensions in Sidgwick's subtle value hedonistic account and suggests these may be resolved by taking desire as only evidence for pleasure's goodness. Taking desire, choice, and pursuit thus, as evidence for pleasure's value, rather than as constitutive of that, was suggested generally on behalf of the hedonistic tradition in Katz 1986, pp. 104-5. And one may regard pleasure as caused or even partly constituted by desire, in some cases, while still maintaining that hedonic reasons are always given wholly by the quality of hedonic experience and not at all directly by the mere direction of one's desire (Scanlon 2002, pp. 337-42; to which cf. Sidgwick 1907, p. 46: “[D]esire is often an element of a state of consciousness which as a whole [emphasis added] is highly pleasurable.”)

Cf. Stocker and Hegeman, 1996, pp. 36-37, where desire is laden with pleasure, and pp. 28-37 more generally. Murat Aydede's (2000) analysis of physical pleasure as a subpersonal reactive ‘attitude’ also may be regarded as a move in a similar direction. And Karl Duncker's (1941, pp. 414-15) phenomenological analysis has anticipatory pleasure as part of desire but takes this as different in kind from ‘actual pleasure’ and also requires that pleasure always have an object (pp. 399-400).

36. As in many evolved brain systems, good-enough results are achieved by combining different sorts of information requiring similar treatment (here, minimally, attention of a kind). Such convergence on midbrain dopamine systems may explain people's being attracted to and addicted to novelty and gambling in much the same ways as to food or sex.

37. For a recent (written in 2003) summary account and citations, see Depue and Morrone-Strupinsky, 2005, §§6.2.15-17, pp. 328-31, especially pp. 332-33; also Strick 2004. The scientific papers and accessible editorial commentaries in Houk, Davis, and Beiser 1995 still collectively provide a good introduction to the relevant physiological, computational, and theoretical literature. Chapters 1 and 2, all of Part III, and all editorial commentaries are especially recommended. My account has benefited from oral presentations and communications, including one in October 2003, by Wolfram Schultz, whose views in his contributions to this volume I mainly follow. As typically in new and developing science, controversy about details continues and even the large picture is subject to change. (For hypotheses going beyond the current scientific consensus, see two special issues of journals: “Reward and Decision Making: 0pportunities and Future Directions,” Neuron 36, October 10, 2002; “Computational Models of Neuromodulation,” Neural Networks, 15, 4-6, June-July 2002.)

While the mesolimbic dopaminergic projection to the nucleus accumbens (in the ventral striatum) is usually emphasized in pleasure interpretations of brain self-stimulation and reward (centrally, what an animal will work for; i.e., ‘learn’ to perform a supposedly arbitrary operant task with higher than baseline probability, when the reward has been made contingent on the task — although other motivational effects on behavior, e.g., its speed or rate, and on pleasure, are sometimes included as well) and may be most important in selecting actions, midbrain dopamine projections to other forebrain structures, including to regions of the functionally heterogeneous prefrontal cortex (Rolls 1999, 2000), also play relevant roles and that to the ventral pallidum may more directly produce pleasure (Berridge 2003a). The striatal-thalamic-cortical circuits for affect/motivation, cognition, and motor planning seem computationally similar. While these seem largely segregated (e.g., Strick 2004), the functionally integrated loops from the striatum to the midbrain and back (with dopamine) tend to overlap unidirectionally, so that the affective and motivational ‘limbic’ circuit may more easily control salience and processing in the cognitive and motor circuits, and thus the direction of the organism's attention and behavior (Haber, Fudge, and McFarland 2000). These functions of dopamine neurons (and some of neurons with related and perhaps homologous neuromodulators; e.g., octopamine in invertebrates from sea slugs to honeybees) are of special interest for affect, attention, and motivation. But other classes of neurons in vertebrate brains have similar computational powers (Schultz and Dickinson, 2000). See n. 43 and the accompanying entry text in §3.3, below, for more on dopaminergic function.

38. Gorgias 495D2-497D7. Cf. Phaedo 60BC. Recent science sheds new light on the subject of Plato's discussion. Nader, Bechara and van der Kooy (1997) distinguish two neural motivation systems, on the basis of experimental dissociations: one for feeding when hungry and a second for feeding when satiated. Only the first is dopamine-dependent; the issue thus connects with those discussed in notes 37 and 43 and their accompanying text. On the general question of whether pleasure and pain are dimensional opposites, see n. 1 above, especially paragraphs 4 and 5, and notes 39 and 45 below with the text accompanying the latter.

39. Similarly in 1896 Wilhelm Wundt, the founder of German experimental psychology, proposed a three-dimensional theory of affect, with excitement/depression and tension (or action-tendency)/relaxation, figuring alongside pleasure/pain. For discussion and interpretation of changes in Wundt's views before and after this first edition, see Titchener 1908, Ch. IV. For similar but neurologically-supported recent views, see Heilman 2000 and Heller, Koven, and Miller 2003, which also raises doubts about the adequacy of dimensional approaches to affect. Controversies over the number of dimensions, which axes to privilege, and whether pleasure and pain are opposites (or instead, perhaps, to be identified, respectively, with Wundt's action-tendency and depression, which would approximate to David Watson's view) have continued to the present day. For literature of the debate on the dimensional structure of emotion space, see the special section of the Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 76:803-64 for May, 1999 (Diener 1999) and, for an application with bearing on our topic, Depue and Collins, 1999. James Russell is a leading exponent of positive and negative affect (pleasure and pain) as polar opposites; John Cacioppo (see his 1999 and Ito and Cacioppo 1999 and 2001) among the opponents (while acknowledging that the two tend to exclude each other at high intensities) as are David Watson and Robert Thayer, discussed in n. 1, ¶¶4 and 5 above. This controversy may be settled at some levels by the advance of neuroscience, but cultural and individual differences, which interact with sex and gender, may defeat any single overall answer — at least at the level of self-report. (For example, it is sometimes said that traditionally Chinese women have been socialized to be indifferent to, or even to feel bad about, their own feeling good.)

40. Interpretation of Epicurus' mainly fragmentary surviving writings (1994; Long and Sedley 1987) remains controversial on pleasure's nature and unity; but see Merlan 1960; Gosling and Taylor 1982, Ch. 19, pp. 365-96; Mitsis 1987; Striker 1993; Preuss 1994, Ch. Six (which discusses earlier interpretations at length before giving his own); Cooper 1999a; Erler 1999. On the Stoics, see Long and Sedley (texts in §§57 and 65, in both volumes), Seneca 1917-25, Sorabji 2000, Nussbaum 1994 and 2001.

41. Aristotle (NE I,viii:1099a24-31 and EE I,i:1214a1-6) criticizes a poem (sometimes credited to Theognis of Megara) for stating that the most pleasant thing is to attain what one desires. Modern Western society and philosophers (e.g., Hobbes, De Homine, 11, ¶15; 1658/1991, p. 54), in contrast, have often privileged desire in their views of human nature and value. The modern disparagement of calm and contentment as complacency and the touting of ‘change’ as if all change were good reverse the predominant bias in favor of stability and inaction in traditional societies and past civilizations, expressed, for example, in Plato's and Aristotle's view of the best life and society. For recent social criticism advocating increasing appetites to achieve ‘pleasure’ (rather than habituating ‘comfort’), see the economist Tibor Scitovsky's The Joyless Society (1992/1976), Ch. Four, “Pleasure Versus Comfort”. The science used there is rather old; Kahneman 1999, pp. 13ff., provides some critical discussion and references toward what would be needed for an updated appraisal. Scitovsky seems to suppose that pleasure derives from a single underlying arousal dimension; pleasure is return toward an optimal level of this (much as it is return to something like homeostatic equilibrium for Plato, §2.2.1 above).

42. Buddhist Canon, 1995 trans., Majjhima Nikâya, 39:¶¶16-18 (pp. 368-69), 111: ¶¶5-10 (pp. 899-900); 119:¶¶19-21 (pp. 953-54). Buddhist Canon, 1974/1900 trans: Dhammasangani, ¶¶9-10 (pp. 9-11). Buddhaghosa (using lost ancient commentaries) 1979, Ch. iv, pp. 90-197, especially pp. 148-75 and most particularly ¶¶94, 100, 139, 154, 182-83. The desert traveler example useful for understanding the distinction between pîti (joyful interest, rapture, zest, happiness — derived from prî-, discussed in n. 15 above) and sukha (used here in a narrow and contrastive sense), pleasure, bliss, or happiness, may be found in ¶100, and in the longer form I have mainly followed, in Buddhaghosa's less widely available 1920-21, iv, 1 (vol. 1, pp. 154-56). Cf. the corresponding account from the northern Buddhist tradition, which likewise has sukha sometimes without joyful interest but not joyful interest without sukha, Vasubandhu, 1923-31, Ch. II, 8a (French trans.: “plaisir” without “joie”, vol. 1, pp. 114-15; Pruden English trans., vol. 1, p. 161).

43. See especially Berridge and Robinson 2003; Berridge 1999, 2003a and 2003b.

Along with the other Berridge citations in the Bibliography, see those for Robinson and Berridge, of which their 1993 is perhaps the most useful for philosophers, in part for its explanations of terms and discussion of ‘sham reward’ (without pleasure). Their interpretation is influential but still controversial. For recent research advancing their program of dissociating neural systems for ‘liking’ and ‘wanting’, see Peciña and Berridge 2000 and Peciña et al. 2003.

Roy Wise, in the 1980s, argued that the unhappiness or lack of happiness of people low on dopamine, including patients on some antipsychotic medications, supports a close connection of dopamine with pleasure (e.g., Wise 1982). For a recent study supporting the connection, see Voruganti et al. 2001. Wise, the scientist most identified with the pleasure interpretation of dopamine activity in the 1980s, withdrew from such bold interpretations and gives his reasons against this one in his accessible 1994 and more thorough 1999. For good reviews by scientists still inclined to interpret dopamine activity, in part, in a hedonic way, see Shizgal (1997, 1999) and Gardner (1999a and 1999b, which fairly gives many reasons on the other side, too), who believes further distinguishing different dopaminergic systems and their functions will resolve the apparent paradoxes in the hedonic interpretation of dopaminergic activity. Ikemoto and Panksepp 1999 also give a balanced synthesis, but from the other side of the debate about the direct hedonic importance of mesolimbic dopamine, also described as a seeking rather than pleasure system in Panksepp 1998. For an application connecting dopamine to extraversion, which correlates with some measures of positive affect, see Depue and Collins 1999. For further references and a brief, readable summary by an affective neuroscientist who has studied especially the amygdala, see LeDoux, 2002, Ch. 9, pp. 235-59, especially pp. 243-52. The special journal issue containing Wise 1999 (Nucleus Accumbens: Behavioral and Cognitive Functions, Psychobiology 27/2:147-310) has also other papers supporting nonhedonic interpretations of mesolimbic dopaminergic activity.

Among the well-supported and in large part compatible (with each other and also with the pleasure interpretation, which Peter Shizgal holds) characterizations of mesolimbic dopaminergic function are: incentive sensitization (Berridge and Robinson), behavioral/psychomotor activation (Wise and others), anticipatory/instrumental behavior (Shizgal and others), willingness to work (John Salamone), seeking (Panksepp), attentional switching, and a network teaching signal correcting errors in predicting reward (Wolfram Schultz and others). It is possible that the challenge of distinguishing a hedonic mode of action from the others, if only for some kinds of pleasure (e.g., anticipatory and instrumental — including pleasures of pursuit), can be sustained. While there remain problems with thinking that these neurons' activity simply constitute any pleasure, or are either necessary or sufficient for all pleasure, they seem at least very closely connected with some pleasure. But awareness of pleasure and so at least part of what is meant by “consciousness of pleasure” likely requires activity distributed between several levels of the brain (Berridge 2003a). Mesolimbic dopamine is likely neither necessary for phenomenal true pleasure nor sufficient for either it or for its cognitive awareness, but more plausibly helps organize, stabilize, and sustain activity linking the two, while also otherwise facilitating motivation and learning.

44. For example, Panksepp (e.g., 1998 and 2001) proposes discrete neural affect systems for sensory pleasure, homeostatically-sensitive drives, sexuality, nurturant/maternal behavior, and rough-and-tumble play, each with its own unique chemical and anatomical basis. However, he explicitly leaves open whether these lead to pleasure by converging on some single neural system, or by engaging similar physiology in different brain areas, or involve physiology (and experiences?) more different or variable in kind (1998, p. 184). Lane, Nadel, and Kaszniak (2000, p. 107) suggest the controversy between discrete affect and dimensional (see n. 39 above) approaches will likely be settled only by neuroscience. Different answers, perhaps, may be given for different levels of brain organization and also at different levels of analysis and there are grounds for thinking that culture, typically interacting with gender, may complicate any answer as well, at least at the level of self-report. See also J. A. Russell and Barrett 1999 for a discussion of how to integrate dimensional and discrete emotion approaches. (Russell is a major proponent of the ‘bipolar’ [positive/negative affect on one dimension] version of the dimensional approach; see n. 39.)

45. These lines from Voznesensky's “Oza”, quoted from here in my own translation, may be conveniently found, in their Russian original, with an English translation in Antiworlds and the Fifth Ace: Poetry by Andrei Voznesensky: A Bilingual Edition, Patricia Blake and Max Hayward (eds.), New York: Basic Books, 1967, pp. 238-39.

Copyright © 2006 by
Leonard D. Katz <lkatz@mit.edu>

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